Notes to Self-Knowledge

1. One reaction to this worry is to construe privileged self-knowledge as exclusively concerning the epistemic status of self-attributions. Self-attributions may be especially secure even if they result from a process that changes their objects. Compare: Opening the refrigerator door may allow me to know that the light is on at that moment even if my opening the door turns the light on. In effect, this is to deny the idea that what’s special about self-knowledge is a matter of access, since to impute privileged access is to say that one has some special way of grasping a fact, prior to actually grasping it. (This point is discussed further in 3.5.)

2. For more on this issue, see Conee (2005), who objects to Williamson’s argument and presents an alternative, epistemically internalist challenge to luminosity; and Berker (2008), who defends luminosity from Williamson’s challenge.

3. An interesting side note: inner sense theorists often accept the higher-order perception (“HOP”) theory of consciousness. On this theory, conscious states are just those mental states of which the subject has higher-order, quasi-perceptual awareness (see the entry on higher-order theories of consciousness). Combining an inner sense account with a HOP theory of consciousness is one approach to the problem of consciousness (see the entry on consciousness).

4. The reasons account also aims to accommodate an intuition at the core of agentialist accounts (see 3.7): that in self-attributing (or “avowing”) the belief that taxes on the wealthy should be increased, say, one does not simply register this belief as one might register the presence of an itch, but in effect commits oneself to it.

[W]hen a self-ascription of a reason-led state [e.g., a belief or intention] is made on the basis of the occurrence of a conscious state in this way, it is not a mere report of that state. It involves the same kind of endorsement and commitment as would be made in entering the first-order, reason-led state itself. (Peacocke 1999: 235)

5. In an earlier paper, Byrne expresses this point in terms of following the rule “If p, believe that you believe that p” (Byrne 2005).

6. By invoking safety, Byrne blocks the objection that the doxastic schema cannot yield knowledge in any case where the first-order belief (the premise p) is false. That objection stems from a popular diagnosis of Gettier cases, namely that inference resting on a false premise cannot yield knowledge (see section 3 of the entry on the analysis of knowledge). As Byrne observes, the idea that knowledge requires safety provides for an alternative diagnosis of Gettier cases.

7. Moreover, reflection on accessible evidence about whether p may actually change a pre-existing belief on this issue.

When people are asked why they feel the way they do about something, they often change their attitudes in the direction of the attitude implied by their reasons. (Wilson and Kraft 1993: 409)

8. Gallois supports this claim with the following argument. Suppose someone who believes the universe came into existence six thousand years ago learns about the Big Bang, and thereby comes to believe the universe came into existence several billion years ago. This thinker must recognize this as a shift in her subjective justification (what she takes to be evidence). Otherwise, it would appear as a shift in facts about the age of the universe, and thereby yield a “bizarre” picture of reality. And, Gallois contends, a rational person can know a priori that the world is not bizarre.

9. “Constitutivism” is sometimes used differently, to refer to the thesis that self-attribution of a mental state constitutes being in that mental state.

10. A related objection is pressed by Siewert (2003); Zimmerman 2006 defends Shoemaker’s constitutivism from Peacocke’s objection.

11. For Burge, “entitlements are epistemic rights or warrants that need not be understood by or even accessible to the subject” (Burge 1993: 458). In addition to the kind of permissibility described here, Burgean entitlement also involves reliability: judgments to which one is epistemically entitled are “well-positioned to achieve or indicate truth in normal circumstances” (1993: 507).

12. Note that the division between reasons-sensitive and reasons-insensitive attitudes is not the same as the division between occurrent and dispositional attitudes mentioned in 3.5 above.

13. Agentialism is committed to a basic division between two classes of attitudes: avowable, reasons-sensitive attitudes, and reasons-insensitive attitudes. It thus stands in stark opposition not only to purely epistemic accounts of self-knowledge but also to Humeanism about the attitudes (see section 5.3 of the entry on David Hume).

14. Lawlor’s claim is supported by a study by Schultheiss and Brunstein (1999), which suggests that “people can detect their nonconscious dispositions and motives by vividly imagining a future situation and attending to how it would make them feel.” (Wilson and Dunn 2004: 507).

15. Snowdon (2012) describes some cases where first-person authority is absent.

Copyright © 2015 by
Brie Gertler <>

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