Supplement to Conventionality of Simultaneity

Further Discussion of Malament's Theorem

Havas (1987, 444) says, “What Malament has shown, in fact, is that in Minkowski space-time … one can always introduce time-orthogonal coordinates … , an obvious and well-known result which implies ε=1/2.” In a comprehensive review of the problem of the conventionality of simultaneity, Anderson, Vetharaniam, and Stedman (1998, 124–125) claim that Malament’s proof is erroneous. Although they appear to be wrong in this claim, the nature of their error highlights the fact that Malament’s proof, which uses the time-symmetric relation κ, would not be valid if a temporal orientation were introduced into space-time (see, for example, Spirtes 1981, Ch. VI, Sec. F; and Stein 1991, 153n).

Sarkar and Stachel (1999) argue that there is no physical warrant for the requirement that a simultaneity relation be invariant under temporal reflections. Dropping that requirement, they show that Malament’s other criteria for a simultaneity relation are then also satisfied if we fix some arbitrary event in space-time and say either that any pair of events on its backward null cone are simultaneous or, alternatively, that any pair of events on its forward null cone are simultaneous. They show further that, among the relations satisfying these requirements, standard synchrony is the unique such relation that is independent of the position of an observer and the half-null-cone relations are the unique such relations that are independent of the motion of an observer. If the backward-cone relation were chosen, then simultaneous events would be those seen simultaneously by an observer at the cone’s vertex. As Sarkar and Stachel (1999, 209) note, Einstein (1905, 39 of the Dover translation or 126 of the Princeton translation) considered this possibility and rejected it because of its dependence on the position of the observer. Since the half-null-cone relations define causally connectible events to be simultaneous, it would seem that they would also be rejected by adherents of the views of Reichenbach and Grünbaum.

Ben-Yami (2006) also argues against Malament’s requirement of invariance under temporal reflections, but for different reasons than those of Sarkar and Stachel. Ben-Yami (2006, 461) takes his fundamental causal relation to be the following: “If event e1 is a cause of event e2, then e2 does not precede e1.” He thus allows events to be simultaneous with their causes, and consequently the range of Reichenbach’s ε is extended to include both 0 and 1. Ben-Yami’s causal relation is not time-symmetric, which is his reason for rejecting the requirement of invariance under temporal reflections. He concludes (Ben-Yami 2006, 469-470) that, with his modified causal relation, there are “infinitely many possible simultaneity relations: any space-like or light-like conic hypersurface of an event on O defines a simultaneity relation for that event relative to O, and then, by translations, for any event on O.” However he then goes on to argue against the assumption that an observer, represented by O, would remain inertial forever, and ultimately concludes not only that standard simultaneity cannot be defined but that the only two simultaneity relations that can be defined relative to an event are those determined by its future and past light cones.

Giulini (2001, 653) argues that it is too strong a requirement to ask that a simultaneity relation be invariant under causal transformations (such as scale transformations) that are not physical symmetries, which Malament as well as Sarkar and Stachel do. Using “Aut” to refer to the appropriate invariance group and “nontrivial” to refer to an equivalence relation on spacetime that is neither one in which all points are in the same equivalence class nor one in which each point is in a different equivalence class, Giulini (2001, 657–658) defines two types of simultaneity: Absolute simultaneity is a nontrivial Aut-invariant equivalence relation on spacetime such that each equivalence class intersects any physically realizable timelike trajectory in at most one point, and simultaneity relative to some structure X in spacetime (for Malament, X is the world line of an inertial observer) is a nontrivial AutX-invariant equivalence relation on spacetime such that each equivalence class intersects any physically realizable timelike trajectory in at most one point, where AutX is the subgroup of Aut that preserves X. First taking Aut to be the inhomogeneous (i.e., including translations) Galilean transformations, Giulini (2001, 660–662) shows that standard Galilean (i.e., pre-relativistic) simultaneity is the unique absolute simultaneity relation. Then taking Aut to be the inhomogeneous Lorentz transformations (also known as the Poincaré transformations), Giulini (2001, 664–666) shows that there is no absolute simultaneity relation and that standard Einsteinian synchrony is the unique relative simultaneity when X is taken to be a foliation of spacetime by straight lines (thus, like Malament, singling out a specific inertial frame, but in a way that is different from Malament’s choice of X).

Copyright © 2018 by
Allen Janis <>

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