Notes to Simplicity

1. Compare Poincaré’s remark that “simplicity is a vague notion” and “everyone calls simple what he finds easy to understand, according to his habits.” (quoted in Gauch [2003, p. 275])

2. N.B. some philosophers use the term ‘semantic simplicity’ for this second category. e.g. Sober [2001, p. 14]

3. This version of the distinction is reflected in some philosophers’ choice of terminology. See e.g. Gauch [2003, p. 270] who uses ‘epistemological parsimony’ to refer to elegance, and ‘ontological parsimony’ to refer to parsimony.

4. See Thornburn [1918] and the entry on William of Ockham for more historical and biographical details.

5. Thus, for example, the hypothesis that the damage to my lawn was caused by 12 rabbits is less quantitatively parsimonious but more qualitatively parsimonious than the hypothesis that it was caused by 1 deer and 3 rabbits.

6. We shall return to further consider some of these worries at the end of Section 4.

7. This follows the terminology of Sober [2003]. Barnes ([2000, pp. 355–7) provides a brief but useful division of approaches to the justification question into five basic categories.

8. For an attempt to give a pragmatic defense of parsimony, see Gauch [2003, p. 269]. Among the pragmatic advantages mentioned are efficiency, uniqueness, and accuracy.

9. For example Einstein’s remark, concerning his General Theory of Relativity, that “God would not have passed up the opportunity to make nature this simple.” (quoted in Kemeny [1959, p. 63]).

10. Also, such justifications are only a priori to the extent that convincing arguments for the existence of God are a priori.

11. Nolan [1999] is a detailed examination of an analogous issue, concerning whether Quine’s notion of ‘fertility’ is a theoretical virtue in its own right.

12. Historical details of the biogeography debate can be found in Fichman [1977] and in Nelson [1978]. For further philosophical discussion, see Baker [2007].

13. Such theories were called “extensionist” because they postulated the past existence of “continental extensions” such as land bridges.

14. The moves from the Ptolemaic model to the Copernican model, and from the Copernican model to the Keplerian model, both involved a reduction in the number of epicycles and free parameters postulated. Since these are both reductions in theoretical apparatus, rather than reductions in the number of objects (or kinds of objects) postulated in the world, this amounts in each case to an increase in elegance rather than in parsimony.

15. Gauch [2003, pp. 277–84] contains a good summary of the basic curve-fitting problem.

16. See Forster [2001], especially pp. 106–7, for more details on the comparison between AIC and BIC.

17. See Vitányi & Li [2001] for more on information-theoretic approaches to defining simplicity and complexity.

18. See Mendel 1865 for more details on Mendel’s experiments.

19. The issue is also discussed by Bunge [1963], and by Schlesinger [1963].

20. One argument for preferring \(H_1\) focuses on explanatory idleness. At first blush it seems that the extra neutrinos postulated by \(H_2\), \(H_3\), and the other less parsimonious hypotheses are explanatorily idle. For example, \(H_2\) postulates that 2 neutrinos rather than 1 are emitted following each Beta decay. Doesn’t this introduce an extra superfluous neutrino? However, this objection is too quick, as both Nolan and Barnes have pointed out. (Nolan [op. cit., p. 339]; Barnes [2000, p. 355]) Within the context of the explanation provided by \(H_2\), neither of the neutrinos postulated is explanatorily idle; the ¼-spin of each neutrino is required to explain the overall missing ½-spin.

21. For more on this approach to analyzing quantitative parsimony, see Baker [2003].

22. “In the economy of philosophy, the razor may be minted coin, but … the verso of the medal bears an inscription too.” (Groarke [1992, p. 195])

23. Cf. Groarke [1992, p. 196], who writes: “Ockham says: ‘Economical explanations are to be preferred.’ Chatton says: ‘Use as much explanation as necessary.’ We have then two sides of a sufficiency / economy principle.” In the same vein is Einstein’s remark that “Our theories should be as simple as possible, but no simpler.”

24. A more recent example involves the postulation of tachyons, ‘superluminal’ particles which travel faster than light, whose existence was postulated in 1969 solely on the grounds that it was consistent with special relativity. See Bilaniuk & Sudarshan [1969, p. 44].

25. Kragh [1981, p. 149]. This criticism is slightly unfair to Dirac since the 18th-century biologists were making a very restricted existence claim, that mermaids exist now somewhere on earth, whereas Dirac’s claim is spatiotemporally unrestricted.

Copyright © 2022 by
Alan Baker <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free