Supplement to Externalism and Self-Knowledge

A Problem with Critical Reasoning

“Critical reasoning” is reasoning that requires an awareness of one’s reasons for a belief, in order to evaluate their worth as reasons. Naturally enough, this requires knowledge of which thoughts are deployed as reasons. The process of evaluating one’s reasons cannot get started without knowing what those reasons are.

A concern for Burge’s self-verifying judgments is that, even if they constitute knowledge, they are inadequately informative of one’s reasons. For in brief, self-verifying judgments do not enable Oscar to avoid simple logical errors in his reasoning, in the manner we would expect of someone rational. If so, then self-verifying judgments are at best a “hollow” kind of self-knowledge, thus deflating the significance of Burge’s compatibilism (Boghossian 1992a, p. 15).

As one manifestation of the issue, self-verifying judgments seem insufficient to reveal whether one’s thoughts are inconsistent (Bilgrami 1992; 2003, Boghossian 1992a; 1994). If so, then critical reasoning might proceed without the person knowing that her premises are impossible, despite whatever self-verifying judgments are at hand. To illustrate, consider that it is possible for someone to judge rationally:

(*) Water ≠ H2O.

For instance, a scientist in 1750 might have reasonably denied the newly proposed hypothesis is that water is H2O. But under EXT, this judgment is not just false—it is inconsistent.[1] The externalist content of the judgment amounts to: Water is non-identical with itself. Yet something seems amiss, for the person is guilty of ignorance, not of gross inconsistency. But how can the externalist explain that? The best explanation seems to be that the person was ignorant of the content of (*), and so did not knowingly flout classical logic. Yet then, SK does not seem true in a meaningful way, despite whatever self-verifying judgments were made.

Instead of inconsistency, the problem can also be put in terms of Oscar’s inability to judge validity from the armchair. (Boghossian 1992a; 1994).[2] The difficulty is that self-verifying judgments do not illuminate whether one thought has the same content as an earlier thought expressed using the same form of words. Yet if Oscar is unable to discern “same content” from the armchair, then he is unable to know from the armchair if his reasoning is valid. For he is unable to discern whether his reasoning equivocates between water thoughts and twin water thoughts.

There is a well-known example to illustrate the point (Boghossian 1992a; 1994). Suppose Peter is a fan of opera and especially of Pavarotti, and assume he is slow switched unawares to Twin Earth. He continues to pursue his interest in opera—but on Twin Earth, he is unwittingly reading interviews of, and buying new albums by, Twin Pavarotti rather than Pavarotti. The problem then arises when memories of Pavarotti are drawn upon in Peter’s reasoning. Suppose he correctly remembers seeing Pavarotti (on Earth) swim in Lake Taupo. After the slow-switch, then, suppose he uses the memory as the first premise in the following argument:

  1. Pavarotti once swam in Lake Taupo.
  2. The singer I heard yesterday is Pavarotti.
  3. Hence, the singer I heard yesterday once swam in Lake Taupo.

From Peter’s armchair, the reasoning looks perfectly valid. Yet in fact, ‘Pavarotti’ in (i) refers to Pavarotti on Earth, but ‘Pavarotti’ in (ii) refers to Twin Pavarotti. After all, (i) expresses a memory of Pavarotti, whereas (ii) expresses a judgment that is causally connected to Twin Pavarotti. If so, then the reasoning at (i)-(iii) blatantly equivocates on ‘Pavarotti’, even though Peter is unable to see this from the armchair.

The issues are somewhat reminiscent of Kripke’s (1979) puzzle about belief. Recall that Kripke considers a bilingual, Pierre, who is unaware that ‘Londres’ co-refers with ‘London’ (though is otherwise competent with the terms). Due to happenstance, Pierre ends up asserting both ‘Londres est jolie’ and ‘London is not pretty’; the question is then whether the speaker is guilty of inconsistency. Regardless, Peter’s case is notably different. Whereas Pierre is ignorant of co-reference, Peter is unaware that his two uses of ‘Pavarotti’ in (i) and (ii) have different referents. Consequently, Peter’s case uniquely reveals that, assuming EXT, Oscar might equivocate in his reasoning even though he cannot discern this in the armchair. So even granting self-verifying judgments, EXT may not uphold SK in a sufficiently robust way. It seems the externalist cannot enable Peter with armchair-knowledge that his ‘Pavarotti’-tokens have different contents

It is controversial, however, whether this kind of "transparancy" of different contents should be allowed. An externalist might instead dismiss such knowledge as an illusion of the Cartesian paradigm (Millikan 1984; 1993, Goldberg 1999b; 2007b, Williamson 2000, ch. 4, Brown 2004, Schroeter 2007). Moreover, even if the externalist can uphold this "transparancy" of difference, it may still be insufficient to explain why Peter is not being irrational (Gertler 2015, Wikforss 2015). Regardless, some externalists seek to explain why Peter should not be rationally criticized for his reasoning.

A common strategy here is simply to deny that Peter, as a slow switch victim, refers to different people in (i) versus (ii) (Schiffer 1992; Burge 1998; Goldberg 2007a). The more natural interpretation may have ‘Pavarotti’ denoting Twin Pavarotti in both instances, in which case, his argument is valid. Of course, this interpretation means that (i) expresses a false memory. But at least there is no unnoticed equivocation within the armchair.

On the other hand, there might be other examples of arguments that merely appear valid in the armchair, and whose invalidity is not due to equivocation on the names (Boghossian 1992b). Further, it may be dubious to see Peter’s memory as “shifty” between environments—where (i) comes to express a false memory about Twin Pavarotti, even though the memory was caused by Pavarotti on Earth (in the normal way). However, the possibility of a “shifty” memory has generated a significant amount of discussion, in part, because it alone would cut against slow switch arguments. Further discussion is thus relegated to section 3.3.

A different approach is to suggest that Peter tacitly assumes that the Pavarotti-concept in (i) and the twin-concept in (ii) are co-referring. Consequently, the reasoning is not a case of equivocation, but rather one where a false identity-statement is assumed (Parent 2017, ch 6). Thus, although Peter’s reasoning contains an error, it is not the sort of error that calls his rationality into question. (Clearly, a fully rational agent can reason from a false premise unwittingly.) Some have worried that this angle on Peter leads to a vicious regress of tacit assumptions. For it requires the concepts in Peter’s tacit assumptions, in turn, to be tacitly interpreted in a particular way (Brown 2004, ch. 5) But the regress of tacit assumptions might be not vicious; rather, it may be precisely the right way to understand Peter’s cognitive reality (Parent 2017, ch. 6).

Yet another proposal is this: Both occurrences of ‘Pavarotti’ express concepts that fail to refer determinately in the first place, due to Peter’s confusion on the matter (Recanati 2012, chs. 10 and 11). Consequently, there is no unnoticed equivocation in (i)-(iii), since this would assume that the referent of one ‘Pavarotti’-token was determinately different from the other. But perhaps neither ‘Pavarotti’-token has a determinate referent to begin with. Arguably, however, this responds to a slightly different problem than Boghossian’s original worry. After all, Boghossian had stipulated that Peter was slow-switched, meaning it was part of the set-up that ‘Pavarotti’ in (ii) determinately refers to Twin Pavarotti (Parent 2017, p. 139).

Interestingly, although the critical reasoning objection was initially posed against Burge’s view, it has started to take a life of its own. The problem can be regarded as a general argument against compatibilism, since no matter what kind of self-knowledge Peter has, the externalist is strained to keep separate the logical from the factual errors in his reasoning. (Even so, the problem with Peter might conceivably be parlayed into a problem for content internalism also; Pérez-Otero 2014, Parent 2017, ch. 6.)

Regardless, in this setting, some compatibilists respond that the Peter example misconceives how content is attributed--for the claim is that “content” is something we posit to predict/retrodict the subject’s behavior (Stalnaker 2008, Jackman 2015; also cf. Stalnaker 1990). (The compatibilist here is adopting an interpretivist view of content, akin to that of Davidson 1973; 1987.) Moreover, it is held that what “adequately explains” behavior depends on the attributor’s aims or purposes. Consequently, in one context (i) might be seen as expressing a false memory about Twin Pavarotti. That might occur if, e.g., the aim is to explain why Peter talks to Twin Pavarotti as if they were long-time acquaintances. Yet for different explanatory purposes, (i) could be interpreted as expressing a genuine memory about Pavarotti. Our compatibilist holds, moreover, that either interpretation of Peter can be legitimate, for there simply is no attributor-independent fact about what mental contents Peter really has.

Of course, many would take exception to this attributor-relative view of content. Some say it is viciously circular to identify Peter’s mental content by what someone attributes to him; after all, an attribution of content is itself a contentful mental state (Boghossian 2010; cf. Kriegel 2010). As a second matter, one needs some constraints on what can be attributed to Peter, yet it is unclear what these would be (Boghossian 2010). So it remains unclear whether the “interpretivist” response to Peter remains viable.

Copyright © 2017 by
T. Parent <>

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