Notes to Singularities and Black Holes

1. A generalized affine parameter is defined as follows. Fix a curve on spacetime and an arbitrary zero point on it; fix also an orthonormal frame at the zero point, i.e., a basis for the vector space of tangent vectors at the point comprising four mutually orthogonal vectors (one timelike and three spacelike) each of unit length. Now, propagate this frame along the curve parallel to itself with respect to the affine structure of spacetime. The tangent vector to the curve can be written at each point as a weighted sum of the vectors in the frame at that point, the weighting factors being the components of the tangent vector in the coordinate system the frame defines in the tangent space over the point. We can define in this tangent space the Euclidean length of the vector by the standard formula in terms of the coordinate system, which will always be a positive number for a non-zero vector. The generalized affine length at that point, then, is the ordinary integral of those Euclidean lengths of the tangent vectors along the curve starting from the zero point. It is, in other words, just the ordinary, necessarily positive length of the curve according to the Euclidean distance function that the family of orthonormal frames along the curve determines.

2. The technical definition is: a spacetime is effectively complete if, for every future or past incomplete timelike geodesic, and every open set containing the geodesic, there is no isometric embedding of the spacetime into another one such that the image of the incomplete curve has future and past endpoints.

3. The ideal boundary of Geroch, Kronheimer and Penrose (1972), which uses equivalence classes of inextendible causal curves to define a causal boundary for spacetimes, suffers from topological problems, in that it is difficult to define any topology whatsoever on the spacetime manifold plus boundary. Another proposal, the so-called abstract boundary of Scott and Szekeres (1994), suffers from problems of physical relevance so profound it is difficult even to see how it makes any contact whatsoever with general relativity as a physical theory. See Curiel (1999) for a discussion of its problems.

4. Certain gravitational plane wave spacetimes provide good examples of this phenomenon: an observer traveling along the incomplete timelike geodesic constituting the singular structure would experience unbounded tidal acceleration, whereas any observer traveling arbitrarily close by would not (Ellis and Schmidt 1977).

5. This occurs in Taub-NUT (Newman, Unti and Tamburino) spacetime. See Hawking and Ellis (1973, pp. 170–178) for a technical exposition of the spacetime. Misner (1967) offers a delightful guide to the menagerie of exuberant weirdness this spacetime manifests.

6. The conformal structure of spacetime captures that part of the spacetime metric that differentiates timelike, spacelike and null paths; like ordinary conformal geometry, it also allows one to calculate angles between vectors, but does not allow one to attribute lengths to vectors. Two spacetimes are conformally equivalent, roughly speaking, when they agree on the possible paths of light rays and on the possible paths of massive bodies in general (but not necessarily on the paths followed by freely falling bodies in particular).

7. Another type of singularity, recently characterized (Dabrowski and Denkiewicz 2009) and closely related to sudden singularities, though conceptually distinct from them, are the so-called w-singularities, in which the singularity arises from divergence of the barotropic index w defining the equation of state of the cosmological fluid. (The barotropic index is the ratio of pressure to mass density in the fluid.) They share all the puzzling features of sudden singularities discussed here.

8. It is perhaps not malapropos to compare these arguments with those of Parmenides (ca. 500 BCE, DK fragment 8, lines 5–11).

9. What one means by “angular momentum” for a black hole is difficult to explain, because a black hole is, after all, just a mathematically defined surface in spacetime, and it is not clear what physical significance one can attribute to the idea that a mathematical surface physically spins. Nonetheless, under special circumstances having a high degree of symmetry one can justify on physical grounds the use of the classical name ‘angular momentum’ for the designated property, and the generic usage is then analytically continued, as it were, to non-symmetrical cases.

10. The topology of a spacetime manifold is all the structure that remains after one removes the metric and all matter fields, and all other geometrical structure definable by them. Topology, among other things, is what differentiates a plane from a ball from a donut. It governs the “shape” of a geometrical space, and determines what properties of the space remain the same no matter how one continuously deforms it (i.e., even when the metrical properties among points change).

11. The Zeroth, First and Second Laws as given here are the same as first stated and proven in Bardeen et al. (1973). See Wald and Gao (2001) for extended discussion and the most rigorous proofs currently known of the First and Second Laws, and Wald (1994) for the same for the Zeroth. The form of the Third Law given here is due to Israel (1986); see Wald (1997) for a discussion of its physical problems, which are much more severe than those of any of the others.

12. See, for example, the remarks in Bardeen, Carter and Hawking (1973), Carter (1973) and Israel (1973), which are not explicitly directed at Bekenstein though he was, as Israel (1987) reports, their unspoken target. In the same place Israel reports that, with the benefit of hindsight after the discovery of the Hawking mechanism, Bekenstein felt that his proposal had failed because it was not “crazy” enough: he had not been willing to identify the black hole's physical temperature with its surface gravity. Geroch's thought experiment, discussed in Section 5.4.2, had driven him to conclude that the identification was insupportable.

13. This question should be carefully distinguished from that of whether thermodynamics and statistical mechanics can be meaningfully applied to model the behavior of self-gravitating systems composed of ordinary matter, such as galaxies; see, e.g., Callender (2011).

14. Geroch's proposed process has become an infamous touchstone in the field, that all arguments about black hole thermodynamics must prove themselves against. The details of the 1970 colloquium were kindly verified by Wald and Bekenstein separately (both of whom were there), in private correspondence with the author of this entry. When the author asked Geroch about it, he demurred.

15. There other, more technical problems with Bekenstein's (1981) original proposal for a universal entropy bound, primarily that it is not covariantly defined, and so suffers serious ambiguity in its characterization of the “size” of a system. Bousso (1999a, 1999b) subsequently proposed a covariantly defined bound, with stronger physical arguments in support of it. It is this bound that has now become the standard in discussions of holography.

16. Vehement opposition to the idea arose before the ink was dry on its initial proposal in print. See, for example, Davies and Taylor (1974). It was only gradually over the next two years, after several alternative derivations were produced more consonant with conventional quantum field theory (e.g., those of Wald 1975 and Hartle and Hawking 1976), that acceptance of Hawking's result became widespread.

It seems not to be well known, though Hawking (1987) himself has reported it, that the inspiration for the investigation that resulted in the discovery of Hawking radiation came from discussions he had had with Zel’doviĉ and Starobinsky in September of 1973 in Moscow, in which they convinced him that the phenomenon known as super-radiance ought to induce a rotating black hole to radiate. (See, e.g., Wald 1984 for an account of the phenomenon.) These discussion were themselves based on the previous work of Zel’doviĉ (1970) himself, Zel’doviĉ and Pitaevskiî (1971), and Misner (1972). Page (2005) gives an interesting discussion of the early history of the development and reception of Hawking radiation, as well as a brief introduction to its technical aspects, collecting in one convenient place the basic, useful formulae of the topic.

It is also worth remarking here that, as first pointed out by Davies (1975) (who was expanding on earlier work by Fulling 1973), and clarified and explained by Unruh (1976), a uniformly accelerating observer moving in the standard vacuum state in Minkowski spacetime will observe herself to be immersed in a thermal bath of radiative particles, with a temperature proportional to the magnitude of her acceleration. This is known as the Unruh Effect. (See, e.g., Wald 1994, ch.~5, for a thorough technical exposition, and Earman 2011 for one geared for a philosophical audience.) The phenomenon is conceptually and physically distinct from that of Hawking radiation and, indeed, occurs so far from black holes as to manifest itself in Minkowski spacetime. One major difference is that the Unruh effect depends essentially on the presence of an accelerated object for the radiative phenomena to “appear”, whereas Hawking radiation occurs whether there are other observers present to detect it or not, and in particular does not depend on the state of motion of any other physical system such as an observer. This difference is most immediately and importantly reflected in the fact that black holes lose mass-energy—an invariant phenomenon— by the emission of Hawking radiation, whereas no physical system loses mass-energy in the Unruh effect. Still, the phenomena are intimately related in several ways; in fact, Unruh himself derived and explained the effect in an attempt to gain insight into Hawking's then recent proposal of black-hole radiance. It also plays an important role in many contemporary arguments about gravitational entropy and the Generalized Second Law.

Finally, there is another remarkable phenomenon of seemingly anomalous radiance in the arena of quantum field theory and relativity. As Davies and Fulling (1977) showed, a mirror moving with non-uniform acceleration through Minkowski spacetime will, on account of the interaction between the mirror and zero-point fluctuations of a quantum field, emit a flux of negative energy in the direction of increasing acceleration, and (to conserve energy) a flux of positive energy in the opposite direction. In fact, this phenomenon is closely related to the Unruh Effect. Israel (1998), for example, sketches an intuitive, illuminating explanation of the Unruh Effect in its terms. It is, sadly, beyond the scope of this article to discuss these phenomena further.

17. Here is a very brief technical explanation for those familiar with quantum theory. The parts of a quantum field in the interior and the exterior of the black hole will generally be entangled. Microcausality, however, implies that the entangled degrees of freedom in the black hole cannot coherently recombine with those in the external universe. Thus once the black hole has completely evaporated away, those entanglements will have vanished and the entropy of the universe will have increased, in violation of unitary evolution.

18. Several speculative extensions of the Standard Model of quantum field theory, especially those with so-called chiral anomalies, predict that lepton and baryon number need not be conserved. There is no experimental evidence in favor of any of those extensions, however, and none of the predicted violations are on the scale that black-hole evaporation would seem to yield.

19. The sentiment is perhaps most piquantly captured by Eddington (1935: 74, ch. 4):

The law that entropy always increases—the second law of thermodynamics—holds, I think, the supreme position among the laws of Nature. If someone points out to you that your pet theory of the universe is in disagreement with Maxwell’s equations—then so much the worse for Maxwell’s equations. If it is found to be contradicted by observation—well, these experimentalists bungle things some times. But if your theory is found to be against the second law of thermodynamics I can give you no hope; there is nothing for it but to collapse in deepest humiliation.

20. It does not seem as though it can bear directly on the issue of the development of order and structure at much smaller scales, such as the genesis of life. See, again, Schrödinger (1944) for a marvelous discussion of this problem.

Copyright © 2019 by
Erik Curiel <>

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