Skepticism and Content Externalism
A number of skeptical hypotheses or scenarios have been proposed which can be used as the basis for arguments to the effect that we lack knowledge of various propositions about objects in the external world, propositions that we normally take for granted and that we assume are obviously true. Descartes’ Evil Genius hypothesis is perhaps the best known such hypothesis. Another is the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis, according to which human beings are brains in vats whose mental experiences, although qualitatively the same as in their normal lives, are all caused by a supercomputer. The skeptic then argues that many of the propositions about the external world that we take for granted (such as “Trees are green”) are propositions that we don’t know, since our evidence for such propositions is often exactly the same as the evidence we would have in a vat-world in which these propositions are false.
Hilary Putnam (1981) proposed an interesting and much discussed attempt to refute a skeptical argument that is based on one form of the brain-and-a-vat scenario. In turn, Putnam’s attempted refutation is based on content externalism (also known as semantic externalism). On this view, the referents and meanings of various types of singular and general terms, as well as the propositions expressed by sentences containing such terms, are determined by aspects of the speaker’s external environment. In this entry, we will consider the basic features of and problems with Putnam’s original argument, and we will also present and discuss several of the most important attempts to reconstruct or improve upon that argument.
- 1. Skeptical Hypotheses and the Skeptical Argument
- 2. Putnam’s Argument Against BIV-Skepticism
- 3. The Disjunctive Argument
- 4. The Semantic Argument
- 5. Wright’s Reconstruction.
- 6. Disquotation Again.
- 7. A Simple Argument.
- 8. Reconstructions Based on Self-Knowledge.
- 9. A Successful Anti-Skeptical Argument?
- 10. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
1. Skeptical Hypotheses and the Skeptical Argument
The Cartesian Skeptic describes an alleged logically possible scenario in which our mental lives and their histories are precisely the same as what they actually are, but where the causes of the facts about our mental lives are not the kinds of events in the external world that we commonly think they are. On Descartes’ Evil Genius hypothesis, there is no physical world. Rather you are a disembodied mind, and your entire mental life, with all of its experiences, has been caused by an all-powerful, purely spiritual Evil Genius. As a result, your beliefs about the external world, such as that you have a body, or that there are planets in the solar system, are all mistaken. On the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis, a given person is a disembodied brain living in a vat of nutrients. The nerve endings of the brain are connected to a supercomputer, whose program sends electrical impulses that stimulate the brain in the same way that actual brains are stimulated when perceiving external objects. If you are a brain in a vat, suppose, your conscious experiences are and have been qualitatively indistinguishable from the experiences you have had over the entire course of your mental life. But if as the result of your computer-caused experiences you believe, say, that you have a body, then you are mistaken.
Given such an hypothesis as that of the brain-in-a-vat, the skeptic can go on to argue that there are many commonsense beliefs that we think we know, but that we do not in fact know. One common such argument is based on the widely endorsed closure principle that knowledge is closed under known entailments:
- (CL) For all persons S and propositions p and q, if S knows that p, and S knows that p entails q, then S knows that q.
Now pick any proposition about the external world that you think you know to be true but that is inconsistent with your being a brain in a vat, say, the proposition that you have a body. Then the skeptic can argue as follows:
- (SA) (1) You know that the proposition that you have a body entails that you are not a brain in a vat. [Premise]
- ∴ (2) If you know that you have a body, then you know that you are not a brain in a vat. [By (1) and (CL)]
- (3) But you don’t know that you are not a brain in a vat. [Premise]
- ∴ (4) You don’t know that you have a body. [By (2) and (3)]
Premise (3) seems justified by the fact that you have the same conscious experiences whether you are a normal human in a normal physical world or a brain in a vat. For again, the evidence you have for each alternative is exactly the same. So you don’t know that you’re not a brain in a vat.
2. Putnam’s Argument Against BIV-Skepticism
On Putnam’s version of the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis, the contents of the universe now and always have been relatively few. There have existed and now exist only brains in vats of nutrients and the supercomputers that send and receive messages to and from each brain. Putnam’s hypothesis assumes that each human (and each sentient creature) that exists or has ever existed is one of the brains in the vats. The supercomputers are so clever that their electronic interactions with the brains result in exact duplications of the mental lives and histories of each person whose brain is in a vat. Thus I, you, indeed we (all human beings) are brains in a vat on this hypothesis. Let us call a brain in a vat of this sort a ‘BIV’.
Putnam’s goal is to refute the skeptical argument that is based on the BIV hypothesis, by providing a counterargument for the conclusion that we are not BIVs. Thus, each of us is provided with a way of knowing that she is not a BIV, contrary to premise (3) of the skeptical argument (SA) above. The crucial move in Putnam’s argument is a sub-argument to the effect that that if one were a BIV, one would not be able to grasp the meanings of various general terms, such as ‘tree’, ‘brain’, and ‘vat’. For in order for an utterance of ‘tree’ for example to represent or refer to trees, Putnam maintains, there must be some causal connection between uses of ‘tree’ and real trees (Putnam 1981 [1999: 37]). Following Wright (1992: 71), I will call this ‘the causal constraint’. A similar point, Putnam assumes, holds for the words ‘brain’ and ‘vat’, as well as for mental utterances of, and the concepts expressed by, such words. It follows that if we are BIVs, then since our uses of ‘brain’ and ‘vat’ do not bear the right causal relations to actual brains and vats, we cannot so much as think or say that we are brains in a vat (Putnam 1981 [1999: 31]).
Putnam goes on to suggest that while a BIV cannot think or say that she is a brain in a vat, her utterances of ‘BIV’ could refer to something else. For instance, the utterances could refer to (i) BIVs-in-the-image. That is, the utterances could refer to the succession of experiences as of being a BIV. In this case, the BIV’s utterance would just be false, since the computer program would never allow her to have perceptual experiences as of being an envatted brain as opposed to being an embodied person. (Of course, a BIV could only seem to be uttering words. So we should just identify her utterances with her mental ‘seemings’ to utter. See Putnam 1981 [1999: 31].)
In addition to ‘brain-in-a-vat-in-the-image’, Putnam suggests (1981 [1999: 36]) two other possible sorts of things that ‘brain in a vat’ might refer to for a BIV. It might also refer to (ii) the electronic impulses that cause experiences as of being a BIV or perhaps to (iii) features of the computer program that cause those electronic impulses. I will use the expressions ‘brain* in a vat*’ and ‘BIV*’ to provide a schematic representation of whichever of these three possible meanings of ‘BIV’ in vat-English is correct, or if none is correct, ‘brain* in a vat*’ and ‘BIV*’ represent the meaning of ‘BIV’ in vat-English, whatever it is.
The important fact for Putnam’s argument is that whichever of these possible meanings is had in vat-English by ‘I am a brain in a vat’, that sentence, as used by a BIV, will be false. We saw that in sense (i), ‘I am a brain in a vat’ would be false in vat-English, since a BIV would never have (perceptual) experiences as of being a BIV. Putnam does not explain why ‘I am a brain in a vat’ would be false in both senses (ii) and (iii). Brueckner (2016: 4) suggests that since in sense (iii) both ‘brain’ and ‘vat’ would refer to certain computer program features, a BIV would not be a BIV in sense (iii): no BIV would be a certain computer program feature that is “located in” a certain other computer program feature. A similar point would hold for sense (ii). From these considerations, Putnam then concludes: “In short, if we are brains in a vat, then ‘we are brains in a vat’ is false. So it is (necessarily) false” (Putnam 1981 [1999: 37]). Here, Putnam seems to think that he has shown the conclusion that he was aiming to show, namely, that we are not brains in a vat. But in fact, the most he has shown so far is that a BIV’s utterance of ‘We are not brains in a vat’ would be true. But this conclusion is simply irrelevant to Putnam’s goal, since as Putnam himself points out, the BIV’s utterance does not mean that we are not BIVs (see Brueckner 1986: 152 and Forbes 1995 [1999: 63]).
3. The Disjunctive Argument
Various authors have noted that additional information is needed to derive Putnam’s desired conclusion (‘I am not a brain in a vat’). One of the earliest and most important of these reconstructions was suggested by Anthony Brueckner (1986). He proposed that Putnam’s argument could reasonably be construed as an instance of disjunction elimination (\(p \lor q\), \(p \rightarrow r\), \(q \rightarrow r \vdash r\)) as follows:
- (B) (1) Either I am a BIV (speaking vat-English) or I am a non-BIV (speaking English). [Premise]
- (2) If I am a BIV (speaking vat-English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I have sense impressions as of being a BIV. [Premise]
- (3) If I am a BIV (speaking vat-English), then I do not have sense impressions as of being a BIV. [Premise]
- ∴ (4) If I am a BIV (speaking vat English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are false. [By (2), (3)]
- (5) If I am a non-BIV (speaking English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I am a BIV. [Premise]
- ∴ (6) If I am a non-BIV (speaking English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are false. [By (5)]
- ∴ (7) My utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are false. [By (1), (4), (6)]
It is important to note, as Brueckner does, that (7) is not Putnam’s desired conclusion (‘I am not a BIV’), nor does it alone imply this conclusion, since (7) is consistent with the speaker’s being a BIV, in the English sense of ‘BIV’.
To reach Putnam’s conclusion, Brueckner considers use of the following disquotation principle:
- (T) My utterances of ‘I am not a BIV’ are true iff I am not a BIV.
Note that (7) implies
- (8) My utterances of ‘I am not a BIV’ are true,
And (8) together with (T) apparently yield the desired anti-skeptical conclusion: I am not a BIV.
But Brueckner persuasively argues (1986: 164–165) that using the disquotational principle (T) in this context is illegitimate. In effect, (T) as used in this context is ambiguous (see Folina 2016: 159). Depending on whether the speaker is or is not a BIV, (T) will provide different truth conditions for the speaker’s utterances of ‘I am not a BIV’. If the speaker is not a BIV and thus is speaking English in uttering (T), then the truth condition for ‘I am not a BIV’ is just the condition that the speaker is not a BIV. But if the speaker is a BIV, then the truth condition expressed by ‘I am not a BIV’ is the condition that the speaker is not a BIV*, where ‘BIV*’ has the vat-English meaning of ‘BIV’, whatever it is (perhaps one of the three meanings that Putnam suggests). Note that on this interpretation, the argument’s conclusion (that the speaker is not a BIV*) is simply irrelevant, since Putnam’s desired conclusion is ‘I am not a BIV’ in its English sense.
On the other hand, if the speaker is assumed to be speaking English in using (T), then (T) together with (8) does imply the desired anti-skeptical result ‘I am not a BIV’ in its English sense. But, as Brueckner puts it in some later articles (1992, 2016), this use of (T) just begs the question, since for the conclusion (‘I am not a BIV’) to be true in English, the speaker must be speaking English in uttering the premise (T), and so must be a non-BIV, which is of course the conclusion to be shown. As Brueckner says, the argument
… is epistemically circular in William Alston’s sense: knowledge of one of its premises—(T)—requires knowledge of its conclusion [Alston 1989]. (Brueckner 2016: 4)
Another way to see that the argument based on the English sense of (T) would be question-begging is to ask whether a speaker would have warrant to believe (T) in its English sense, if the speaker did not already have warrant to believe that she was a non-BIV speaking English. Note that if the speaker were a BIV speaking vat-English, the speaker would not even understand (T) in its English sense, let alone have warrant to believe it in that sense. So it surely seems that the speaker could not have warrant to believe (T) in its English sense unless she already had warrant to believe the argument’s conclusion, that is, had warrant to believe ‘I am not a BIV’ in its English sense. (See Brueckner 1986: 164–165 and 2016: 4. The type of question-begging just described, as well as the type described by Alston (1986 ) would seem to be the same as the type identified by Crispin Wright and that he describes as failure of warrant to transmit from premise to conclusion. See Wright 1985: 436; 2000: 141–143; see also Davies 2000: 397–399.)
The proper conclusion to draw from Brueckner’s seminal discussion would thus seem to be that either the argument (B) plus (T) has an irrelevant conclusion (if the speaker is assumed to be a BIV speaking vat-English), or the argument begs the question (if the speaker is assumed to be a non-BIV speaking English).
In later work Brueckner 1992 and 2003 seems to raise a problem for the question-begging charge, when he points out that one can know that a given disquotational principle expresses a truth whether one is a non-BIV speaker of English or a BIV speaker of vat-English. We will discuss this issue below in section 6.
4. The Semantic Argument
In later work on Putnam’s anti-skeptical argument, especially in his articles 1992 and 2003, Brueckner seems to have abandoned his (1986) objection to uses of disquotation, such as the use of (T), in various versions of Putnam’s argument. In his 1992 Brueckner proposes a general schema in which to formulate specific Putnamian anti-skeptical arguments (1992 [1999: 48]):
- (I) If I am a BIV, then my utterances of sentences have non-disquotational truth conditions and express non-disquotational contents.
- (II) My utterances of sentences have disquotational truth conditions and express disquotational contents.
- (III) I am not a BIV. [By I and II].
Brueckner calls this the semantic argument. As an instance of the disquotational premise II, Brueckner considers (1992 [1999: 53]):
- (**) My utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I am a BIV.
Apparently as justification for use of (**) in anti-skeptical arguments, Brueckner notes:
This statement of disquotational truth conditions for my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ is guaranteed to express a truth as long as the metalanguage in which (**) is stated contains the object language to which my utterance ‘I am a BIV’ belongs.
So it seems that Brueckner has changed his mind from his 1986 and at this point no longer believes that the use of disquotation in Putnamian anti-skeptical arguments is question-begging. We will return to this topic below.
But while seeming to accept disquotational premises, Brueckner now sees serious problems with instances of the first premise-schema I. He considers the following instance of I:
- (Cond) If I am a BIV, then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I am a BIV*,
where, as Brueckner puts it, “‘I am a BIV*’ formulates the Putnamian non-disquotational truth conditions, whatever they are”. (As Brueckner had explained earlier (1992 [1999: 47]), these truth conditions would be “non-disquotational”, since the metalanguage in which they are stated does not contain the object language to which the the relevant BIV tokens of ‘I am a BIV’ belong.) Now for (Cond) to be true, its consequent must be true when evaluated at a vat-world. So consider the consequent of (Cond.):
- (Cons) My utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I am a BIV*.
According to Brueckner, since (Cons) is not disquotational, the metalanguage in which it is expressed cannot contain the object language to which utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ (as meant in (Cons)) belongs. But then, Brueckner argues, (Cons) can express a truth at a vat-world only if its speaker is not in a vat-world. Here, Brueckner seems to reason that since the metalanguage being used to express (Cons) does not contain the object language being described (vat-English), the metalanguage being used is a language spoken only by non-BIVs. Brueckner concludes, “we apparently cannot, without begging the question, use premise (I) of the anti-skeptical semantic argument” (1992 [1999: 55]; his italics).
5. Wright’s Reconstruction.
Crispin Wright (1992: 74) suggested an important reconstruction of Putnam’s anti-skeptical argument which, like Brueckner’s original reconstruction, also essentially depends on disquotation:
- (i) My language disquotes; [Premise]
- (ii) In BIVese, ‘brain-in-a-vat’ does not refer to brains-in-a-vat; [Premise]
- (iii) In my language, ‘brain-in-a-vat’ is a meaningful expression; [Premise] Hence,
- (iv) In my language, ‘brain-in-a-vat’ refers to brains-in-a-vat; [By (i) and (iii)]
- (v) My language is not BIVese; [By (ii) and (iv)]
- (vi) If I am a BIV, then my language is BIVese; [definition of BIVese] So,
- (vii) I am not a brain-in-a-vat.
Bob Hale (2000: 185) points out that the two premises (i) and (iii) involving disquotation are both acceptable. Both
might be available to, and warranted for, a proponent of the argument, regardless of whether she is or is not a brain-in-a-vat…. (his italics)
However, Hale argues, provided that the speaker of premise (ii) is not merely contradicting premise (i), she must not be using ‘brain-in-a-vat’ as a disquotation of “’brain-in-a-vat’”, as it occurs earlier in (ii). Thus the speaker of (ii) must not be speaking BIVese, and so must be a non-BIV. Hale concludes,
… in taking premiss (ii) to be available to him, Putnam is in effect assuming that he is not a brain-in-a-vat. Since that is just what he is trying to prove, his argument is viciously circular. (2000: 186; his italics)
Clearly, Hale’s point provides a powerful objection to Wright’s reconstruction of Putnam’s argument.
6. Disquotation Again.
Brueckner (2003: 156) considers the following argument:
- (A*) If I am a BIV, then it is not the case that my utterances of ‘Trees are green’ are true iff trees are green.
- (B*) My utterances of ‘Trees are green’ are true iff trees are green.
- (C) So, I am not a BIV.
In reply to the objection that use of the disquotational premise (B*) begs the question, Brueckner says that the objector would be right to reject a defense of (B*) that is based on the claim that since I know that I’m a normal speaker of English, I also know (B*). Such a claim would indeed beg the question, Brueckner says. But he goes on to suggest that knowledge of such disquotational facts as (B*) need not be based on knowledge that one is a normal English speaker. Rather, the former kind of knowledge “is simply part of understanding my own language (whatever it is and whatever I am)” (2003: 157).
In this reply, Brueckner seems to be relying on the fact that one can know that (B*) expresses a truth, whether or not one is a non-BIV speaker of English or a BIV speaking vat-English. That is simply because, whatever language is being spoken in uttering (B*), the metalanguage being used contains the object language sentence that provides the relevant truth condition.
But as Brueckner himself had earlier pointed out (1986: 165; 1995: 100)), while we can in this manner know that disquotational sentences like (B*) are true, we cannot know which truth is being expressed until we know which language is being spoken. In this case, if the speaker is a BIV speaking vat-English, then (B*) would mean “My utterances of ‘trees are green’ are true iff trees* are green” (where ‘trees*’ expresses one of the three possible types of meanings that Putnam suggests for ‘tree’ in vat-English). So on the assumption that the speaker is a BIV speaking vat-English, premise (B*) would be true. However, the conclusion (C) of the argument would then mean ‘I am not a BIV*’, and while this conclusion would also be true, it is also irrelevant to Putnam’s desired conclusion (in English) ‘I am not a BIV’. Moreover, note that if understood to be in vat-English, the premise (A*) would be false.
On the other hand, if we assume that the speaker is a non-BIV speaking English, then premises (A*) and (B*) would both be true, as would the conclusion (C). However, the argument in question, though sound, would blatantly beg the question. For in order for the speaker to have warrant that premises (A*) and (B*) are both true in the relevant senses, warrant must already be available to the speaker of (A*) and (B*) that she is a non-BIV speaking English.
We should also note that premise (A*) cannot be true if it is spoken by a BIV speaking vat-English, since disquotation holds for vat-English as well as English. Thus (A*) is true only if spoken by a non-BIV speaking English, and so its use begs the question for the same reason pointed out by Hale (2000) regarding Wright’s (1992) reconstruction.
7. A Simple Argument.
Brueckner goes on in his 2003 to consider what he would later (2016) call a modified version of Simple Argument 1 or SA1:
- A. If I am a BIV, then my word ‘tree’ does not refer to trees.
- B. My word ‘tree’ refers to trees.
- ∴ C. I am not a BIV.
Brueckner (2016) suggests that premise B begs the question, since its truth requires the existence of trees as referents for his word ‘tree’. So to know that B is true, he would have to know that he is “a non-BIV in a world containing trees, rather than a BIV in a treeless vat world” (Brueckner 2016: 5).
To avoid this objection, Brueckner suggests the following modification of SA1 (2003: 158, 2016: 5):
- A*. If I am a BIV, then it is not the case that if my word ‘tree’ refers, then it refers to trees.
- B*. If my word ‘tree’ refers, then it refers to trees.
- ∴ C. I am not a BIV.
Brueckner claims that B* can be true even if there are no trees, so that use of it here does not beg the question.
However, given widely held direct reference views of proper names, indexicals, and natural kind terms, views that are strongly suggested by the work of Kripke (1972), Kaplan (1977 ), and Putnam (1975), it is not obvious that the existential commitments of sentences containing such terms can be removed by merely conditionalizing or ‘hedging’ the sentences. (For a useful discussion of hedging see Yeakel 2016.)
‘Tree’ is a natural kind term. As such, it is plausible to suppose that this term’s primary semantic function is that of predicating membership in the kind T to which all trees belong. But suppose that there is no such kind T. In this case, the general term ‘tree’ would have no semantic value, since there simply would be no such property as that of belonging to T. As a consequence, Brueckner’s premise B* would express no proposition and would have no truth value, since the term ‘tree’ would make no semantic contribution to what is said by B*. Thus, in order for premise B* to express a truth, there must be a natural kind T to which all trees belong, and so Brueckner’s claim that B* can be true even if there are no trees seems doubtful.
We should again note that use of premise (A*) begs the question for the same reason that was pointed out by Hale (2000) regarding Wright’s (1992) reconstruction.
8. Reconstructions Based on Self-Knowledge.
So far, all of the reconstructions of Putnam’s anti-skeptical argument that we have considered have involved, in various ways, the use of disquotation. But one remaining type of reconstruction does not involve the use of disquotation at all. (A major advantage, some might say.) Rather, these arguments depend on the thesis that one can know a priori that one’s thoughts have a given content, even when that content has an externalist semantics. Arguments of this sort have the following form:
- (F) (p1) I am thinking that P. (By privileged a priori access to content.)
- (p2) If I am a BIV, then I am not thinking that P. (By Putnam’s causal constraint.)
- ∴ C I am not a BIV.
Arguments of this form have been discussed and defended by Tymoczko 1989, Warfield 1998, and Brueckner 2003, 2005, 2016. I will rely on Warfield’s argument of form (F), which is:
- (W) (p1) I think that water is wet.
- (p2) No brain in a vat in an otherwise empty world can think that water is wet.
- ∴ C I am not a brain in a vat. (1998: 78)
(Warfield explains that an “otherwise empty world” is “a world containing only the brain in a vat and whatever is necessary to sustain the brain in a vat” (1998: 77).)
Warfield suggests that one major advantage of his argument (W) is that it appears to avoid the charge of question-begging that (as we’ve seen) is so often made against other forms of Putnamian anti-skeptical argument. (A similar motivation is also suggested by Brueckner 2016: 5.) This is because, Warfield says, he can justify a claim to have a priori knowledge of both of the argument’s premises: premise 2 on the basis of externalist thought experiments by Putnam and others; premise 1 by virtue of the principle that one can always have a priori knowledge of the contents of one’s thoughts (pp. 78, 80).
By ‘a priori knowledge’ Warfield means knowledge that is obtained without either perceptual observation or empirical investigation (1998: 80; see also McKinsey 1991). Warfield’s view then is that one can always have privileged a priori knowledge of the propositional contents of one’s thoughts (the traditional principle of privileged access), even when these contents are external or wide, in the sense that having a thought with that content logically implies the existence of particular objects or substances that are external to the agent (see the useful entry by Gertler 2017 on self-knowledge).
Thus Warfield’s attempt to defend the claim that he has a priori knowledge of both premises of his anti-skeptical argument commits him to a view that we will call content compatibilism, the view that having privileged access to the contents of one’s thoughts is consistent with some of those contents being externalist, or wide. Other proposals of anti-skeptical arguments of the form (F), such as those by Tymoczko and Brueckner, also commit their defenders to content compatibilism.
But content compatibilism is a controversial view. Some have complained that it implies that we can have a priori knowledge of far too many things (see McKinsey 1991 and 2002). Consider for instance the case of Garrison, who thinks that Donald is clueless, so that the following thought ascription is true:
- (G) Garrison thinks that Donald is clueless.
On the direct reference view of names, (G) ascribes to Garrison a thought that has as its wide content the singular proposition that Donald is clueless. This content is wide in the sense that (with the exception of Donald) anyone’s having a thought with this content logically implies the existence of things or substances that are external to that person. In this case of course, the relevant external object or substance is Donald.
Now given the principle of privileged access, Garrison can know a priori that he thinks that Donald is clueless. But as we’ve just seen, it is a logical consequence of Garrison’s having this thought that Donald exists. Hence, Garrison can merely deduce that Donald exists from something he knows a priori, and thus he can know a priori that Donald exists. But this consequence is absurd. Surely no one can know that any given other person exists without perceptual observation or empirical investigation. (A similar argument can be given for thought contents expressed by use of indexical pronouns and natural kind terms.)
I take this argument to be a reductio of content compatibilism: one of these two principles, privileged access and content externalism, must be false. One who endorses content externalism should I think endorse a restricted form of privileged access on which we can have privileged access only to the narrow contents of our thoughts (see McKinsey 2002).
Given content externalism, then, Warfield cannot have the desired a priori knowledge of premise 1 (“I think that water is wet”). Does this mean that his use of premise 1 begs the question? Apparently so. Certainly, from a Putnamian point of view, the question is begged. For on that point of view, one could not have warrant for premise 1 unless one had warrant to believe that (unlike a BIV) one had satisfied the causal constraints on having the concept water. Thus it would seem that—absent any a priori knowledge of premise 1—one could not have warrant to believe premise 1 unless one already had warrant to believe that one is a non-BIV. (McLaughlin 2000 and Steup 2003 also contend that Warfield’s argument begs the question.)
9. A Successful Anti-Skeptical Argument?
It is doubtful whether Putnam’s causal constraint alone can be used to show, in a manner that does not beg the question, that any arbitrary person is not a BIV. However, it is possible to show, using Putnam’s causal constraint, that the argument (SA) for skepticism mentioned above that uses both the BIV scenario and the closure principle (CP) is, in a sense, self defeating. Here, recall, is (SA):
- (SA) (1) You know that the proposition that you have a body entails that you are not a brain in a vat. [Premise]
- ∴ (2) If you know that you have a body, then you know that you are not a brain in a vat. [By (1) and (CL)]
- (3) But you don’t know that you are not a brain in a vat. [Premise]
- ∴ (4) You don’t know that you have a body. [By (2) and (3)]
In their arguments against skepticism, Putnam and his defenders have been mainly concerned with providing arguments against premise (3) of (SA). But in fact, Premise 1 of the skeptical argument itself may provide the best reason for doubting Premise 3 of that argument. For consider the following anti-skeptical argument (AS):
- (AS) (1) You know that the proposition that you have a body entails that you are not a brain in a vat. [Premise (1) of (SA)]
- ∴ (2) You have the concept of a BIV. [By (1)]
- (3) But no BIV has the concept of a BIV. [By the causal constraint.]
- ∴ (4) You are not a BIV. [By (2), (3)]
(The inference from (1) to (2) here requires two additional, and I hope obvious, assumptions: (1a) Knowing a proposition requires having the concepts necessary for thinking the proposition, and (1b) The concept of a BIV is one by which the known proposition is grasped.)
Of course, the conclusion (4) of (AS) (“You are not a BIV”) does not imply that you know that you are not a BIV. However, note that all of the other anti-skeptical arguments considered so far also have this feature; they all have the conclusion that the relevant agent is not a BIV. It is then inferred that the agent knows that she is not a brain in a vat by virtue of her having deduced the conclusion that she is not a BIV from premises that she knows, always including assumed knowledge of the causal constraint.
In this manner, any agent to whom the skeptical argument (SA) is addressed may also reason through the argument (AS) to the conclusion that she is not a BIV and then to the further conclusion that she knows that she is not a BIV, and hence that premise (3) of the skeptical argument is false. Thus in any such case, if the relevant instance of premise (1) of (SA) is true, then the corresponding instance of premise (3) will be false. Thus in any such case, the skeptical argument will be shown to have at least one false premise, and the argument (relative to the addressed person) will have been refuted.
Note that there can be no issue of question-begging in an anti-skeptical argument like this. First, it is not the person to whom the skeptical argument is being addressed who is assuming premise (1) of both (SA) and (AS). Rather, it is the skeptic who is making that assumption. Second, the person being addressed can be taken to be assuming premise (1) merely for the sake of conditional proof. That is, she can be taken to be arguing merely for the conclusion that if premise (1) is true then premise (3) is false, so that at least one of argument (SA)’s premises is false.
It would seem, then, that Putnam’s causal constraint, if it is in fact true, can be used to refute the skeptical argument that is based on both the BIV scenario and the closure principle (CP).
We have looked at a number of attempts to reconstruct a Putnamian anti-skeptical argument that uses Putnam’s causal constraint to refute the skeptical argument that is based on both the brain-in-a-vat scenario and the closure principle (CP). Most of the anti-skeptical arguments we looked at used the principle of disquotation in various ways, and as a result, these arguments begged the question in similar ways to Brueckner’s original reconstruction of Putnam’s argument. Some of these arguments begged the question in a different way, pointed out by Hale (2000).
We also looked at a class of anti-skeptical arguments that depend on content compatibilism, the view that one can have a priori knowledge of the contents of one’s thoughts, even when those contents are logically wide. I suggested an argument against content compatibilism, the falsity of which opens this style of anti-skeptical argument to the charge of question-begging.
Finally, we saw that Putnam’s causal constraint, if true, does in fact raise a serious problem for skeptical arguments of the form (SA) that are based on both the BIV scenario and (CP). The problem is that when the skeptical argument is applied to particular persons, the causal constraint provides those persons with the grounds to show that the skeptical argument when applied to them has at least one false premise.
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Other Internet Resources
- Brueckner, Tony, “Skepticism and Content Externalism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2018/entries/skepticism-content-externalism/>. [This was the previous entry on skepticism and content externalism in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Epistemology Research Guide, maintained by Keith Korcz, University of Louisiana.
I am indebted to an anonymous referee who made many valuable comments, suggestions, and corrections on an earlier draft of this essay.