Supplement to Conventionality of Simultaneity

Transport of Clocks

A phenomenological scheme that deserves special mention, because of the amount of attention it has received over the course of many years, is to define synchrony by the use of clocks transported between locations A and B in the limit of zero velocity. Eddington (1924, 15) discusses this method of synchrony, and notes that it leads to the same results as those obtained by the use of electromagnetic signals (the method that has been referred to here as standard synchrony). He comments on both of these methods as follows (1924, 15–16): “We can scarcely consider that either of these methods of comparing time at different places is an essential part of our primitive notion of time in the same way that measurement at one place by a cyclic mechanism is; therefore they are best regarded as conventional.”

One objection to the use of the slow-transport scheme to synchronize clocks is that, until the clocks are synchronized, there is no way of measuring the one-way velocity of the transported clock. Bridgman (1962, 26) uses the “self-measured” velocity, determined by using the transported clock to measure the time interval, to avoid this problem. Using this meaning of velocity, he suggests (1962, 64–67) a modified procedure that is equivalent to Eddington’s, but does not require having started in the infinite past. Bridgman would transport a number of clocks from A to B at various velocities; the readings of these clocks at B would differ. He would then pick one clock, say the one whose velocity was the smallest, and find the differences between its reading and the readings of the other clocks. Finally, he would plot these differences against the velocities of the corresponding clocks, and extrapolate to zero velocity. Like Eddington, Bridgman does not see this scheme as contradicting the conventionality thesis. He says (1962, 66), “What becomes of Einstein’s insistence that his method for setting distant clocks — that is, choosing the value 1/2 for ε — constituted a ‘definition’ of distant simultaneity? It seems to me that Einstein’s remark is by no means invalidated.”

Ellis and Bowman (1967) take a different point of view. Their means of synchronizing clocks by slow transport (1967, 129–130) is again somewhat different from, but equivalent to, those already mentioned. They would place clocks at A and B with arbitrary settings. They would then place a third clock at A and synchronize it with the one already there. Next they would move this third clock to B with a velocity they refer to as the “intervening ‘velocity’”, determined by using the clocks in place at A and B to measure the time interval. They would repeat this procedure with decreasing velocities and extrapolate to find the zero-velocity limit of the difference between the readings of the clock at B and the transported clock. Finally, they would set the clock at B back by this limiting amount. On the basis of their analysis of this procedure, they argue that, although consistent nonstandard synchronization appears to be possible, there are good physical reasons (assuming the correctness of empirical predictions of the special theory of relativity) for preferring standard synchrony. Their conclusion (as summarized in the abstract of their 1967, 116) is, “The thesis of the conventionality of distant simultaneity espoused particularly by Reichenbach and Grünbaum is thus either trivialized or refuted.”

A number of responses to these views of Ellis and Bowman (see, for example, Grünbaum et al. 1969; Winnie 1970b, 223–228; and Redhead 1993, 111–113) argue that nontrivial conventions are implicit in the choice to synchronize clocks by the slow-transport method. For example, Grünbaum (Grünbaum et al. 1969, 5–43) argues that it is a nontrivial convention to equate the time interval measured by the infinitely slowly moving clock traveling from A to B with the interval measured by the clock remaining at A and in standard synchrony with that at B, and the conclusion of van Fraassen (Grünbaum et al. 1969, 73) is, “Ellis and Bowman have not proved that the standard simultaneity relation is nonconventional, which it is not, but have succeeded in exhibiting some alternative conventions which also yield that simultaneity relation.” Winnie (1970b), using his reformulation of special relativity in terms of arbitrary synchrony, shows explicitly that synchrony by slow-clock transport agrees with synchrony by the standard light-signal method when both are described in terms of an arbitrary value of ε within the range 0 < ε < 1, and argues that Ellis and Bowman err in having assumed the ε=1/2 form of the time-dilation formula in their arguments. He concludes (Winnie 1970b, 228) that “it is not possible that the method of slow-transport, or any other synchrony method, could, within the framework of the nonconventional ingredients of the Special Theory, result in fixing any particular value of ε to the exclusion of any other particular values.” Redhead (1993) also argues that slow transport of clocks fails to give a convention-free definition of simultaneity. He says (1993, 112), “There is no absolute factual sense in the term ‘slow.’ If we estimate ‘slow’ relative to a moving frame K′, then slow-clock-transport will pick out standard synchrony in K′, but this …corresponds to nonstandard synchrony in K.”

An alternative clock-transport scheme, which avoids the issue of slowness, is to have the clock move from A to B and back again (along straight paths in each direction) with the same self-measured speed throughout the round trip (Mamone Capria 2001, 812–813; as Mamone Capria notes, his scheme is similar to those proposed by Brehme 1985, 57–58, and 1988, 811–812). If the moving clock leaves A at time t1 (as measured by a clock at rest there), arrives at B coincident with the event E at B, and arrives back at A at the time t2, then standard synchrony is obtained by saying that E is simultaneous with the event at A that occurred at the time (t1 + t2)/2. It would seem that this transport scheme is sufficiently similar to the slow-transport scheme that it could engender much the same debate, apart from those aspects of the debate that focussed specifically on the issue of slowness.

Copyright © 2018 by
Allen Janis <>

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