Phenomenological Approaches to Self-Consciousness

First published Sat Feb 19, 2005; substantive revision Thu May 23, 2019

For phenomenologists, the immediate and first-personal givenness of experience is accounted for in terms of a pre-reflective self-consciousness. In the most basic sense of the term, self-consciousness is not something that comes about the moment one attentively inspects or reflectively introspects one’s experiences, or recognizes one’s specular image in the mirror, or refers to oneself with the use of the first-person pronoun, or constructs a self-narrative. Rather, these different kinds of self-consciousness are to be distinguished from the pre-reflective self-consciousness which is present whenever I am living through or undergoing an experience, e.g., whenever I am consciously perceiving the world, remembering a past event, imagining a future event, thinking an occurrent thought, or feeling sad or happy, thirsty or in pain, and so forth.

1. Pre-reflective self-consciousness

One can get a bearing on the notion of pre-reflective self-consciousness by contrasting it with reflective self-consciousness. If you ask me to give you a description of the pain I feel in my right foot, or of what I was just thinking about, I would reflect on it and thereby take up a certain perspective that was one order removed from the pain or the thought. Thus, reflective self-consciousness is at least a second-order cognition. It may be the basis for a report on one’s experience, although not all reports involve a significant amount of reflection.

In contrast, pre-reflective self-consciousness is pre-reflective in the sense that (1) it is an awareness we have before we do any reflecting on our experience; (2) it is an implicit and first-order awareness rather than an explicit or higher-order form of self-consciousness. Indeed, an explicit reflective self-consciousness is possible only because there is a pre-reflective self-awareness that is an on-going and more primary kind of self-consciousness. Although phenomenologists do not always agree on important questions about method, focus, or even whether there is an ego or self, they are in close to unanimous agreement about the idea that the experiential dimension always involves such an implicit pre-reflective self-awareness.[1] In line with Edmund Husserl (1959, 189, 412), who maintains that consciousness always involves a self-appearance (Für-sich-selbst-erscheinens), and in agreement with Michel Henry (1963, 1965), who notes that experience is always self-manifesting, and with Maurice Merleau-Ponty who states that consciousness is always given to itself and that the word ‘consciousness’ has no meaning independently of this self-givenness (Merleau-Ponty 1945, 488), Jean-Paul Sartre writes that pre-reflective self-consciousness is not simply a quality added to the experience, an accessory; rather, it constitutes the very mode of being of the experience:

This self-consciousness we ought to consider not as a new consciousness, but as the only mode of existence which is possible for a consciousness of something (Sartre 1943, 20 [1956, liv]).

In short, unless a mental process is pre-reflectively self-conscious there will be nothing it is like to undergo the process, and it therefore cannot be a phenomenally conscious process (Zahavi 1999, 2005, 2014). An implication of this is obviously that the self-consciousness in question is so fundamental and basic that it can be ascribed to all creatures that are phenomenally conscious, including various non-human animals.

The notion of pre-reflective self-awareness is related to the idea that experiences have a subjective ‘feel’ to them, a certain (phenomenal) quality of ‘what it is like’ or what it ‘feels’ like to have them. As it is usually expressed outside of phenomenological texts, to undergo a conscious experience necessarily means that there is something it is like for the subject to have that experience (Nagel 1974; Searle 1992). This is obviously true of bodily sensations like pain. But it is also the case for perceptual experiences, experiences of desiring, feeling, and thinking. There is something it is like to taste chocolate, and this is different from what it is like to remember or imagine what it is like to taste chocolate, or to smell vanilla, to run, to stand still, to feel envious, nervous, depressed or happy, or to entertain an abstract belief.

All of these different experiences are, however, also characterized by their distinct first-personal character. The what-it-is-likeness of phenomenal episodes is properly speaking a what-it-is-like-for-me-ness. This for-me-ness doesn’t refer to a specific experiential quality like sour or soft, rather it refers to the distinct first-personal givenness of experience. It refers to the fact that the experiences I am living through are given differently (but not necessarily better) to me than to anybody else. I may see that you are sad, but my seeing your sadness is qualitatively different from my living through my sadness. It could consequently be claimed that anybody who denies the for-me-ness of experience simply fails to recognize an essential constitutive aspect of experience. Such a denial would be tantamount to a denial of the first-person perspective. It would entail the view that my own mind is either not given to me at all—I would be mind- or self-blind—or is presented to me in exactly the same way as the minds of others.

One sometimes distinguishes two uses of the term ‘conscious’, a transitive and an intransitive use. On the one hand, we can speak of our being conscious of something, be it x, y, or z. On the other, we can speak of our being conscious simpliciter (rather than non-conscious). For some time a widespread way to account for intransitive consciousness in cognitive science and analytic philosophy of mind has been by means of some kind of higher-order theory. The distinction between conscious and non-conscious mental states has been taken to rest upon the presence or absence of a relevant meta-mental state (e.g., Armstrong 1968; Carruthers 1996, 2000; Lycan 1987, 1996; Rosenthal 1997). Thus, intransitive consciousness has been taken to depend upon the mind directing its intentional aim at its own states and operations. As Carruthers puts it, the subjective feel of experience presupposes a capacity for higher-order awareness: “such self-awareness is a conceptually necessary condition for an organism to be a subject of phenomenal feelings, or for there to be anything that its experiences are like” (1996, 152). But for Carruthers, the self-awareness in question is a type of reflection. In his view, a creature must be capable of reflecting upon, thinking about, and hence conceptualizing its own mental states if those mental states are to be states of which the creature is aware (1996, 155, 157).

One might share the view that there is a close link between consciousness and self-consciousness and still disagree about the nature of the link. And although the phenomenological view might superficially resemble the view of the higher-order theories, we are ultimately confronted with two quite different accounts. The phenomenologists explicitly deny that the self-consciousness that is present the moment I consciously experience something is to be understood in terms of some kind of higher-order monitoring. It does not involve an additional mental state, but is rather to be understood as an intrinsic feature of the primary experience. That is, in contrast to higher-order accounts of consciousness that claim that consciousness is an extrinsic or relational property of those mental states that have it, a property bestowed upon them from without by some further state, the phenomenologists would typically argue that the feature in virtue of which a mental state is conscious is an intrinsic property of those mental states that have it. Moreover, the phenomenologists also reject the attempt to construe intransitive consciousness in terms of transitive consciousness, that is, they reject the view that a conscious state is a state we are conscious of as object. To put it differently, not only do they reject the view that a mental state becomes conscious by being taken as an object by a higher-order state, they also reject the view (generally associated with Brentano) according to which a mental state becomes conscious by taking itself as an object (cf. Zahavi 2004; 2014).

What arguments support the phenomenological claims, however? Phenomenologists don’t simply appeal to a correct phenomenological description but provide additional, more theoretical, arguments. One line of reasoning found in virtually all of the phenomenologists is the view that the attempt to let (intransitive) consciousness be a result of a higher-order monitoring will generate an infinite regress. On the face of it, this is a rather old idea. Typically, the regress argument has been understood in the following manner. If all occurrent mental states are conscious in the sense of being taken as objects by occurrent second-order mental states, then these second-order mental states must themselves be taken as objects by occurrent third-order mental states, and so forth ad infinitum. The standard response to this objection is that the regress can easily be avoided by accepting the existence of non-conscious mental states. This is precisely the position adopted by the defenders of higher-order theory. For them a second-order perception or thought does not have to be conscious. It would be conscious only if accompanied by a (non-conscious) third-order thought or perception (Rosenthal 1997, 745). The phenomenological reply to this solution is rather straightforward, however. The phenomenologists would concede that it is possible to halt the regress by postulating the existence of non-conscious mental states, but they would maintain that such an appeal to the non-conscious leaves us with a case of explanatory vacuity. That is, they would find it quite unclear why the relation between two otherwise non-conscious processes should make one of them conscious. Or to put it differently, they would be quite unconvinced by the claim that a state without subjective or phenomenal qualities can be transformed into one with such qualities, i.e., into an experience with first-personal character, by the mere addition of a non-conscious meta-state having the first-state as its intentional object.

The phenomenological alternative avoids the regress. As Sartre writes: “[T]here is no infinite regress here, since a consciousness has no need at all of a reflecting [higher-order] consciousness in order to be conscious of itself. It simply does not posit itself as an object” (1936, 29 [1957, 45]). That is, pre-reflective self-consciousness is not transitive in relation to the state (of) which it is aware. It is, as Sartre puts it, the mode of existence of consciousness itself. This does not mean that a higher-order meta-consciousness is impossible, but merely that it always presupposes the existence of a prior non-objectifying, pre-reflective self-consciousness as its condition of possibility. To quote Sartre again, “it is the non-reflective consciousness which renders the reflection [and any higher-order representation of it] possible” (1943, 20 [1956, liii]).

There are also lines of argumentation in contemporary analytical philosophy of mind that are close to and consistent with the phenomenological conception of pre-reflective self-awareness. Alvin Goldman provides an example:

[Consider] the case of thinking about x or attending to x. In the process of thinking about x there is already an implicit awareness that one is thinking about x. There is no need for reflection here, for taking a step back from thinking about x in order to examine it…When we are thinking about x, the mind is focused on x, not on our thinking of x. Nevertheless, the process of thinking about x carries with it a non-reflective self-awareness (Goldman 1970, 96).

A similar view has been defended by Owen Flanagan, who not only argues that consciousness involves self-consciousness in the weak sense that there is something it is like for the subject to have the experience, but also speaks of the low-level self-consciousness involved in experiencing my experiences as mine (Flanagan 1992, 194). As Flanagan quite correctly points out, this primary type of self-consciousness should not be confused with the much stronger notion of self-consciousness that is in play when we are thinking about our own narrative self. The latter form of reflective self-consciousness presupposes both conceptual knowledge and narrative competence. It requires maturation and socialization, and the ability to access and issue reports about the states, traits, dispositions that make one the person one is. Other philosophers who have defended comparable views, include José Luis Bermúdez (1998), who has argued that that there are a variety of nonconceptual forms of self-consciousness that are “logically and ontogenetically more primitive than the higher forms of self-consciousness that are usually the focus of philosophical debate” (1998, 274; also see Poellner 2003), and Uriah Kriegel (2009) who has defended the existence of a type of self-consciousness that is intrinsic to and inherent in phenomenal consciousness. Across a variety of philosophical studies, then, one finds support for the phenomenological conception of pre-reflective self-awareness.

That pre-reflective self-awareness is implicit, then, means that I am not confronted with a thematic or explicit awareness of the experience as belonging to myself. Rather we are dealing with a non-observational self-acquaintance. Here is how Heidegger and Sartre put the point:

Dasein [human existence] as existing, is there for itself, even when the ego does not expressly direct itself to itself in the manner of its own peculiar turning around and turning back, which in phenomenology is called inner perception as contrasted with outer. The self is there for the Dasein itself without reflection and without inner perception, before all reflection. Reflection, in the sense of a turning back, is only a mode of self-apprehension, but not the mode of primary self-disclosure (Heidegger 1989, 226 [1982, 159]).

In other words, every positional consciousness of an object is at the same time a non-positional consciousness of itself. If I count the cigarettes which are in that case, I have the impression of disclosing an objective property of this collection of cigarettes: they are a dozen. This property appears to my consciousness as a property existing in the world. It is very possible that I have no positional consciousness of counting them. Then I do not know myself as counting. Yet at the moment when these cigarettes are revealed to me as a dozen, I have a non-thetic consciousness of my adding activity. If anyone questioned me, indeed, if anyone should ask, “What are you doing there?” I should reply at once, “I am counting.” (Sartre 1943, 19–20 [1956, liii]).

It might be clarifying to compare the phenomenological notion of pre-reflective self-consciousness with the one defended by Brentano. According to Brentano as I listen to a melody I am aware that I am listening to the melody. He acknowledges that I do not have two different mental states: my consciousness of the melody is one and the same as my awareness of perceiving it; they constitute one single psychical phenomenon. On this point, and in opposition to higher-order representation theories, Brentano and the phenomenologists are in general agreement. But for Brentano, by means of this unified mental state, I have an awareness of two objects: the melody and my perceptual experience.

In the same mental phenomenon in which the sound is present to our minds we simultaneously apprehend the mental phenomenon itself. What is more, we apprehend it in accordance with its dual nature insofar as it has the sound as content within it, and insofar as it has itself as content at the same time. We can say that the sound is the primary object of the act of hearing, and that the act of hearing itself is the secondary object (Brentano 1874, 179–180 [1973, 127–128]).

Husserl disagrees on just this point, as do Sartre and Heidegger: my awareness of my experience is not an awareness of it as an object.[2] My awareness is non-objectifying in the sense that I do not occupy the position or perspective of a spectator or in(tro)spector who attends to this experience in a thematic way. That a psychological state is experienced, “and is in this sense conscious, does not and cannot mean that this is the object of an act of consciousness, in the sense that a perception, a presentation or a judgment is directed upon it” (Husserl 1984a, 165 [2001, I, 273]). In pre-reflective self-awareness, experience is given, not as an object, but precisely as subjective experience. For phenomenologists, intentional experience is lived through (erlebt), but does not appear in an objectified manner. Experience is conscious of itself without being the intentional object of consciousness (Husserl 1984b, 399; Sartre 1936, 28–29). That we are aware of our lived experiences even if we do not direct our attention towards them is not to deny that we can direct our attention towards our experiences, and thereby take them as objects of reflection (Husserl 1984b, 424).

To be self-aware is not to capture a pure self or self-object that exists separately from the stream of experience, rather it is to be conscious of one’s experience in its intrinsic first-person mode of givenness. When Hume, in a famous passage in A Treatise of Human Nature (1739), declares that he cannot find a self when he searches his experiences, but finds only particular perceptions or feelings, it could be argued that he overlooks something in his analysis, namely the specific givenness of his own experiences. Indeed, he was looking only among his own experiences, and seemingly recognized them as his own, and could do so only on the basis of that immediate self-awareness that he seemed to miss. As C.O. Evans puts it: “[F]rom the fact that the self is not an object of experience it does not follow that it is non-experiential” (Evans 1970, 145). Accordingly, we should not think of the self, in this most basic sense, as a substance, or as some kind of ineffable transcendental precondition, or as a social construct that gets generated through time; rather it is an integral aspect of conscious life, and involves this immediate experiential character.

One advantage of the phenomenological view is that it is capable of accounting for some degree of diachronic unity, without actually having to posit the self as a separate entity over and above the stream of consciousness (see the discussion of time-consciousness in Section 3 below). Although we live through a number of different experiences, the experiencing itself remains a constant in regard to whose experience it is. This is not accounted for by a substantial self or a mental theater. On this point Hume was right. There is no pure or empty field of consciousness upon which the concrete experiences subsequently make their entry. The field of experiencing is nothing apart from the specific experiences. Yet we are naturally inclined to distinguish the strict singularity of an experience from the continuous stream of changing experiences. What remains constant and consistent across these changes is the sense of for-me-ness (or perspectival ownership) constituted by pre-reflective self-awareness. Only a being with this sense of ownership could go on to form concepts about herself, consider her own aims, ideals, and aspirations as her own, construct stories about herself, and plan and execute actions for which she will take responsibility.

2. Philosophical issues and objections

The concept of pre-reflective self-awareness is related to a variety of philosophical issues, including epistemic asymmetry, immunity to error through misidentification and self-reference. We will examine these issues each in turn.

It seems clear that the objects of my visual perception are intersubjectively accessible in the sense that they can in principle be the objects of another’s perception. A subject’s perceptual experience itself, however, is given in a unique way to the subject herself. Although two people, A and B, can perceive a numerically identical object, they each have their own distinct perceptual experience of it; just as they cannot share each other’s pain, they cannot literally share these perceptual experiences. Their experiences are epistemically asymmetrical in this regard. B might realize that A is in pain; he might sympathize with A, he might even have the same kind of pain (same qualitative aspects, same intensity, same proprioceptive location), but he cannot literally feel A’s pain the same way A does. The subject’s epistemic access to her own experience, whether it is a pain or a perceptual experience, is primarily a matter of pre-reflective self-awareness. If secondarily, in an act of introspective reflection I begin to examine my perceptual experience, I will recognize it as my perceptual experience only because I have been pre-reflectively aware of it, as I have been living through it. Thus, phenomenology maintains, the access that reflective self-consciousness has to first-order phenomenal experience is routed through pre-reflective consciousness, for if we were not pre-reflectively aware of our experience, our reflection on it would never be motivated. When I do reflect, I reflect on something with which I am already experientially familiar.

The ease with which we self-ascribe experiences is partially to be explained by appeal to pre-reflective self-awareness. It is important to emphasize, however, that pre-reflective self-awareness is only a necessary and not a sufficient condition for reflective self-ascription and first-person knowledge. Many animals who possess pre-reflective self-consciousness obviously lack the cognitive resources needed for reflective self-ascriptions.

When I experience an occurrent pain, perception, or thought, the experience in question is given immediately and noninferentially. I do not have to judge or appeal to some criteria in order to identify it as my experience. There are no free-floating experiences; even the experience of freely-floating belongs to someone. As William James (1890) put it, all experience is “personal.” Even in pathological cases, as in depersonalization or schizophrenic symptoms of delusions of control or thought insertion, a feeling or experience that the subject claims not to be his is nonetheless experienced by him as being part of his stream of consciousness. The complaint of thought insertion, for example, necessarily acknowledges that the inserted thoughts are thoughts that belong to the subject’s experience, even as the agency for such thoughts are attributed to others. This first-person character entails an implicit experiential self-reference. If I feel hungry or see my friend, I cannot be mistaken about who the subject of that experience is, even if I can be mistaken about it being hunger (perhaps it’s really thirst), or about it being my friend (perhaps it’s his twin), or even about whether I am actually seeing him (I may be hallucinating). As Wittgenstein (1958), Shoemaker (1968), and others have pointed out, it is nonsensical to ask whether I am sure that I am the one who feels hungry. This is the phenomenon known as “immunity to error through misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun.” To this idea of immunity to error through misidentification, the phenomenologist adds that whether a certain experience is experienced as mine, or not, does not depend upon something apart from the experience, but depends precisely upon the pre-reflective givenness that belongs to the structure of the experience (Husserl 1959, 175; Husserl 1973a, 28, 56, 307, 443; see Zahavi 1999, 6ff.).

Some philosophers who are inclined to take self-consciousness to be intrinsically linked to the issue of self-reference would argue that the latter depends on a first-person concept. One attains self-consciousness only when one can conceive of oneself as oneself, and has the linguistic ability to use the first-person pronoun to refer to oneself (Baker 2000, 68; cf. Lowe 2000, 264). On this view, self-consciousness is something that emerges in the course of a developmental process, and depends on the acquisition of concepts and language. Accordingly, some philosophers deny that young children are capable of self-consciousness (Carruthers 1996; Dennett 1976; Wilkes 1988; also see Flavell 1993). Evidence from developmental psychology and ecological psychology, however, suggests that there is a primitive, proprioceptive form of self-consciousness already in place from birth.[3] This primitive self-awareness precedes the mastery of language and the ability to form conceptually informed judgments, and it may serve as a basis for more advanced types of self-consciousness (see, e.g., Butterworth 1995, 1999; Gibson 1986; Meltzoff 1990a, 1990b; Neisser 1988; and Stern 1985). The phenomenological view is consistent with such findings.

The notion of pre-reflective self-awareness is much more accepted today than it was 20 years ago and has become part of the standard repertoire in philosophy of mind. The notion’s increasing popularity not surprisingly has also led to an increasing amount of criticism. One line of attack has focused on what might be called the universality question. Is it truly the case that all conscious mental states involve pre-reflective self-awareness, for-me-ness, and a sense of ownership? Does the link hold by necessity such that it characterizes all experiences, however primitive or disordered they might be, or might it, for instance, be something that only holds true for a more limited group of experiences, say, normal, adult, experiences (Lane 2012; Dainton 2016; Guillot 2017; Howell & Thompson 2017). Whether infantile or pathological or hallucinogenic experiences constitute relevant exceptions, i.e., experiences that lack pre-reflective self-awareness, for-me-ness and sense of ownership, is to a large extent dependent upon how robustly one interprets these notions. If pre-reflective self-awareness is interpreted simply as a non-inferential awareness of the experience one is having rather than as an awareness of some self-object, and if for-me-ness and sense of ownership are interpreted not as involving an awareness of the possessive relation between oneself and the experience, but rather as the distinct perspectival givenness or first-personal presence of experience, it is far from obvious that there really are exceptions to be found (Zahavi 2014, 2018, 2019). Some critics have also claimed that the sense of ownership is a by-product of reflective or introspective processes (e.g., Bermúdez 2011; 2018; Dainton 2007). They insist that there is nothing like a pre-reflective sense of ownership that is “something over and above the changing stream of thought, perception, volition, emotion, memory, bodily sensation, and so on” (Dainton 2007, 240; emphasis added). But as should already be clear, phenomenologists do not claim that pre-reflective self-awareness or the sense of ownership is something “over and above” experience, something extra that is added as a second experience. Rather, the claim is that it is an intrinsic feature of experience itself. In this respect, the phenomenological claim is as deflationary as the critics would want (Gallagher 2017a).

3. Temporality and the limits of reflective self-consciousness

Although, as pre-reflectively self-aware of my experience I am not unconscious of it, I do not attend to it; rather I tend to overlook it in favor of the object that I am perceiving, the thing I am remembering, etc. In my everyday life, I am absorbed by and preoccupied with projects and objects in the world, and as such I do not attend to my experiential life. Therefore, this pervasive pre-reflective self-consciousness is not to be understood as complete self-comprehension. One can accept the notion of a pervasive self-consciousness and still accept the existence of the unconscious in the sense of subjective components which remain ambiguous, obscure, and resistant to comprehension. Thus, one should distinguish between the claim that consciousness is characterized by an immediate first-person character and the claim that consciousness is characterized by total self-transparency. One can easily accept the first and reject the latter (Ricoeur 1950, 354–355).

In contrast to pre-reflective self-consciousness, which delivers an implicit sense of self at an experiential or phenomenal level, reflective self-consciousness is an explicit, conceptual, and objectifying awareness that takes a lower-order consciousness as its attentional theme. I am able at any time to attend directly to the cognitive experience itself, turning my experience itself into the object of my consideration.

Phenomenologists do not claim the infallible authority of reflection over subjective experience. There are no epistemic guarantees connected with self-consciousness other than immunity to error through misidentification. If I cannot be wrong about who is living through my experiences, I can be wrong about all kinds of other things about my experiences. A brief consideration of the phenomenology of temporality will help to explain this, namely, why reflective self-consciousness is characterized by certain limitations. It will also help to clarify how pre-reflective self-consciousness, as a mode of existence, is possible in the first place, as well as elucidate the phenomenological account of diachronic unity, an account that does not posit something called the “self” as a separate entity over and above the stream of consciousness (cf. Zahavi 2014).

According to Husserl’s analysis, experience of any sort (perception, memory, imagination, etc.) has a common temporal structure such that any moment of experience contains a retentional reference to past moments of experience, a current openness (primal impression) to what is present, and a protentional anticipation of the moments of experience that are just about to happen (Husserl 1966; see Gallagher 1998). The retentional structure of experience, that is, the fact that when I am experiencing something, each passing moment of consciousness does not simply disappear at the next moment but is kept in intentional currency, constitutes a coherency that stretches over an experienced temporal duration. Husserl’s favorite example is a melody. When I experience a melody, I don’t simply experience a knife-edge presentation (primal impression) of one note, which is then completely washed away and replaced with the next discrete knife-edge presentation of the next note. Rather, consciousness retains the sense of the first note as just past, as I hear the second note, a hearing that is also enriched by an anticipation (protention) of the next note (or at least, in case I do not know the melody, a sense that there will be a next note, or some next auditory event). Husserl claims that we actually do perceive melodies—in opposition to an earlier view propounded by Brentano, viz., that with the help of our imagination or recollection we construct or reconstruct such unities out of a synthesis of mental acts. That we actually perceive melodies (without first constructing them using memory and imagination) is possible only because consciousness is so structured to allow for this temporal presentation.

Importantly, the temporal (retentional-impressional-protentional) structure of consciousness not only allows for the experience of temporally extended objects or intentional contents, but also entails the self-manifestation of consciousness, that is, its pre-reflective self-awareness. The retention of past notes of the melody is accomplished, not by a “real” or literal re-presentation of the notes (as if I were hearing them a second time and simultaneously with the current note), but by an intentional retaining of my just past experience of the melody as just past. This means that this retentional structure gives me an immediate awareness of my ongoing experience in the ongoing flow of experience, a self-awareness that is implicit in my experience of the object. At the same time that I am aware of a melody, for example, I am co-aware of my ongoing experience of the melody through the retentional structure of that very experience—and this just is the pre-reflective self-awareness of experience (see Zahavi 1999, 2003).

The temporal structure that accounts for pre-reflective self-awareness is also the structural feature that accounts for the limitations imposed on reflective self-consciousness. Reflective self-consciousness yields knowledge of pre-reflective subjectivity that is always after the fact. Reflective self-consciousness, which takes pre-reflective experience as its object, is itself (like any conscious experience) characterized by the same temporal structure. In principle, however, the retentional-impressional-protentional structure of reflection cannot overlay the retentional-impressional-protentional structure of pre-reflective experience in complete simultaneity. There is always a slight delay between reflection and the pre-reflective object of reflection. One might say that the pre-reflective experience must first be there if I am to turn my reflective attention to it and make it an object of reflection. Husserl writes: “When I say I, I grasp myself in a simple reflection. But this self-experience [Selbsterfahrung] is like every experience [Erfahrung], and in particular every perception, a mere directing myself towards something that was already there for me, that was already conscious, but not thematically experienced, not noticed” (Husserl 1973b, 492–493). This delay is one of the reasons why there remains a difference or distance between the reflecting subject and the reflected object, even though the reflected object is my own experience. As a reflecting subject, I never fully coincide with myself.

As Merleau-Ponty puts it, our temporal existence is both a condition for and an obstacle to our self-comprehension. Temporality contains an internal fracture that permits us to return to our past experiences in order to investigate them reflectively, but this very fracture also prevents us from fully coinciding with ourselves. There will always remain a difference between the lived and the understood (Merleau-Ponty 1945, 76, 397, 399, 460). Self-consciousness provides us with the sense that we are always already in play. This leads some phenomenologists to note that we are born (or “thrown” into the world) and not self-generated. We are caught up in a life that is in excess of our full comprehension (Heidegger 1986). There is always something about ourselves that we cannot fully capture in the moment of self-conscious reflection.

If reflective self-consciousness is limited in this way, this should not prevent us from exercising it. Indeed, reflective self-consciousness is a necessary condition for moral self-responsibility, as Husserl points out. Reflection is a precondition for self-critical deliberation. If we are to subject our different beliefs and desires to a critical, normative evaluation, it is not sufficient simply to have immediate first-personal access to the states in question.

We take as our point of departure the essential ability for self-consciousness in the full sense of personal self-inspection (inspectio sui), and the ability that is based on this for taking up positions that are reflectively directed back on oneself and one’s own life, on personal acts of self-knowledge, self-evaluation, and practical acts of self-determination, self-willing, and self-formation. (Husserl 1988, 23).

Self-consciousness is, therefore, not epiphenomenal. Our ability to make reflective judgments about our own beliefs and desires also allows us to modify them.

One might see the position of Husserl, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty as being situated between two extremes. On the one hand, we have the view that reflection merely copies or mirrors pre-reflective experience faithfully, and on the other hand we have the view that reflection distorts lived experience. The middle course is to recognize that reflection involves a gain and a loss. For Husserl, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty, reflection is constrained by what is pre-reflectively lived through. It is answerable to experiential facts and is not constitutively self-fulfilling. At the same time, however, they recognized that reflection qua thematic self-experience does not simply reproduce the lived experiences unaltered and that this is precisely what makes reflection cognitively valuable. The experiences reflected upon are transformed in the process, to various degrees and manners depending upon the type of reflection at work. Subjectivity consequently seems to be constituted in such a fashion that it can and, at times, must relate to itself in an “othering” manner. This self-alteration is something inherent to reflection; it is not something that reflection can overcome.

4. Bodily self-awareness

Much of what we have said about self-consciousness may still seem overly mentalistic. It is important to note that for phenomenologists like Husserl and Merleau-Ponty, pre-reflective self-awareness is both embodied and embedded in the world. The first-person point of view on the world is never a view from nowhere; it is always defined by the situation of the perceiver’s body, which concerns not simply location and posture, but action in pragmatic contexts and interaction with other people. Pre-reflective self-awareness includes aspects that are both bodily and intersubjective.

The claim is not simply that the perceiver/actor is objectively embodied, but that the body is in some fashion experientially present in the perception or action. Phenomenologists distinguish the pre-reflective body-awareness that accompanies and shapes every spatial experience, from a reflective consciousness of the body. To capture this difference, Husserl introduced a terminological distinction between Leib and Körper, that is, between the pre-reflectively lived body, i.e., the body as an embodied first-person perspective, and the subsequent thematic experience of the body as an object (Husserl 1973a, 57). Pre-reflective body- (Leib-) awareness is not a type of object-perception, but it is an essential element of every such perception. If I reach for a tool, I know where to reach because I have a sense of where it is in relation to myself. I also sense that I will be able to reach it, or that I will have to take two steps towards it. My perception of the tool must involve proprioceptive and kinaesthetic information about my bodily situation and the position of my limbs, otherwise I would not be able to reach for it or use it. If in such cases, we want to say that I have an awareness of my body, such bodily awareness is quite different from the perception that I have of the tool. I may have to look or feel around in order to find where the tool is; but, under normal circumstances, I never have to do that in regard to my body. I am tacitly aware, not only of where my hands and feet are, but also of what I can do with them. This tacit awareness of my body always registers as an “I can” (or “I can’t,” as the case may be). Primarily, my body is experienced, not as an object, but as a field of activity and affectivity, as a potentiality of mobility and volition, as an “I do” and “I can.”

The body provides not only the egocentric spatial framework for orientation towards the world, but also the constitutive contribution of its mobility. Perception does not involve a passive reception, but an active exploration of the environment. Husserl calls attention to the importance of bodily movements (the movements of the eye, manipulations by the hand, the locomotion of the body, etc.) for the experience of space and spatial objects. He further claims that perception is correlated to and accompanied by proprioceptive-kinaesthetic self-sensation or self-affection (Husserl 1973c). Every visual or tactile appearance is given in correlation to a kinaesthetic experience. When I touch a shaped surface, it is given in conjunction with a sensation of finger movements. When I watch the flight of a bird, the moving bird is given in conjunction with the kinaesthetic sensations of eye movement and perhaps neck movement. Such kinaesthetic activation during perception produces an implicit and pervasive reference to one’s own body. The implicit self-awareness of the actual and possible movements of my body helps shape the experience that I have of the world. To be clear, however, bodily self-awareness is not an awareness of the body in isolation from the world; it is embedded in action and perception. We do not first become aware of the body and subsequently use it to engage with the world. We experience the world bodily, and the body is revealed to us in our exploration of the world. Primarily, the body attains self-awareness in action (or in our dispositions to action, or in our action possibilities) when it relates to something, uses something, or moves through the world.[4]

Bodily self-awareness, like self-consciousness more generally, has limitations. I am never fully aware of everything that is going on with my body. Indeed, my body tends to efface itself as I perceive and act in the world. When I jump to catch a ball that is thrown over my head, I certainly have a sense of what I can do, but I am not aware of my precise movements or postures—for example, that my right leg bends at a certain angle as I reach with my left hand. I can execute movements without being explicitly conscious of them, and even what I am tacitly aware of is somewhat limited—for example, I am not aware of the shape of my grasp as I reach to grab the ball. Although I may not be aware of certain details about my bodily performance, this does not mean however that I am unconscious of my body. Rather it means that the way that I am aware of my body is fully integrated with the intentional action that I am performing. I know that I am jumping to catch the ball, and implicit in that, as an immediate sense rather than an inference, I experience my body jumping to catch the ball.

Furthermore, experiential aspects of my embodiment permeate my pre-reflective self-consciousness. There is something it is like to jump to catch a ball, and part of what it is like is that I am in fact jumping. There is something different about what it is like to sit and imagine (or remember) myself jumping to catch the ball, and at least part of that difference has to do with the fact that I am sitting rather than jumping, although none of this may be explicit in my experience.

Another way to think of the self-awareness involved in action is to consider the sense of agency that is normally an aspect of pre-reflective self-awareness in action. If, as I am walking down the street, I am pushed from behind, I am instantly aware of my body moving in a way that I did not intend. The fact that I feel a loss of control over my actions suggests that there had been an implicit sense of agency or control in my walking prior to being pushed. In voluntary action, I experience the movements of my body as my own actions, and this is replaced by a feeling of loss of bodily control in the case of involuntary movement. Voluntary actions feel different from involuntary actions, and this difference depends respectively, on the experience of agency or the experience of a lack of agency—as the case may be if my body is being moved by someone else.[5]

Hubert Dreyfus has famously argued that in the case of expert performance we are not self-conscious, but rather “usually involved in coping in a mindless way” (Dreyfus 2007a, 356). On his account, our immersed bodily life is so completely and totally world-engaged that it is entirely oblivious to itself. Indeed, in total absorption, one ceases being a subject altogether (Dreyfus 2007b, 373). It is only when this bodily absorption is interrupted that something like self-consciousness emerges. Dreyfus consequently doesn’t deny the existence of self-consciousness, but he definitely wants to see it as a capacity that is only exercised or actualized on special occasions. Moreover, when this capacity is exercised it necessarily disrupts our coping and radically transform the kind of affordances that are given to it (Dreyfus 2005, 61; 2007, 354). A number of theorists, however, have taken issue with this characterization of expert performance and have argued that in the performing arts (e.g., in dance, musical performance) and in athletics (e.g., baseball, cricket) expert performers may employ an enhanced but still pre-reflective awareness (Legrand 2007), a heedful consciousness of the situation (e.g., Sutton et al. 2011), or even a skillful reflective monitoring (Montero 2010; 2014), or some variable combination of these (Høffding 2018), and that such consciousness does not impede performance but improves it.

5. Intersubjective and social forms of self-consciousness

A focus on embodied self-experience inevitably leads to a decisive widening of the discussion. The externality of embodiment puts me, and my actions, in the public sphere. Self-consciousness, which involves an ability to make reflective judgments about our own beliefs and desires, is always shaped by others and what we have learned from others. This intersubjective or social influence can also affect pre-reflective self-awareness, including my sense of embodied agency.

I can become aware of myself through the eyes of other people, and this can happen in a number of different ways. Thus, embodiment brings intersubjectivity and sociality into the picture, and draws attention to the question of how certain forms of self-consciousness are intersubjectively mediated, and may depend on one’s social relations to others. My awareness of myself as one person among others, an awareness that I may frame from the perspective of others, attempting to see myself as they see me, involves a change in the attitude of self-consciousness. Within this attitude, judgments that I make about myself are constrained by social expectations and cultural values. This kind of social self-consciousness is always contextualized, as I try to understand how I appear to others, both in the way I look, and in the meaning of my actions. I find myself in particular contexts, with specific capabilities and dispositions, habits and convictions, and I express myself in a way that is reflected off of others, in relevant (socially defined) roles through my language and my actions.

The role of the other in this mode of self-consciousness is not unessential. According to Husserl, I become aware of myself specifically as a human person only in such intersubjective relations (Husserl 1973b, 175; 1952, 204–05; see Hart 1992, 71; Zahavi 1999, 157ff. Also see Taylor 1989, 34–36 for a similar idea). Thus Husserl distinguishes the subject taken in its bare formality from the personalized subject and claims that the origin and status of being a person must be located in the social dimension. I am a person, socially contextualized, with abilities, dispositions, habits, interests, character traits, and convictions, all of which have been developed through my interactions with others. When considering the fullness of human selfhood, the idea of an isolated, pure and formal subject of experience is an abstraction (Husserl 1968, 210). Given the right conditions and circumstances, the self acquires a personalizing self-apprehension, i.e., it develops into a person and as a person (cf. Husserl 1952, 265). And this development depends heavily upon social interaction (Husserl 1973b, 170–171).

This kind of self-consciousness also opens up the possibility of self-alienation, famously explicated by Sartre in terms of the other’s gaze. For Sartre, because “our being, along with its being-for-itself, is also for-others; the being which is revealed to the reflective consciousness is for-itself-for-others” (1956, 282). On this view, the primary experience of the other is not that I perceive her as some kind of object in which I must find a person, but I perceive the other as a subject who perceives me as an object. My experience of the other is at the same time an experience that involves my own self-consciousness, a self-consciousness in which I am pre-reflectively aware that I am an object for another. This experience can further motivate a reflective self-consciousness, as I consider how I must appear to the other.

Merleau-Ponty (1945, 415) suggests that the other’s gaze can motivate this kind of self-consciousness only if I already have a sense of my own visibility to the other. This sense of my own visibility, however, is immediately linked with the pre-reflective, proprioceptive-kinaesthetic sense of my body, an insight that goes back to Husserl’s analysis (mentioned above). Merleau-Ponty notes its connection to the infant’s capability for imitation, and this is carried forward to more recent advances in developmental psychology (see Merleau-Ponty, 1945, 165, 404–405; 2010; Gallagher and Zahavi 2012; Zahavi 1999, 171–72). Indeed, although much emphasis has fallen on vision and the gaze of the other in phenomenological accounts of self-consciousness, proprioceptive and tactile experiences have a developmental primacy and emerge in the pre-natal environment in ways that allow for very basic relational experiences of self-movement versus movement of the mother’s body (Lymer 2010; 2014; Ciaunica & Crucianelli 2019; Ciaunica & Fotopoulou 2016), and continue to play a significant role in embodied interactions with caregivers during early infancy. In this respect, intersubjective/intercorporeal experiences can affect pre-reflective body self-awareness. This complicates any claim that the pre-reflective experience of body ownership is primarily for self-preservation (Ciaunica & Crucianelli 2019; de Vignemont 2018).

This is not the place to enter into a detailed discussion of these rich and complex issues, issues that extend to analyses of phenomena such as empathy, shame, guilt, and so on (see Zahavi 2010, 2014). But it is important to realize that self-consciousness is a multifaceted concept. It is not something that can be exhaustively analyzed simply by examining the inner workings of the mind.

6. Conclusion

The notion of self-consciousness has been the subject of a rich and complex analysis in the phenomenological tradition. Aspects of the phenomenological analysis also show up in other areas of research, including feminism (Stawarska 2006; Young 2005; Heinämaa 2003), ecological psychology (Gibson 1966), and recent analyses of enactive perception (Gallagher 2017b; Noë 2004; Thompson 2008). The recognition of the existence of a primitive form of pre-reflective self-consciousness is an important starting point for an understanding of more elaborate forms of self-consciousness that are concept- and language-dependent. Phenomenological analyses show these processes to be more than purely mental or cognitive events since they integrally involve embodiment and intersubjective dimensions.



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