#### Supplement to Singularities and Black Holes

## Light Cones and Causal Structure

In attempting to diagram relativistic spacetimes, one of the most
important features to capture is the *causal structure* of the
spacetime. This structure specifies which events (that is, which
points of space and time) can be connected by trajectories that are
slower than light, which events can be connected by trajectories
traveling *at* the speed of light, and which events cannot be
connected by anything traveling at or below light speed. Events in the
first group are said to be “timelike related”, because a
physical clock could travel from one event to the other. Events in the
second group are “lightlike related” because a light ray
can travel from one to the other. Events in the third group are
“spacelike related”. Given that it is physically
impossible (on the standard interpretation of relativity theory) for
any causal process to exceed the speed of light, these three possible
ways of being connected tell us whether one event is able to influence
another.

We can depict these three spatiotemporal relationships by drawing in
the “light cone” of an event. Given an event *p*, the
light cone of *p* consists of all the points that can be
connected to *p* by a straight ray of light. Imagine that event
*p* is someone flashing a bright light from a particular
location. Then one second later, there will be a sphere of points that
is currently occupied by the outgoing light pulse. Two seconds later,
a larger sphere, farther out, will be illuminated, and so on. We can
depict these spheres at progressive times in a spacetime if we ignore
one dimension of space so that we can draw in the points occupied by
the light pulse as a circle, as in the following figure:

We can likewise depict the points in the past that are connected to
point *p* by light rays. For a given time, these points will
again form a sphere, which will grow larger the farther into the past
we look. Thus the full light cone looks like this:

We can now use these light cones to depict the causal structure of
spacetime. Anything outside of the light cone of *p* cannot
causally interact with *p*. The “causal future” of
*p* consists of the points on and inside the future half of the
light cone. Likewise, the causal past is picked out by the bottom half
of the light cone. Note that because nothing can go faster than light,
the trajectory of any object will always remain within the light cone
of each event along that trajectory—the path will
“thread” the cones:

We depict flat spacetime by keeping all the light cones oriented in the same direction, as in the following figure.

The curvature of spacetime, then, will be depicted by the tilting of these light cones. This reflects the fact that the causal structure of such spacetimes is different from that of flat spacetimes. So, for example, the spacetime around a massive body like a star will be depicted as follows.

We have a black hole when the curvature of spacetime becomes so severe
that, for some region, there is no path *out* of that region
that remains inside its own light cones. That is, the causal structure
of the spacetime is such that one cannot escape from that region
without traveling faster than light. Such a region is by definition a
black hole; the border of that region is the event horizon.