Supplement to Self-Knowledge

Knowledge of the Self

The main entry focused on knowledge of one's own mental states. Yet “self-knowledge” can also be used to refer to knowledge of the self and its nature. Issues about knowledge of the self include: (1) how it is that one distinguishes oneself from others, as the object of a self-attribution; (2) whether self-awareness yields a grasp of the material or non-material nature of the self; (3) whether self-awareness yields a grasp of one's personal identity over time; and (4) what sort of self-understanding is required for rational or free agency. These issues are closely connected with referential semantics, the mind-body problem, the metaphysics of personal identity, and moral psychology, respectively. This section briefly sketches some prominent views about knowledge of the self arising from debates in these areas.


In self-attributing a mental state, I recognize the state as mine in some sense, and my self-attribution partially consists in a reference to myself. This reference is reflexive, in that I think of myself as myself and not, e.g., as BG, or as the shortest person in the room. Nozick (1981) underscores the significance of being able to thus refer to oneself: “To be an I, a self, is to have the capacity for reflexive self-reference”. This raises the question: how is it that I identify myself, and distinguish myself from others?

Consider: seeing a flushed red face on film, I might wonder whether the face I see is mine or my identical twin's, and therefore I may say, “someone is embarrassed, but is it me?” Evans (1982) argues that for some kinds of self-attributions, such a question will not arise. Adopting a term from Shoemaker (1968), he describes self-attributions of the relevant type as “immune to error through misidentification”.

None of the following utterances appears to make sense when the first component expresses knowledge gained in the appropriate way: “Someone's legs are crossed, but is it my legs that are crossed?”; “Someone is hot and sticky, but is it I who am hot and sticky?”; “Someone is being pushed, but is it I who am being pushed?” (Evans 1982: 220–1)

Evans believes that my immunity to error through misidentification, in such cases, shows that I identify myself directly in these cases. If in identifying myself as the one who is hot and sticky, I used some information beyond the information involved in determining that someone is hot and sticky, then I could possibly be justified in believing that someone was hot and sticky but mistaken in thinking that it was me. Because that scenario doesn't “make sense”, he thinks, I must recognize myself directly, without any identifying information.

Others deny that self-identification is direct, claiming instead that it occurs by way of some sort of description. For instance, Rovane argues that, in self-reference, the way one thinks of oneself can be analyzed as “the series of psychologically related intentional episodes to which this one [the current intentional episode] belongs” (Rovane 1993: 86). While Rovane sees intentional states as the anchor to self-reference, Howell (2006) provides an alternative descriptive picture, in which the self is identified through awareness of an occurrent sensation.

Proponents of descriptive accounts claim that such accounts can accommodate the fact that we don't actually err about who it is that is hot and sticky. For instance, Rovane claims that it is unsurprising that we are reliable self-identifiers, given that understanding ourselves and our place in the world is required for genuine agency. (We return to the issue of agency below.) Still, there is an important epistemic disagreement between those, like Evans, who claim that self-reference is “identification-free”, and those who claim that we refer to ourselves via a description. The former maintain that there is, in a real sense, no room for error about who is hot and sticky, whereas the latter will say that while such errors are possible, we simply avoid them.

Notably, both “direct reference” and descriptive accounts capture the reflexivity of first-person reference. (For descriptive accounts, this reflexivity lies in the fact that “this one” refers to the very thought of which it is a part.) They thereby fit with the widely accepted belief that self-reference in the distinctively first-person mode is essentially indexical. (See Castañeda 1966; Perry 1979; Lewis 1979.) The dispute between Evans and Rovane is then, in part, a disagreement as to whether the indexical term “I” refers to the self directly, as Evans believes, or instead refers via an implicit indexical of another sort, e.g., “this” or “here”. In general, one's epistemology of self-identification will depend on what sort of indexical one considers most fundamental, in self-reference.

A final issue concerns the relation between self-awareness and awareness of other persons. On the leading traditional view of this relation, one first grasps that one bears psychological properties, and reasons by analogy to the conclusion that other creatures do as well. (This is the “argument from analogy” to the existence of other minds, articulated by J.S. Mill (1865).) Some recent philosophers have challenged this traditional view, contending that self-awareness is logically dependent on at least a conceptual grasp of other persons. For instance, here is Bermúdez:

[A] subject's recognition that he is distinct from the environment in virtue of being a psychological subject depends on his ability to identify himself as a psychological subject within a contrast space of other psychological subjects. (Bermúdez 1998: 274)

Materialism and Dualism

In a much-criticized piece of reasoning, Descartes (1641/1984) contrasts the certainty afforded by introspection with the dubitability of knowledge of the physical, to show that introspective objects (thoughts) are ontologically distinct from physical things. This strategy for supporting dualism has few current proponents. Commentators still adhere to the basic criticism lodged by Arnauld (1641/1984): that a purely epistemic premise cannot support an ontological conclusion. It is clearly possible to be (relatively) certain that there is water in the tub, while doubting that there is H2O in the tub; yet water is identical to H2O. Many contemporary materialists are similarly concerned to restrict the deliverances of introspection, arguing that while mental states appear, to introspection, to be non-physical, the grasp which introspection affords is partial at best, and systematically misleading at worst.

However, there are materialists who take the opposite tack: rather than rejecting self-reflection as a guide to ontology, they claim that some mental states appear physical. These arguments employ three types of self-reflection: introspective awareness of sensations, introspective awareness of perceptual states, and proprioceptive awareness of bodily states. Proprioception is the putatively direct, non-perceptual awareness of one's bodily state; it is what allows you to know that your arm is raised “from the inside”, that is, without looking at your arm.

The argument for materialism from proprioceptive awareness, due to Brewer (1995), is as follows. Proprioception is epistemically on a par with introspective knowledge, in that (i) it is a species of direct, non-inferential awareness, and (ii) it is “immune to error through misidentification of the first-person pronoun” in Shoemaker's sense.

Presumably, introspective awareness of mental states justifies the claim that we are mental beings, by virtue of its epistemic character. But proprioceptive awareness of physical states shares this epistemic character; so we are equally justified in the claim that we are physical beings. This argument falls short of disproving dualism, for it leaves open the question how our mental nature is related to our physical nature.

Brewer (1995) also builds an alternative argument along these lines, which seeks to rule out dualism by focusing on introspective awareness of sensations. This argument takes introspective awareness of sensations as intrinsically mental and, at the same time, intrinsically physical. Like the previous argument, it claims that awareness of physical properties is epistemologically equivalent to awareness of mental properties. But it goes further, contending that introspection provides an awareness of physical and mental properties, in sensations, as inextricable. It thus tries to block the possibility of distinctness between the mental subject and the physical subject.

A final argument to show that self-knowledge supports materialism, advanced by Cassam (1997), uses a somewhat different approach. Rather than relying on the spatial quality of bodily sensations or proprioception, this argument exploits one's awareness of one's own perceptual states. It says that in becoming aware of our own perceptual states and taking these states to represent a physical world, we are driven to conceive of ourselves as physical objects.

Broadly Cartesian objections to introspection-based arguments for materialism illuminate possible ways that the ontological conclusion can be flawed, consistent with the introspective evidence. For instance, the apparent proprioceptive awareness of the position of one's limbs could be nonveridical: an amputee might have a similar sense that her legs are crossed, even if she doesn’t, in fact, have any legs. (This does not violate Evans’ claim that such judgments are immune to error through misidentification: the error here is not one of misidentifying the subject, but instead of falsely ascribing a property to the self.) A similar argument could be made against the claim that sensations are intrinsically spatial, and that perceptual states represent a physical world. Even if one's sensations portray oneself as spatially extended, the idea that one is non-extended (immaterial) is logically consistent with the presence of those sensations or (apparent) perceptual states. Proponents of these arguments for materialism could respond by claiming either that knowledge of oneself as a mental thing is less certain than this alleged contrast implies, or that knowledge of oneself as a physical thing is more certain than it implies.

Personal Identity

The ontological views described in the previous subsection have no immediate consequences for personal identity. For it may be that the criteria of persistence through time, for persons, differ from the criteria of persistence for (other) material objects even if, as materialists contend, a person at a time is necessarily constituted by some matter or other. (See the entry on personal identity.) Knowledge of mental states is not usually thought to provide any special insight into one's persistence through time, since it is typically assumed that one enjoys privileged access only to one's current states. In particular, the individual has no special insight into whether her current apparent memories are veridical, and so has no special way to determine whether a particular prior experience was hers. Since views about first-person access played a greater part in shaping theories of personal identity during the modern period than they do today, my brief remarks here will focus on that period.

As mentioned above, Descartes’ meditator uses the proposition that there is thinking occurring, to which she purportedly has immediate (indubitable) introspective access, to establish her own existence with certainty. But this does not allow the meditator to grasp a persisting self. For Descartes, the self, like every other substance, is not directly apprehended; it is understood only through its properties.

Hume also claims that we never directly apprehend the self. Unlike Descartes, he concludes from this that there is no substantial self. In a famous passage, Hume uses introspective awareness to show that the self is a non-substantial “bundle” of perceptions.

For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I can never catch myself at any time without a perception, and can never observe anything but the perception. When my perceptions are remov’d for any time, as by sound sleep; so long am I insensible of myself, and may truly be said not to exist. (Hume 1739–40/1978: 252)

Locke agrees that self-reflection is important to the nature of the self. But while Descartes takes self-reflection to reveal that nature, Locke seems to suggest that one's self-conception constitutes the self.

[A person is] a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and considers itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places. (Locke 1689/1975: II.27.ix, my emphasis).

On some interpretations, what it is for an experience or action to belong to me (a Lockean person) is for me to appropriate it, or to impute it to myself (Winkler 1991). This interpretation underscores the importance of Locke's claim that “person” is a forensic term.

“Person”…is a forensic term, appropriating actions and their merit; and so belongs only to intelligent agents, capable of a law, and happiness, and misery. This personality extends itself beyond present existence to what is past, only by consciousness,- whereby it becomes concerned and accountable; owns and imputes to itself past actions, just upon the same ground and for the same reason as it does the present. (Locke 1689/1975: II.27.xxvi)

Locke's view of the self is usually considered less deflationary than Hume's view. But these philosophers agree that, in a very real sense, the nature of the self is bound up with one's reflections on one's states. For Hume, this means that the self is nothing over and above a constantly varying bundle of experiences. For Locke, it means that the self is defined by what we do—or, perhaps, can—self-attribute, through recollection and/or appropriation.

Kant repudiates the basic strategy shared by Locke and Hume, for he denies that self-awareness reveals objective facts about personal identity. He concurs with Descartes and Hume that we never directly apprehend the self (this fact is what he calls “the systematic elusiveness of the ‘I’”). And while he holds that we cannot avoid thinking of ourselves as persisting, unitary beings, he attributes this self-conception to necessary requirements for thought which do not directly support substantive ontological conclusions about the nature of the self.

A couple of contemporary views about personal identity are noteworthy in this context. Galen Strawson's (1997) view does not explicitly draw on introspective reflection, but it implies that the limits of a subject correspond to the limits of what could be introspectively grasped, at a moment. A subject is defined by (indeed, identified with) a period of experience which is “experientially unitary”. Since in humans an appropriately unified experience lasts no more than about three seconds, subjects are in fact very short-lived. Dainton and Bayne (2005) present a related view, which tries to avoid the result that subjects are very short-lived. On this view, personal identity is tied to (the capacity for) experiential continuity rather than experiential unity. But unlike Strawson's view, the continuity view is vulnerable to familiar objections concerning the possibility of branching streams of consciousness or “fission”.


The role of self-understanding in agency is a complex topic, and we can only briefly examine some leading positions on the issue here. Knowledge of one's relatively stable traits and dispositions—one's character—is believed, by some, to be crucial for the exercise of free agency. For instance, Taylor claims that self-reflection is imperative for being human (where this means, in part, being capable of agency),

[T]he human animal not only finds himself impelled from time to time to interpret himself and his goals, but … he is always already in some interpretation, constituted as human by this fact. (Taylor 1985: 75)

In a somewhat different vein, Frankfurt maintains that the capacity to rationally evaluate one's desires is required for freedom of the will. This rational evaluation issues in second-order desires, that is, desires concerning which desires to have or to act upon.

[N]o animal other than man … appears to have the capacity for reflective self-evaluation that is manifested in the formation of second-order desires. (Frankfurt 1971: 7)

It is only because a person has volitions of the second order that he is capable both of enjoying and of lacking freedom of the will. (1971: 14)

These claims by Taylor and Frankfurt go beyond the merely pragmatic observation that a reasonable degree of self-understanding is required for effective action. Instead, they assert that what is distinctive about the exercise of a free will, in determining one's course of action, is that this exercise involves the capacity to critically reflect on one's basic goals and desires. (For a related recent view, see Bilgrami 2006.)

While Taylor, Frankfurt, and Bilgrami stress that a broad self-understanding is crucial for responsible agency, others claim that particular actions require some awareness of one's intentions in performing that action. For instance, Searle (1983) argues that intentions are always self-referential, in that when one performs an action X intentionally, the relevant intention to act includes an intention to X so as to fulfill that intention itself. Anscombe (1981) similarly emphasizes the significance of one's awareness of intentions in acting. In fact, on her view thoughts about actions, intentions, postures, etc. have a special status: it is only thoughts about such aspects of the self that are

unmediated, non-observational, and also are descriptions (e.g., “standing”) which are directly verifiable or falsifiable about the person. (Anscombe 1981: 35)

And she also believes that action requires some awareness of these features of oneself. For criticism of the idea that action requires awareness of intention, see Cunning (1999).

One contemporary theory of practical reasoning, offered by Velleman (1989), casts knowledge of the self in a particularly important role. Velleman notes that we strongly desire to understand ourselves and, in particular, to understand our reasons for acting. On his view, this desire leads us to try to discern our action-motivating desires and beliefs. (He calls this attempt to gain self-awareness “reflective theoretical reasoning”.) But strikingly, Velleman thinks that the desire for self-understanding also leads us to model our actions on our predictions about how we will act. In this way, our expectations as to how we will act are themselves intentions to act. “Intentions to act … are the expectations of acting that issue from reflective theoretical reasoning” (Velleman 1989: 98). Thus, Velleman can say that our desire to understand what we are doing, at the moment we are doing it, is usually satisfied, since our predictions about how we will act are themselves intentions to act, and hence our beliefs about what we will do are “self-fulfilling expectations”.

Finally, there is an emerging literature which examine the effect of societal influences on subjects’ self-understanding and, thereby, on agency. See, e.g., Neisser and Jopling 1997 and Meyers 2002.

Copyright © 2015 by
Brie Gertler <>

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