Notes to Social Choice Theory

1. When \(n\) is even, the first part of the theorem only holds for group sizes \(n\) above a certain lower bound (which depends on \(p)\), due to the possibility of majority ties. When \(n\) is odd, it holds for any \(n \gt 1\).

2. If different individuals have different known levels of reliability, weighted majority voting outperforms simple majority voting at maximizing the probability of a correct decision, with each individual’s voting weight proportional to \(\log(p/(1-p))\), where \(p\) is the individual’s reliability as defined above (Shapley and Grofman 1984; Grofman, Owen, and Feld 1983; Ben-Yashar and Nitzan 1997).

3. Optionally, one can stipulate that the utility from a tie is 1/2.

4. Completeness requires that, for any \(x, y \in X\), \(xR_iy\) or \(yR_ix,\) and transitivity requires that, for any \(x, y, z \in X\), if \(xR_iy\) and \(yR_iz\), then \(xR_iz.\)

5. In the classic example, there are three individuals with preference orderings \(xP_1 yP_1 z, yP_2 zP_2 x\), and \(zP_3 xP_3 y\) over three alternatives \(x, y\), and \(z\). The resulting majority preferences are cyclical: we have \(xPy\), \(yPz\), and yet \(zPx\).

6. Formally, \(\{x \in X : x \in f(R_1,R_2 ,\ldots ,R_n)\) for some \(\langle R_1,R_2 ,\ldots ,R_n\rangle\) in the domain of \(f\}\).

7. For present purposes, one can stipulate that the last clause (for all \(x\) in the range of \(f\), \(yR_ix\) where \(y \in f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n))\) is violated if \(f(R_1, R_2 , \ldots ,R_n)\) is empty.

8. Formally, \(y'P_iy\), where \(y' = f(R_1,\ldots, R'_i, \ldots ,R_n)\) and \(y = f(R_1 , \ldots ,R_i , \ldots ,R_n)\), assuming that \(\langle R_1,\ldots\), \(R'_i\), \(\ldots ,R_n\rangle\) is in the domain of \(f\). The definition presupposes that the social choice sets for the profiles \(\langle R_1, \ldots ,R_i , \ldots ,R_n\rangle\) and \(\langle R_1,\ldots\), \(R'_i\), \(\ldots ,R_n\rangle\) are singleton.

9. Sen, like Arrow in his definition of social welfare functions (as opposed to functionals), required \(R\) to be an ordering by definition.

10. Technically, this requires a domain restriction to positive welfare profiles.

11. Formally, \(X = \{p, \neg p : p \in X^+\}\), where \(X^+\) is a set of un-negated propositions. To avoid technicalities, we assume that \(X\) contains no contradictory or tautological propositions.

12. In principle, consistency can be defined relative to some side constraint such as the legal doctrine in the ‘doctrinal paradox’ example.

13. See also the remark on the relationship between path-connectedness and non-simplicity at the end of this subsection.

14. An earlier mathematically related, though interpretationally distinct contribution is Wilson’s work on abstract aggregation (1975).

15. We call an opinion function \(Pr\) on \(X\) probabilistically coherent if it is extendable to a probability function (with standard properties) on the smallest algebra that includes \(X\). An algebra is a set of propositions that is closed under negation and conjunction. If \(X\) is itself an algebra, as often assumed, then a probabilistically coherent opinion function on \(X\) is simply a probability function. In the context of probabilistic opinion pooling, \(X\) is often assumed to be an algebra generated by some underlying set of possible worlds, e.g., the set of all subsets of it, with negation understood as set-theoretic complementation and conjunction understood as set-theoretic conjunction. If we wish to lift the assumption that \(X\) is finite, then every reference to an algebra in this section must be replaced with a reference to a \(\sigma\)-algebra.

16. The learnt information \(L\) could be either simply the truth of some proposition (an event) or, more generally, a likelihood function. Much of the earlier literature in statistics on ‘external Bayesianity’ uses the latter modelling option, while some of the recent philosophical literature uses the former. Depending on how \(L\) is modelled, conditionalization then takes the form either of classical Bayesian conditionalization or of its generalization to the case of likelihood functions.

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