Supplement to Externalism and Self-Knowledge

Variations on Slow Switching

Regarding the slow switch experiment, the default interpretation is that Oscar’s water concept is wholly replaced with a twin water concept (see, e.g., Ludlow 1996, Brueckner 1997). Following Bernecker (2010), call this the “conceptual replacement” interpretation. Yet when considering Burge’s “preservative memory,” we saw that Oscar could conceivably retain the water concept while acquiring an additional concept (even if he cannot discriminate between the two). Call this the “conceptual addition” interpretation (favored by, e.g., Burge 1998, Boghossian 1989, Gibbons 1996). As may be expected, the details of the slow switch argument vary depending on which interpretation is adopted.

For instance, under the conceptual addition interpretation, ‘water’ in Oscar’s mouth becomes equivocal: On some occasions it expresses the water concept, e.g., when Oscar expresses childhood memories. On other occasions it expresses the twin water concept, e.g., when he asks his waiter on Twin Earth for a glass of “water.” Yet one can also question whether the newer concept is the twin water concept, specifically. Instead it may be that the additional concept is disjunctive, in denoting water or twin water. Alternatively, an externalist may even suggest that Oscar expresses more than one concept when he utters ‘water’, or possibly that it is indeterminate which concept it expresses. (See Bernecker 2010, ch. 6, for an overview of such options; Brueckner 2000 also is helpful.)

How should we decide among the various interpretations? Surprisingly, almost no externalist has pursued this question at any length, but two exceptions are Heal (1998) and Goldberg (2005b) (see also Burge 1998, n. 13). Though in Heal’s case, the aim is not so much to settle the question, as to illustrate that the issue is really much more complex than has been admitted.

Consider again Oscar’s post-switch utterance:

(W†) Water is the only thing I now drink; however, many years ago, I drank water fortified by gin.

First, Heal allows that (W†) can be interpreted in the way suggested earlier, namely, where it confirms the “shifty” memory view. The basis for this interpretation was the following.

(1a) The first occurrence of ‘water’ has a twin water content (since it is used in expressing a thought about the stuff presently before Oscar).

(2a) The second occurrence of ‘water’ expresses the same content as the first.

(3a) So, the second occurrence of ‘water’ has a twin water content.

But one might be just as inclined to reason thus (Heal 1998, p. 101):

(1b) The second occurrence of ‘water’ has a water content (since it helps to express a memory about the stuff on Earth).

(2b) The first occurrence of ‘water’ has the same content as the second.

(3b) So, the first occurrence of ‘water’ has a water content.

On its face, it is unclear why one argument takes priority over the other. Indeed, the latter may provide the more appropriate interpretation, depending on one’s purposes (Heal 1998, pp. 101-102). This is one complexity that seems underappreciated.

As a second complication, Oscar’s transition from English to Twin English is not entirely clean-cut. Heal observes: “in the early two or three days of a switch the victim, asked to indicate what he meant by ‘water’; would specify a mixed bag by offering phrases such as ‘what I had a bath in last week’, ‘what is in this glass right now’, ‘what, in its frozen form, I skated on last winter’, ‘what comes out of that tap over there’, etc.” (p. 107). And this raises the question “Under what conditions, then, is a switch complete?” (p. 107). (The “Triplet Earth” and “triwater” example on p. 99-100 is relevant here as well.)

An externalist can recommend some guidelines for untangling these knots. Most basically, they should be decided by one’s externalist metaphysics of meaning (of the sorts noted in section 1).[1] For instance, on Putnam’s (1975) externalist semantics, it is important that the environmental objects referred to“serve also as standard-setters by resemblance to which…other items deserve the same label” (Heal 1998, p. 103). (N.B., Putnam himself speaks of “stereotypes” vs. standard-setters.) Given that, “our practice of using natural kind terms can exist and have the features it does only because we have memories of and generally reliable abilities to re-identify particular specimens” (p. 104). Against this background, Heal concludes “[t]he ‘slow switching’ claim then amounts to this: after a while in the new environment a new set of (remembered and identifiable) specimens from the new environment will come to play the standard-setting role” (p. 104). The establishment of stereotypes and the acquisition of re-identification abilities are the crucial matters, for the externalist, in determining which concepts figure into which of Oscar’s thoughts, and at what times.

Goldberg (2005b) adds further tentative guidelines on the matter. The default should be to interpret Oscar in relation to his current environment, unless there is a defeating condition, e.g., where Oscar has just been switched from Earth. Another defeating condition might be when Oscar’s justification for a belief is reasonable only if he is interpreted with respect to the earlier, Earthian environment. Thirdly, the default may also be overridden if Oscar intends to be reporting a particular event from memory, and the event de facto occurred on Earth. This can happen, e.g., if Oscar’s second use of ‘water’ in (W†) is intended “to pick out the stuff I mixed with gin many years ago.” (This intention describes Earthian water, even on its Twin Earth interpretation.) It may be unclear whether either of the latter two conditions is enough to override the default. Though Goldberg suggests that either is sufficient if, in addition, were Oscar informed of the slow switch, he would disavow Twin Earth interpretations of his utterances and beliefs (roughly put) (2005, p. 114).

Copyright © 2017 by
T. Parent <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free