Sophie de Grouchy

First published Thu Dec 5, 2019; substantive revision Thu Nov 9, 2023

Sophie de Grouchy (1764–1822) was a French philosopher whose book The Letters on Sympathy offers clear and original perspectives on a number of important moral, political, and legal philosophical issues. As well as this book, which she published together with her translation of Smiths’s The Theory of Moral Sentiments in 1798, Grouchy wrote and published other texts pseudonomously and anonymously. In particular, Grouchy published articles defending republicanism and participated in the writing and editing of her husband’s (Condorcet) last work, the Sketch of Human Progress. Unfortunately her work remained in the shadow for many years. The fact that it is now coming to be known in the philosophical community is a function of the general effort in the last twenty years to recover work by women philosophers of the past. Grouchy is particularly relevant to philosophers working on (feminist) republicanism, eighteenth century philosophy, Adam Smith, and social and legal philosophy.

1. Life

Marie-Louise-Sophie de Grouchy, Marquise de Condorcet was born in 1764 at the Chateau de Meulan. She died in 1822 of an unknown disease. Her parents were Marie Gilberte Henriette Fréteau de Pény and Francois-Jacques, Marquis de Grouchy. She was the eldest of four. Her sister, Charlotte, married Grouchy’s close friend and collaborator, Pierre-Georges Cabanis. One of her two brothers, Emmanuel de Grouchy, Marshall under Napoleon, was reputedly responsible for the French losing at Waterloo because he chose to finish a dish of strawberries before answering a call to battle.

Grouchy was educated at home, benefiting from her brothers’ tutors and her highly cultured mother’s teachings. At eighteen, she was sent to the Chanoinesse school of Neuville, a convent finishing school for the very rich. There she continued her studies, reading Rousseau and Voltaire and learning English and Italian by translating texts by Edward Young and Torquato Tasso. This is also where she became an atheist.

At the age of 22, she married Nicolas, Marquis de Condorcet, mathematician and philosopher, who held the post of officer of the mint under Turgot. Together they moved to the Hotel of the Mint in Paris, and there they started a salon, hosting members of the political and literary international scene.

In 1791, together with Condorcet, Thomas Paine, the Girondin Brissot, and a few others, she started a journal designed to raise awareness of republican political thought in France. This journal, Le Républicain, only lasted a few months as Condorcet demanded it be discontinued after the Champ de Mars massacre, at which Grouchy and her daughter, Eliza, born in 1790, had been present.

Grouchy contributed several pieces to that publication (unsigned or signed “La Vérité”—Truth) and she also translated others by Paine. It was probably around that time that Grouchy wrote the first draft of her Letters on Sympathy, a response to and commentary on Adam Smith’s The Theory of Moral Sentiments.

In 1793, Condorcet was added to a list of men and women who were “proscribed” by the government of the Terror and had to go into hiding to evade arrest. Condorcet remained in hiding until spring of 1794 when he attempted to run and died under an assumed name in a small town outside Paris. During his time in hiding, he completed the introduction to a encyclopedic work on the progress of humanity which he had started several decades earlier. There is evidence that Grouchy helped him with this work during her frequent visits. At the very least, she edited an incomplete manuscript, adding several passages which were deleted by a later editor.

After Condorcet’s death, Grouchy, whose wealth had been confiscated, lived by painting miniature portraits. By the time the Terror was over, she decided to publish her Letters on Sympathy, addressed to her her brother-in-law, Cabanis, together with a translation of Adam Smith’s The Theory of Moral Sentiments which greatly surpassed existing translations.

From 1795 until her death in 1822, she dedicated her writing time to editing her husband’s works. She continued to participate in France’s philosophical life through her salon and kept in regular touch with Cabanis who worked on physiology and later, Stoicism.

2. Enlightenment and Revolution

Grouchy was very much a product of the Enlightenment ideas that influenced the French Revolution. As a teenager, she gave up religion and embraced Voltaire, Rousseau, and social justice. Her salon was the heart of the revolutionary faction that had the most contact with foreigners such as Thomas Paine. She was also, through Brissot, closely connected to the Girondins, and through him and her husband, Condorcet, to the French abolitionist movement. Although she did not herself write about women’s rights, it is not unlikely that she had some influence over her husband’s short piece on this subject written in 1790: “On the Right of Women to the City”.

2.1 Enlightenment Philosophy and the French Revolution

The Revolution was a time when philosophers came into the limelight, books inspired acts and reforms, and the words of Rousseau, Voltaire, Adam Smith, Thomas Paine and the Marquis de Condorcet were (at least for some time) authoritative. But it’s important to note that some of the philosophers who influenced the ideals and the course of the French Revolution were women. Sophie de Grouchy was one of them.

Voltaire and Rousseau were almost universally influential—everyone who could read had heard of them, and while some preferred one to the other, both figured in the collective imagination as a model for thinking social and political reforms. Grouchy had read both at convent school and Voltaire had been Condorcet’s friend and mentor. Unfortunately, his acquaintance with Voltaire began after the death of Voltaire’s partner, philosopher Emilie du Chatelet, which meant that there was no direct connection between her and Grouchy.

The main external influences for late eighteenth century French Revolutionary philosophers were Adam Smith and Thomas Paine. Smith’s Wealth of Nations had been a huge success in France and his economic thought was particularly influential for Turgot, France’s finance minister before Necker, and Condorcet, officer of the mint. Condorcet offered a copy of his Life of Turgot to Smith. While Smith and Turgot seem to have developed their theory of economics independently, there was certainly some correspondence between the two at a later stage.

Thomas Paine spent much of the period of the French Revolution in Paris, and he was a good friend of the Condorcets—Grouchy’s command of English must have been part of the reason why he liked them, but also the couple and their friends favored an American style of republicanism and Paine’s knowledge and ideas were very useful in helping define what that meant. Paine played a key role in the founding of the journal Le Républicain, providing several pieces, which were almost certainly translated by Grouchy.

2.2 Salonières

Although Grouchy was a philosopher who participated fully in the intellectual debates of her time—including those that led to political reforms—her status was never quite the same as that of her male counterparts because she was a woman.

The women who had any influence of the political life of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries are very often dubbed “salonières”. In other words, they were hostesses, whose job was to make sure that the men who came to share important philosophical insight in their home did not go about with an empty glass. Famous salonières of the French Revolution include Madame Helvetius, widow of the philosopher of that name, Madame de Stael, Madame Roland, wife of the Girondin minister of the interior, and Sophie de Grouchy. Although these women were hostesses, their motivation for hosting was perhaps as much the desire to be part of the debate as to facilitate it. It was easier for a woman to talk politics in her own home than anywhere else. Although women could attend men’s clubs—at least until 1793—and the Assembly, they could only listen. Several of the salonières of the revolution became writers of note, including Madame Roland, Madame de Stael, and Sophie de Grouchy. Unfortunately, historians of the revolution, starting with Michelet but continuing to these days, ensured that they only became famous as hostesses rather than as the thinkers and writers they were.

2.3 The Gironde

One faction of the Revolution that was particularly welcoming to women was the Gironde. This was in part at least because their unofficial leader, Brissot, found it easy to admire and respect women’s intellect. He had known Catharine Macaulay in England and been instrumental in her republican History of England being translated to French. He was a close friend and correspondent of Manon Roland and had published (anonymously, following her wishes) several of her reflections on the Revolution in his paper Le Patriote Francois. Brissot was also a close friend and collaborator of fellow editor Louise Keralio-Robert. It was he who convinced the French Theatre to put on Olympe de Gouges’s abolitionist play, Zamore and Mirza, and then invited her to join his Society of Friends of the Black. He was also on the editorial board of Le Républicain, and advertised it in Le Patriote.

Condorcet was strongly implicated in the Girondist party by February 1793 as he drafted the Gironde’s constitutional project. In July 1793, a list of 21 “proscribed” Girondins was issued, and 39 names (including Condorcet’s) were added shortly afterwards. Brissot and twenty-one others were arrested. They were tried on 24 October and executed on the last day of that month. It took just over half an hour for the twenty-two heads to fall. Others who had escaped, including Manon Roland’s husband (the interior minister Jean-Marie Roland) and her lover (the politician François Buzot) committed suicide shortly afterwards. After several months spent in hiding in Paris, Condorcet too attempted to escape. He died in prison in Bourg-la-Reine in March 1795, either by swallowing poison hidden for him in a ring by his brother in law Cabanis or from a heart attack brought on by his long walk from Paris.

Many of the projects began by the Gironde were more or less given up by those who came after, including the abolition of slavery and the emancipation of women.

3. Works

Sophie de Grouchy only published one book in her own name: a short text entitled Huit Lettres sur la Sympathie translated as The Letters on Sympathy, which she appended to her translation of two texts by Adam Smith: The Theory of Moral Sentiments and The Origins of Language. We do, however, have evidence that she wrote other texts. Grouchy edited a republican journal with her husband in 1791 and there are two articles that, although unsigned, can be attributed to her. She also contributed translations and articles by Thomas Paine to the journal, and later published her own translation of Adam Smith’s works. There is also evidence of some unpublished (and possibly unfinished) work, which Condorcet refers to in a letter to his daughter.

3.1 The Letters on Sympathy

The Letters on Sympathy were first drafted in 1791 or 1792, but published in 1798 alongside a translation of Smith’s Theory of Moral Sentiment and Origins of Language. According to Grouchy’s daughter, Grouchy decided to translate Smith because she needed money. It also provided her with the opportunity to publish her own response to Smith. She ensured that it did not get mistaken for a simple introduction by printing it at the end of the translations, rather than the beginning.

Grouchy is enthusiastic about Smith’s views—she agrees with him that moral sentiments and judgments can be derived from sympathy and that we need to develop our rational abilities in order to render this capacity useful. But she takes issue with certain aspects of those views. In particular, she feels that he has not dug sufficiently deep in order to understand what sympathy is. He has noted “its existence, and its principal effects”, but not gone back to “its first cause, showing how it must belong to all sensible beings capable of reflection” (Letter I, p.3). This first cause she traces back to infanthood, and to the very physical relationship of a baby with its nurse. Grouchy does not talk about mothers there. She is careful to distinguish between the physical relationship, skin on skin, feeding, and the moral one, the duty a mother may have to nurture her children, and the duties of the children to love and respect their mother. In that she differs from Manon Roland and Mary Wollstonecraft who thought that an infant needed to be fed by his own mother in order to flourish morally. What Grouchy is looking for is a physical trigger to the sensations of pleasure and pain that will eventually give rise to sentiments of sympathy, and this trigger has to be common to all human beings in order to account for the ubiquitous presence of sympathy in human societies. Every baby that survives to an age where they may develop sentiments will have been fed by another human, and there will have been no previous universal experience suited to stimulate the sensations that can lead to these sentiments. Grouchy not only traces sympathy back to its origins, but her account is distinctly naturalistic. This cashes out in her description of the growth of sympathy and the birth of morality.

The text takes the form of eight letters, addressed to C***. Although some readers have conjectured that C*** was her husband, Condorcet, there is evidence that the letters are addressed to her brother-in-law, close friend and collaborator Pierre-George Cabanis. Cabanis shared an interest with Grouchy on the role of physiology in human behavior and morality, as well as in social reforms.

The eight letters function like chapters and take the reader through the argument, which starts with the origins of sympathy, and end with the application of the theory developed to social, legal and political reform. Although the format is epistolary, there is no question that these are not real letters but chapters of a short treatise. The argument sustained throughout the text and the addresses to C*** at the beginning and at the end serve as transition passages from one part of the argument to the other.

The first letter explains how the author is going to depart from Smith’s own argument. Smith, she says, has merely postulated sympathy as a human disposition, but what is needed in order to understand more fully the workings of sympathy is an inquiry into its origins. She then goes on to argue that these origins are physiological in nature, arising from an infant’s first human, skin on skin contact (with her nurse) and the discovery of pleasure and pain. The next two letters offer a theory of the development of sympathy through reason, showing how we extend our sympathy to a greater circle as we develop, and distinguishing between different sorts of sympathies. Letters IV and V offer an account of the origins of morality out of sympathy, in which the author mostly agrees with Smith. In the final three letters Grouchy explores the implications of her theory for the legal, social, economic and political reforms called for, and made possible, by the French Revolution.

3.2 Political Journalism and Translations

Le Républicain, edited by the founding members of the Society of the same name (Condorcet, Brissot, Paine, Duchatelet, Dumont, and Sophie de Grouchy) lasted for four issues in the spring/summer 1791. Grouchy seems to have been quite involved in the production of the journal. In the first issue, she translated two pieces by Thomas Paine (one of which is signed Duchastellet, despite having been written by Paine). The third piece in that first issue is signed “La Vérité” (Truth) which featured as a signature on Grouchy’s stationary. Stylistically, it appears to have been a collaboration between Grouchy and Condorcet. Its argument is a justification of the revolution to foreigners, an explanation of how the republican principles it embodied contribute to freeing the people of France and how they will, at the right time, do the same for other countries. The main piece of the second issue is the first half of a long paper discussing a letter written by Louis XVI to the people of France before his attempted escape. It offers a republican analysis of the pitfalls of monarchy, even when the monarch in question is not a tyrant. The article was first drafted by Dumont, but he later withdrew it and it was significantly rewritten using arguments, phrases and style that can be found in the Letters on Sympathy. The third issue contains the end of that article, another letter by Paine, translated by Grouchy, and a short piece entitled “Letter from a Young Mechanic” which is unsigned but attributed to Grouchy in which the fictional mechanical inventor who is a student of Vaucanson proposes that the royal family be replaced by a set of automata. Even though such machines are expensive, it says, they will cost a fraction of what the French people are spending on their actual king. And what’s more, the mechanical king, far from being a tyrant, will raise its pen and sign everything its government wants it to! Jacques Vaucanson, the putative teacher of the fictional author was a famous inventor, and one whose inventions Condorcet had praised in his works as an example of the sort of technical activity that could be just as inspirational as theories (Condorcet, Oeuvres, 413–437, and Belhoste 1994: 127).

A recurrent theme both in the “Letter from a Young Mechanic” and “Observations on the King’s Letter” is the financial cost of maintaining a royal family. Grouchy, who had lived for some years in the Hotel de Monnaies while Condorcet was the inspector general of the Monnaie de Paris under Necker, had some knowledge of economics. Condorcet himself advocated a liberal economy, much closer to his previous superior, Turgot, a Physiocrat who believed in a laisser-faire economy. Together Turgot and Condorcet had attempted in 1774 to solve the problem of the growing price of bread by letting the farmers decide how they sold their flour, instead of controlling the market. Unfortunately their reform was followed by a drought and later severe hail storms so that whatever grain had managed to push through the dry soil was destroyed because it could not be harvested. The king, rather than following Necker’s advice and waiting for his reforms to have their effect—after all no amount of reform could change the weather—sacked Turgot and gave his job to Necker. This did nothing to prevent the people from starving and France found itself in the midst of the “flour wars” with riots in Paris and pillages in the countryside by people who could no longer afford to buy bread, or who spent their entire income on it, leaving nothing for clothes or housing. The final issue of the journal contains a long essay on the creation of an electoral council, a piece later reprinted as part of Condorcet’s works.

In 1798, Grouchy published a two volume translation of Adam Smith’s The Theory of Moral Sentiments and A Dissertation on the Origins of Languages. Her translation was notable in that it was based on the seventh (1792) and most authoritative edition of Smiths’s work. Also, unlike previous translators of The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Grouchy followed the text closely, without summarizing, interpreting, adding, or deleting parts. Her translation remained in print until the late twentieth century.

3.3 The Sketch of Human Progress

In 1794, while Condorcet was in hiding, Grouchy advised him to work on the introduction of his unfinished history of human progress. There is evidence that the couple worked closely together at that time. Moreover, there are discrepancies between the final manuscript in Condorcet’s hand, and the first published version, edited and introduced by Grouchy. There are notable passages added that deal with the role of women and families in the evolution of humanity. On the first page of the first part, “Men united into hordes”, Condorcet writes that human groups are always family based and this is because mothers and fathers have a natural tendency to form strong emotional attachments towards their children:

A family society seems to be natural to man. Its origin is to be found in the child’s need for its parents and in the natural solicitude of the mother and—though to a lesser extent—of the father for their offspring. But the child’s need lasts long enough to bring into existence and foster a desire to perpetuate this life together and to awaken a lively sense of its advantages. A family that lived in a region offering ready means of subsistence could increase and become a tribe. (Lukes and Urbinati 2012: 9)

These passages were deleted in a later edition by François Arago who preferred to see them as inauthentic than as the product of a collaboration between Condorcet and Grouchy.

Condorcet’s discussion of the importance of the family for human society in these first paragraphs does not lead, as one might expect, to further discussion of how the family develops, and how it influences the progress of humanity. But in Grouchy’s 1795 edition, the idea that studying families is important in order to understand human progress is reintroduced in the last pages (Condorcet, 1795, p.322):

Until now, political history, as indeed, the history of philosophy and of science has always been the history of a few men. But what the human species actually consists in, the families, subsisting nearly entirely from their labor, has been forgotten.(my translation)

A history of families, Grouchy and Condorcet conclude, is what we need to study in order to truly understand human progress because focusing on isolated individuals, exceptionally bred royalty, or heroes whose paths are exceptional, cannot give us an accurate picture of how humanity in general changed through the ages.

If we take into account the influence of Sophie de Grouchy as his collaborator, we can interpret this framing of the work with considerations about family life as hers. It does give the work a distinctly proto-feminist flavor of the kind that goes beyond Condorcet’s principles. Focusing on the family and its importance for human development is crucial to the proper integration of women into the history of humanity and to make their lives central to any plans for future progress. Not only does it allow us to look beyond the odd, isolated woman who against all historical odds succeeded in asserting herself at the top of some discipline or other, but it also reminds men that they have a life and a set of duties within the family unit, that they are not free individuals moving history along with the sheer force of their courage or intellect, but fathers who need to change a nappy and help their daughters with their homework so that they too have a chance at participating in human progress.

3.4 Other Writings

We have evidence that Grouchy wrote other texts beside those listed in the previous sections. In his 1794 “Advice to his daughter”, Condorcet refers to texts and fragments by his wife, besides the eight letters on sympathy, dealing with moral philosophy. In 1792 Grouchy wrote to Etienne Dumont to ask him to read a draft of the Letters and the beginning of a philosophical novel. The fragments have not been found so far, and it is possible that they were destroyed.

4. Philosophy

The Letters on Sympathy, where the greatest part of Grouchy’s philosophy is to be found, are principally a response to Smith’s Theory of Moral Sentiments. The author states in the first letter that her writing was prompted by reading Smith’s book, and that where she disagreed with him, she wanted to develop her own views and arguments. Later in that letter she says what specifically she disagrees with: Smith does not investigate the origins of sympathy, and hence his account of its effects must be incomplete. Elsewhere in the Letters she specifies aspects of her argument where she either agrees or disagrees with Smith.

Grouchy is also writing in the context of the French revolution, and attempting, with her husband, to help bring about a number of reforms in France. This means that her philosophy is mostly focused on value theory—specifically moral, social, legal, economic and political theory.

Theoretical influences come from philosophers who turned to psychology and cognitive development such as Locke and Condillac. As far as political philosophy was concerned, we find influences from Voltaire and Rousseau, but also Fenelon and Montesquieu.

A further influence must be noted, that of her choice of correspondent, C***. Jean-George Cabanis was a medical doctor by training, but also a writer who attempted to combine his scientific knowledge with moral and social philosophy. His main work, On the relations between the physical and moral aspects of man in 1802 describes the effects that physiology has on moral psychology—character, he says, is inevitably affected by the body’s reaction to the weather, and by the function of organs, such as digestion. In her work, Grouchy also emphasizes the role of physiology in morality, arguing that sympathy arises first and foremost out of the sensations caused by internal organs.

4.1 Moral Psychology

Grouchy’s moral philosophy cannot be defined in terms of one particular influence. Her arguments carefully weave together elements from what we would recognize now as distinct ethical theories: ancient virtue ethics, stoicism, and utilitarianism.

4.1.1 Early modern developmental psychology

Locke was a major influence in eighteenth century moral psychology, especially through his Thoughts on Education in which he argued that every aspect of an infant’s experience contributes to her moral and cognitive development. Like him, Grouchy traces the development of morality to infancy, arguing that its first sources occur “in the cradle” when an infant experiences the pain of being separated from her nurse and the pleasure of being reunited with her.

From Locke, but also Condillac, Grouchy takes the idea that cognitive development is primarily physiological at source, but can lead, with the proper education, to the development of moral sentiment on the one hand (the soul) and of abstract ideas on the other (the mind). The two together, for Grouchy, gives us the idea of justice.

4.1.2 Physiology

The most important physiologist thinker during Grouchy’s lifetime was her brother in law Pierre-Georges Cabanis. In 1796, two years before the publication of the Letters, but four years after they were first drafted, Cabanis presented a number of lectures on a topic that was central to the most original parts of Grouchy’s response to Smith, namely, the role of the sensations of pleasure and pain in bringing about sympathy, and ultimately morality. His lectures were printed in 1802 under the title Les Rapports du Physique et du Moral. Arguing that morality was the result of reasoning about sensations, Cabanis proposed that “moral properties were nothing but physical properties considered from certain particular points of view” and that

[i]t is from that point of view that the physical study of man is principally interesting: this is where the philosopher, the moralist, the legislator must direct their gaze, and where they can find at the same time new lights on human nature, and fundamental ideas on its perfectioning. (Cabanis 1802: 78, 80)

Grouchy agrees with Cabanis that the ultimate source of human development is physical, and this is how she departs from Smith’s account of sympathy. Smith acknowledges that sympathy exists as part of human psychology, but Grouchy insists on tracing its origins and finds them in sensations of pleasure and pain. While Cabanis is mostly interested in finding physiological correspondences for particular moral or psychological phenomena, Grouchy, starting from simply physiological sources, builds a complex and complete theory of moral development, which starts from particular and personal attachments and ends in the love of humanity in general.

4.1.3 Pleasure and pain

The first causes of sympathy, Grouchy argues, are the sensations of pains and pleasure one experiences as part of our relationship to another. A baby who finds comfort at the breast of its nurse will experience pain when it is separated from it, and later learn to recognize and care for the pain experienced by the nurse. Grouchy distinguishes between physical and moral pleasures and pains on the one hand, and present and remembered pleasures and pains on the other. She also argues that we can derive abstract ideas of pleasures and pains.

4.1.4 Stoicism

The principal Stoic element in the Letters on Sympathy is the way in which Grouchy describes the development of sympathy as reminiscent of the Stoic “cradle arguments,” that is, offering a description of infant behavior as evidence of what is natural to human beings and not merely conventional. Stoic cradle arguments often invoke the concept of oikeiosis. The Stoics claim that what can be observed in infants is a natural concern for self-preservation. This tendency, oikeiosis, naturally grows to extend one’s tendencies towards self-preservation to an impartial concern for all (Annas 1993: 265). Animals and young children are capable of the early stages of the process—that of recognizing their own bodies as belonging to them, and learning how to use them for their own survival. Mature animals are also able to engage in later stage of oikeiosis, that of caring for their young. Human oikeiosis starts as it does with animals, but develops further—as far as cosmopolitanism.

The development of sympathy in Grouchy follows a similar pattern. We start in infancy by recognizing our own pains and pleasures, those that signal to us what we need to stay alive. From this the circle of sympathy is widened to include others who form part of our life, starting with the observations of physical pleasures and pains, in oneself and in others, then moving towards psychological sufferings, and extending the circle further to humanity in general.

4.1.5 Utilitarianism

Grouchy’s strong emphasis on pain and pleasure might suggest that her moral theoretical leanings are towards consequentialism rather than Stoicism. And indeed some of her discussions of what it means to do the right thing seem to be informed by consequentialism. In Letter V, she claims that acts receive reason’s approval depending on the extent to which they benefit humanity. In Letter VIII, she suggests that the value of the law can be measured in part in terms of the pleasure and pain it produces.

Cabanis (C***) agreed with Grouchy that the ability to see and recognize pain was central to sympathy and ultimately to morality, but he also sought to reconcile this with a form of Stoicism. What attracted Cabanis—and presumably Grouchy—to Stoic philosophy was the possibility it opened for a form of atheism that nonetheless saw something divinely pleasing in all living things. Cabanis’s last work is a defense of hylozoism rather than the materialism he is known for, i.e., the view that spirit, as reason, is everywhere, and most especially in humans and “higher” animals. But nonetheless, Cabanis explicitly rejects the Stoic view that pains and pleasure don’t matter morally, and indeed, suggests that even the Stoics did not believe this:

We cannot possibly agree with the Stoics that pain is not bad. Perhaps pain is not always bad in its effects—it can offer useful warnings, sometimes even strengthens physical organs just as it impresses greater energy and strength of will to morality. […] But if pain was not an evil it would not be so for others anymore than for ourselves. We should discount it in others and in ourselves. So why this tender humaneness that characterizes the greatest stoics much more than the firmness and the constancy of their virtues? (Cabanis 1824: 84)

Cabanis goes on to cite Cato, who gave up his horse for his companion on a scorching road in Sicily, and Brutus, who gave his coat to a sick slave on a freezing winter night. Stoics themselves do not countenance the view that pain should be ignored when it comes to acting. Therefore, one can be an ethical stoic and make the relief of pain central to one’s morality.

4.2 Political Philosophy

4.2.1 Liberty

Since the revival of neo-republican thought in contemporary political philosophy, several philosophers of the past have been re-interpreted as republican thinkers. This is the case, for instance, with Mary Wollstonecraft, who until recently was thought of as a liberal thinker, is now seen by many as an important source for feminist republicanism (Halldenius 2015; Berges & Coffee 2016). Although we should be weary of reading too much contemporary political theory into past thinkers, in particular when it comes to very technical arguments and definitions, it is nonetheless often helpful to focus on the central themes of republican thought in order to understand these thinkers. In particular, the Revolutionary engagement with liberty was very often framed in Roman terms with arguments that to become a republic was to become free from domination by an arbitrary power. These thoughts resonated particularly strongly, and sometimes differently for women philosophers as they considered whether their positions as wives and daughters in a patriarchal society meant that they too were dominated, and would carry on being so in a republic unless marriage and family laws were reformed. This was the focus of Mary Wollstonecraft and Olympe de Gouges, but it was less so in the case of Grouchy, who to some extent relied on her husband’s more powerful and influential voice to propose feminist reforms.

Placing Grouchy in a republican context highlights the importance of her work for the French Revolution and vice versa. Few political philosophers write in a vacuum; most are influenced by or wish to influence the events unfolding around them. But when the events are as remarkable as a revolution, then it makes no sense to ignore their impact on the work we are looking at. In the case of Grouchy, it is even clearer that she wished to participate, through her writings, in the making of the new Republic; in the summer of 1791, together with Condorcet and a few friends, she established a political journal, Le Républicain, the purpose of which was to enlighten the public as to what republicanism was.

Le Républicain lasted for just over a month, framed by two events: Louis XVI’s attempted escape from France, and the Champ de Mars Massacre. The aim of Le Républicain stated in its opening article, “Avis aux Français,” was to promote the ideal of republicanism, attempting to make it more respectable and better understood than it was at the time: “to enlighten minds on the subject of republicanism, which is slandered because it is misunderstood”. (Condorcet and Paine 1792, p.5

A theme that is strongly present in all the articles of Le Républicain, including the ones attributed to Grouchy, is the threat to freedom constituted by any monarchy, no matter how well-intentioned the monarch is. In this, Grouchy and the other authors of the Républicain differ from republicans inspired by Montesquieu, such as Sieyès, who believed that the form of government was incidental to a republican constitution as long as the ruler always acted in the public interest. Grouchy and others disagreed on the grounds that the hereditary power granted to a monarch is always arbitrary, so that even if it is benign, it is not reliably so. It does not matter, says Paine, whether a monarch is “a fool a hypocrite or a tyrant”—what matters is that this individual has “absolute power” over everyone, including those who are not yet born (Condorcet and Paine 1792, p.5. A monarch who is well intentioned may change his attitude for personal reasons and become a tyrant, or he may die and leave the power in the hands of a tyrannical successor.

4.2.2 Equality

Philosophers of the French revolution were interested in equality as well as liberty (fraternity was added later to the motto), but the equality that concerned them was equality of status, specifically civic status, rather than political status. Very few of them even thought about economic equality. Sophie de Grouchy wrote that all citizens are owed the same respect, and this implies that there should not be extreme economic inequality.

The central argument of Grouchy’s Letters is that virtue, moral or political, is born out of sympathy, the ability and propensity to feel others’ pain and to want to relieve it. Grouchy claims that we first experience sympathy as an infant in the arms of a nurse, and that we learn progressively to feel sympathy for the physical and mental pain that any other person experiences, whether or not we are close to them. But in order for this to be possible, we do need to see the suffering other as a human being, as someone just as capable of experiencing pain as we are. Extreme inequality means that this does not happen: the very rich and the very poor do not regard each other as being part of the same species, so that they cannot sympathize with each other and will not apply the laws of morality and justice in their dealings with each other (Letter VIII).

Grouchy’s concrete proposal to reduce extreme inequality does not include even the possibility of future inequality. She assumes that without legally supported inequality, natural inequalities (in intelligence and fecundity) would result in three quarters of the land being distributed randomly according to luck and skill and one quarter distributed equally between families. But this, she argues, with figures at hand, would still exclude extreme poverty or extreme wealth and would be sufficient to ensure that all citizens recognized each other as equally worthy of respect.

Although there is definitely a feminist background to Grouchy’s Letters, one which reflects her husband’s 1790 paper on the inclusion of women to the rights of the city, and perhaps in fact inspired that paper, it does not have a clear or central feminist agenda. Humanity in general is the focus of her discussion; women are explicitly included in the arguments (indeed, the very first teacher of sympathy is the wet-nurse, the most prominent example given of a good teacher is Sophie’s own mother, and mothers and fathers are equally enjoined to participate in a child’s proper education) but they are not given separate consideration. In her discussion of family law, she does mention reforms that would affect women more particularly.

4.3 Legal Philosophy

4.3.1 Citizenship

In her defense of equality, Sophie de Grouchy considers the problems brought about by inequality of status, privileges, and wealth and the way in which the law contributes to these problems by maintaining privileges. She is in agreement with the principles debated in the early days of the French revolution, in particular by Emmanuel Sieyès who argued that to be unequal in the eyes of the law is to be potentially dominated. That is, a citizen can use a privileged relationship to the law to abuse another. Grouchy argues that this was one the greatest wrongs of the Ancient Régime, i.e., when the law is not applied equally to all, those who cannot manipulate it perceive themselves as dominated:

[When the law allows for] privileges, hereditary, personal or local which offer a legal loophole, direct or indirect, [t]hen the people are tempted to see criminal laws as made against them and in favor of the rich, as the result of an association designed to oppress them. (Letter VIII, p. 152

4.3.2 Punishment

Much of Grouchy’s discussion of the law focuses of the question of punishment. Before 1789, there were a number of ways in which the law could kill its criminals depending both on the kind of crime they had committed and their station. Aristocrats were decapitated with a sword. This was regarded as the most honorable death, although it was not always the least painful or horrible. The Count Lally-Tollendal, who received the death penalty in 1766 for having betrayed the King’s interest at war, had to be hit three times by the sword before his neck could be broken and the head detached. Sanson, the executor of the Revolution, cited his example when defending the proposed new machine that would cut heads off neatly and instantly. Nonetheless, decapitation was more honorable than the sentences reserved for commoners of death by hanging (murderers) or the wheel (thieves, highway robbers). The crime women were most commonly accused of was infanticide or performing abortions. These were punished by hanging when they were found guilty of having killed their infants, but, as was most often the case, when evidence was lacking, they would do prison time for fornication, or be freed until more evidence could be found.

Grouchy’s discussion of punishment is clearly influenced by the writings of the Milanese criminologist Cesare Beccaria. Beccaria had already argued for the necessity of equal penalties for all as even privileges must rest on an equal respect for the law. His book On Crimes and Punishment published in 1764 was translated in French that same year and published with a lengthy commentary from Voltaire. Beccaria came to Paris and spent much of 1776 in Madame Helvetius’s salon in Auteuil. His influence was no doubt still present some years later when the Marquis de Condorcet, and their future brother-in-law Pierre-George Cabanis, and later Condorcet’s wife Sophie de Grouchy also became frequent visitors. This, as well as Condorcet’s close connection with Voltaire, and his own engagement at the time Beccaria’s book was published in penal reform, goes some way towards explaining Grouchy’s affinities with Beccaria’s claims. In her Letters on Sympathy, she argues that:

In order for the fear of a sentence to be effective and beneficial the sentence must not outrage. Its justice must be perceptible to average reason, and it must especially awaken the conscience, at the same time as it punishes its silence and slumber. But this will not be so […] if a judge can arbitrarily harden or soften a sentence; if there are privileges, hereditary, personal or local which offer a legal loophole, direct or indirect. (Letter VIII)

4.3.3 Marriage and family laws

Divorce was legalized and made more accessible for a brief period during the French Revolution before it was codified under Napoleon in a way that made much more difficult to obtain, especially for women. Grouchy in her Letters argues in favor not only of divorce, but of short-term, renewable marriage contracts and clear rights for children born outside marriage and for their mothers. In these she is in agreement with another woman philosopher of the Revolution, Olympe de Gouges. Grouchy derived these arguments at least in part from Montesquieu’s analysis of the Roman law in the Spirit of the Law.

4.3.4 Commercial law

Grouchy also argued that a heavily regulated market increased poverty, forcing the poor to remain poor, or even become poorer because they couldn’t regulate their exchanges or negotiate their work and production fairly. Grouchy, like Condorcet and Turgot, believed that shackling the market with strict laws was a form of domination and that allowing farmers and merchants to set their own prices would go some way towards relieving poverty in the country. Thus she can be interpreted as one of the original defenders of commercial republicanism (Bergès 2018a).


Works by Sophie de Grouchy

Editions of the Letters on Sympathy

  • 1798, Théorie des Sentiments Moraux, suivi d’une Dissertation sur l’Origine des Langues, par Adam Smith, traduit de l’Anglais sur la septième et dernière édition, par S. Grouchy, Ve Condorcet. Elle y a joint huit Lettres sur la Sympathie, Tome II, Paris: Buisson.
  • 1993, Lettres sur la Sympathie suivies des Lettres d’Amour à Maillat Garat, Jean-Paul Lagrave (ed.), Montreal: Presses de l’Universite du Quebec.
  • 2008, Letters on Sympathy (1798): A Critical Edition, Karin Brown (ed.) and James McClellan III (trans.), (Transactions of the American Philosophical Society, New Series, 98(4)), Philadelphia: American Philosophical Society.
  • 2010, Les Lettres sur la Sympathies (1798) de Sophie de Grouchy: philosophie morale et reforme sociale, Marc André Bernier and Deidre Dawson (eds), Oxford: Voltaire Foundation.
  • 2019, Sophie de Grouchy’s “Letters on Sympathy”: A Critical Engagement with Adam Smith’s “The Theory of Moral Sentiments”, Sandrine Bergès (trans./ed.) and Eric Schliesser (ed.), (Oxford New Histories of Philosophy), New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190637088.001.0001

Other texts by Grouchy

  • Condorcet, Nicolas de, 1808, Oeuvres, Edited by Mme de Condorcet (Sophie de Grouchy), P.J.G Cabanis, and D.J. Garat.
  • Condorcet, Nicolas de and Thomas Paine, 1792, Aux Origines de la Republique 1789–1792, Volume III, Le Républicain par Condorcet et Thomas Paine, 1791, Paris: EDHIS, 1991 (Contains several articles attributed to Grouchy).
  • Condorcet, Nicolas de, 1795, Esquisse d’un tableau historique des progrès de l’esprit humain , Paris: Agasse (edited posthumously by Grouchy).
  • Martin, Jean, 1927, “Achille du Chastellet et le Premier Mouvement Républicain en France d’Après des Lettres Inédites (1791–1792)”, La Revolution Française, Revue Historique, Nouvelle série, 33 (Janvier-Février-Mars 1927): 104–132. (Contains letters from Grouchy to Etienne Dumont.
  • Schandeler, Jean-Pierre and Pierre Crépel (eds.), 2004, Notes sur le Tableau Historique des progrès de l’esprit humain, projets, Esquisse, Fragments et Notes (1772–1794), Paris: Institut National D’Etudes Démographiques. (Contains the original and edited text of the Sketch, which Grouchy worked on with Condorcet).

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  • Bergès, Sandrine, 2018a, “What’s It Got to Do with the Price of Bread? Condorcet and Grouchy on Freedom and Unreasonable Laws in Commerce”, European Journal of Political Theory, 17(4): 432–448. doi:10.1177/1474885118782391
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Other Internet Resources

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