Notes to Being and Becoming in Modern Physics

1. As translated in Wheelwright (1960). The quote by Parmenides in what follows is also from this volume.

2. Many recent papers on these issues are collected in Oaklander and Smith (1994). Gale (1967) has some good older papers and a useful bibliography.

3. For an extended discussion of these metaphysical issues from the standpoint of an A-theorist, see Zimmerman (2011). For arguments by a B-theorist, see Pooley (2013). For skepticism regarding the debate as a whole, see Callender (2017, Chapter 13). The reader may gather, from these three essays and the references therein, that despite the apparent intuitive clarity of Figure 1, it has proven surprisingly difficult to formulate in a rigorous way the three distinct positions supposedly depicted or their various variants.

4. For a revival and defense of this idea, see Savitt (2002). See also Maudlin (2007) and Norton (2010).

5. There are many excellent non-technical introductions to the special theory. John Norton’s "Einstein for Everyone" is available on his web site at the University of Pittsburgh. Other fine currently available books are Mermin (1968), Mermin (2005) and Born (1962). A more demanding introduction mathematically is Taylor and Wheeler (1963). An excellent philosophical discussion is Chapter IV of Friedman (1983).

All the concepts needed for the present discussion are outlined briefly in the opening paragraphs of section 4 of Shimony (1993), but there is no substitute for working through in detail at least one presentation of the special theory at whatever level of mathematical sophistication one is equipped to handle.

6. While most popular presentations of special relativity explicitly employ only these two assumptions, Friedman (1983) points out that another assumption of a more technical nature, the flatness of Minkowski spacetime, is needed in order to derive all the characteristic results of the theory. We will ignore this refinement here.

One should note, however, that the two assumptions explicitly made are assumptions concerning invariance—the invariance of the speed of light and the laws of physics. That certain other quantities classically thought to be invariant turn out not to be so in special relativity has sometimes obscured the fact that there is a fundamental invariant special relativisic four-dimensional quantity called the spacetime interval that will enter our considerations in due course.

7. Hans Reichenbach indicated the same view in 1925. See Grünbaum (1973, p. 318).

8. Whether this suggested distinction overlaps or is independent of the distinction between tensed and tenseless uses of ‘is’ invoked above in the section on Newtonian Spacetime is an open question. Questions about the viability of this distinction are connected to deep questions in ontology and philosophy of language on which Carnap, Quine, and Sellars differed. See the discussion in Jay Rosenberg’s entry in this Encyclopedia, Wilfrid Sellars.

9. Minkowski spacetime is a time orientable manifold. If one chooses one of the two lobes of the light cone at a point \(\mathbf{O}\) to be, say, future, that choice can be extended smoothly throughout the whole of the spacetime. We say nothing as to how this choice is to be made in this entry, but we assume that it has been, somehow, made.

10. The three are free to choose \(\mathbf{O}\) as the origin of each of their coordinate systems and to assign it spatial coordinate \((0,0,0)\) and temporal coordinate 0. But what position and time values are assigned by each of them to other spacetime points now follows rigorously from the rules, the Lorentz transformations, of special relativity.

11. It is the fact the Rietdijk-Putnam-Penrose argument for the fixity of the future does not rely on features of natural laws or causation that leads me to call the thesis chronogeometric fatalism rather than chronogeometric determinism. Determinist and fatalist arguments have the same conclusion, that the future is somehow fixed and not within our control, but the former do so from causal or nomological considerations while the later do not.

12. Briefly, \(Rxy\) iff \((y \lt x\) or \(y \ll x)\). Clifton and Hogarth (1995) point out the relation betwen \(x\) and each point in (but not on) its past light cone also satisfies all the criteria of adequacy specified in the text.

13. This result is implicit in the proofs offered by Stein and by Clifton and Hogarth. It is made explicitly in Callender (2000).

14. Following Winnie (1977), I suggested calling this set \(\text{ALEX}(e_0,e_1)\), since it is an open subset in the Alexandrov topology. Now I prefer to follow the standard usage in physics and call these sets causal diamonds. Their use as relativistic presents is proposed in Savitt (2009).

Copyright © 2017 by
Steven Savitt <>

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