#### Supplement to Conventionality of Simultaneity

## Transport of Clocks

A phenomenological scheme that deserves special mention, because of
the amount of attention it has received over the course of many years,
is to define synchrony by the use of clocks transported between
locations *A* and *B* in the limit of zero
velocity. Eddington (1924, 15) discusses this method of synchrony, and
notes that it leads to the same results as those obtained by the use
of electromagnetic signals (the method that has been referred to here
as standard synchrony). He comments on both of these methods as
follows (1924, 15–16): “We can scarcely consider that
either of these methods of comparing time at different places is an
essential part of our primitive notion of time in the same way that
measurement at one place by a cyclic mechanism is; therefore they are
best regarded as conventional.”

One objection to the use of the slow-transport scheme to synchronize
clocks is that, until the clocks are synchronized, there is no way of
measuring the one-way velocity of the transported clock. Bridgman
(1962, 26) uses the “self-measured” velocity, determined
by using the transported clock to measure the time interval, to avoid
this problem. Using this meaning of velocity, he suggests (1962,
64–67) a modified procedure that is equivalent to Eddington’s,
but does not require having started in the infinite past. Bridgman
would transport a number of clocks from *A* to *B* at
various velocities; the readings of these clocks at *B* would
differ. He would then pick one clock, say the one whose velocity was
the smallest, and find the differences between its reading and the
readings of the other clocks. Finally, he would plot these differences
against the velocities of the corresponding clocks, and extrapolate to
zero velocity. Like Eddington, Bridgman does not see this scheme as
contradicting the conventionality thesis. He says (1962, 66),
“What becomes of Einstein’s insistence that his method for
setting distant clocks — that is, choosing the value 1/2 for
ε — constituted a ‘definition’ of distant
simultaneity? It seems to me that Einstein’s remark is by no means
invalidated.”

Ellis and Bowman (1967) take a different point of view. Their means of
synchronizing clocks by slow transport (1967, 129–130) is again
somewhat different from, but equivalent to, those already mentioned.
They would place clocks at *A* and *B* with arbitrary
settings. They would then place a third clock at *A* and
synchronize it with the one already there. Next they would move this
third clock to *B* with a velocity they refer to as the
“intervening ‘velocity’”, determined by using
the clocks in place at *A* and *B* to measure the time
interval. They would repeat this procedure with decreasing velocities
and extrapolate to find the zero-velocity limit of the difference
between the readings of the clock at *B* and the transported
clock. Finally, they would set the clock at *B* back by this
limiting amount. On the basis of their analysis of this procedure,
they argue that, although consistent nonstandard synchronization
appears to be possible, there are good physical reasons (assuming the
correctness of empirical predictions of the special theory of
relativity) for preferring standard synchrony. Their conclusion (as
summarized in the abstract of their 1967, 116) is, “The thesis
of the conventionality of distant simultaneity espoused particularly
by Reichenbach and Grünbaum is thus either trivialized or
refuted.”

A number of responses to these views of Ellis and Bowman (see, for
example, Grünbaum *et al*. 1969; Winnie 1970b,
223–228; and Redhead 1993, 111–113) argue that nontrivial
conventions are implicit in the choice to synchronize clocks by the
slow-transport method. For example, Grünbaum
(Grünbaum *et al*. 1969, 5–43) argues that it is a
nontrivial convention to equate the time interval measured by the
infinitely slowly moving clock traveling from *A* to *B*
with the interval measured by the clock remaining at *A* and in
standard synchrony with that at *B*, and the conclusion of van
Fraassen (Grünbaum *et al*. 1969, 73) is, “Ellis
and Bowman have not proved that the standard simultaneity relation is
nonconventional, which it is not, but have succeeded in exhibiting
some *alternative conventions* which also yield that
simultaneity relation.” Winnie (1970b), using his reformulation
of special relativity in terms of arbitrary synchrony, shows
explicitly that synchrony by slow-clock transport agrees with
synchrony by the standard light-signal method when both are described
in terms of an arbitrary value of ε within the range 0 <
ε < 1, and argues that Ellis and Bowman err in having
assumed the ε=1/2 form of the time-dilation formula in their
arguments. He concludes (Winnie 1970b, 228) that “it is not
possible that the method of slow-transport, or any other synchrony
method, could, within the framework of the
*nonconventional* ingredients of the Special Theory, result in
fixing *any* particular value of ε to the exclusion of
any other particular values.” Redhead (1993) also argues that
slow transport of clocks fails to give a convention-free definition of
simultaneity. He says (1993, 112), “There is no absolute factual
sense in the term ‘slow.’ If we estimate
‘slow’ relative to a moving frame *K*′, then
slow-clock-transport will pick out standard synchrony
in *K*′, but this …corresponds to nonstandard
synchrony in *K*.”

An alternative clock-transport scheme, which avoids the issue of
slowness, is to have the clock move from *A* to *B* and
back again (along straight paths in each direction) with the same
self-measured speed throughout the round trip (Mamone Capria 2001,
812–813; as Mamone Capria notes, his scheme is similar to those
proposed by Brehme 1985, 57–58, and 1988, 811–812). If the
moving clock leaves *A* at time *t*_{1} (as
measured by a clock at rest there), arrives at *B* coincident
with the event
*E* at *B*, and arrives back at *A* at the
time *t*_{2}, then standard synchrony is obtained by
saying that *E* is simultaneous with the event at *A*
that occurred at the time (*t*_{1} +
*t*_{2})/2. It would seem that this transport scheme is
sufficiently similar to the slow-transport scheme that it could
engender much the same debate, apart from those aspects of the debate
that focussed specifically on the issue of slowness.