Notes to Spinoza’s Physical Theory

1. On Peterman's (2012, 2015) account, according to which Spinoza means something different than Descartes' (and everybody else) by “extension“, this agreement is merely nominal. Peterman argues that Spinoza denies that it is of the essence of physical, extended things that they take up space, and holds that extension itself in not dimensional.

2. Leibniz famously criticized Descartes on this point, arguing that what is preserved in interactions is a function not of speed and bulk, but of velocity and what we now think of as mass; that is, it is momentum that is preserved. Leibniz took this to entail that there are powers of bodies that are not reducible to or accountable for in terms of their extensive quantities; this essentially entails a rejection of the Cartesian idea that the essence of body is exhausted by extension. Spinoza was unaware of Leibniz's criticism of Descartes' conservation law. Given the experimental basis of Leibniz's argument, it is a fair question whether Spinoza would have accepted Leibniz's reasoning even if he had been aware of it.

3. Of course, there could be no general laws covering interactions between bodies initially moving along the same line either, since extra-physical influence could cause a deviation from that line. But in that case it would be clear, given the laws Descartes in fact gives, that the deviation arose from external influence. But in cases involving no change of direction at all, we can be sure that either no extra-physical influence was brought to bear, or that the net effect of non-physical influences was null.

4. On at least one occasion Spinoza does claim that no ground is required where Descartes supposes one is. He claims that truth is its own standard (IIp43s), and therefore needs not be certified by some grounding criterion, such as Descartes' non-deceiving God. However, this is not a close parallel to the case of the principle of inertia. A fundamental capacity to distinguish truth from error is required in order that we be entitled to recognize any rational demonstration at all as an indication of the being of things. This can certainly not be generalized to the claim that we can recognize the truth of any every idea without attending to its grounds; indeed, the very notion of an adequate idea is of one that includes its grounds. There is no evident reason that an adequate, true, conception of the law of inertia should be exempt from this demand.

5. Schmaltz (2020) contains a sustained defense of a view of modes on which it is appropriate to treat Spinoza's finite modes as proper subjects of predication despite their insubstantiality.

6. That he regards this discussion as inadequate is suggested by his closing remark that, to set these matters out fully, he would have had to “expand [his] explications and demonstrations.” For a recent discussion denying that the PI has anything much to do with physics, see Peterman (forthcoming b)

7. Winkler (2016) argues that the simplest bodies “should not be understood as real at all, but as hypothetical entities, specifically as infinitesimal or vanishing quantities” (p. 99). While this may remove an embarrassment, it does not seem to help solve the problem.

8. Bennett's interpretation attaches to “motion and rest” as it figures, not in the PI, but in connection with the eternal and infinite modes mentioned in E1P21, of which letter 64 says that “motion and rest” is an example. On Bennett's view, the PI is simply incoherent in light of the basic commitment to an adjectival account of bodies.

9. PCPIId5n.2 perhaps leaves more room to maneuver: here what PCPIIP22 later calls “motion” is characterized as “the force or actions which moves” an individual body in local motion; what gets later called “rest” is “the force required to take away those certain degrees of motion from the body so that it is wholly at rest”. This, at least, does not explicitly ascribe these forces to bodies; but nor does it ascribe them to regions of extension.

10. This approach seems to be taken in Bennett (1984), and perhaps Deuleuze (1990) as well.

11. Winkler (2016) argues that, for Spinoza, “motion-and-rest plays the role of the relational (preindividual) aspect that individuates bodies” and that this “leaves conatus to play the role of the singular (individuating) aspect of the body” (p. 108). On this view, what separates out, as it were, individuals with their conative essence is motion-and-rest; but the resultant individual is the indivdual it is because of its distinct conatus/essence. This still leaves it mysterious how we are to conceive motion-and-rest so that it can do this indivudating work.

12. A complication prohibits us from inferring straightaway that essences are particular to individuals, and adequate on their own to individuate them. There is some apparent support to be found in Spinoza's text for the claim that distinct individuals may share essence. In Ip17s Spinoza says, “a man is the cause of the existence of another man, but not of his essence, for that latter is an eternal truth. Hence they can agree entirely according to their essence. But in existing they must differ.” But while not in outright contradiction with IId2, the idea that two distinct individuals might agree entirely in their essences has quite implausible and embarrassing consequences when taken in concert with it. For suppose I conceive Peter, who has a given essence, through being caused to have an idea of him by interacting with him. Suppose further that Paul shares that essence, though I have never interacted with him. Nonetheless, in conceiving Peter I conceive Paul. Worse yet, if two distinct individuals may have the same essence, then IId2 would imply that any two individuals that share the same essence must co-endure, i.e., must exist determinately at precisely the same times, since if one of them exists, its essence does, and that essence cannot exist without that of which it is the essence existing. Not only is this implausible on its face, it also directly conflicts with the very example IIp17s exploits in allegedly showing how two individuals might share an essence: a man sharing entirely the essence of another man whom he causes. It makes more interpretive sense to suppose that Spinoza regards essences as particular to the individuals to which they belong. For this reason, we might question Schliesser's claims that knowledge of Spinozistic essences is knowledge of types, which can in principle be multiply instantiated, rather than tokens, and that such essences are not “instantiated in space and time” (Schliesser 2014, p. 8).

Moreover, we need not read the remark in Ip17s as actually endorsing in full voice the view that two individuals can have the same essence. Spinoza makes this remark in the context of explaining how the intellect and will of God must differ in kind from ours. He prefaces the remark by saying that “what is caused differs from its cause precisely in what it has from the cause.” Thus the fact that a man causes the existence of another ensures that they must disagree as to existence. However, since he does not cause the other's essence, the fact that he is that other's cause does not require that they differ in essence. This is not to imply absolutely that they may have the same essence, but only that the causal relationship between them, as opposed to that between God and ourselves, does not itself prohibit this.

13. Newlands (2018) argues that it is wrong to suppose that Spinozistic individuation is via essence. His own view is that both what the essence of a mode is and whether a mode is an individual are dependent on how they are conceived. Conceiving a mode more narrowly or broadly in terms of its capacity to be affected and have effects delivers different verdicts concerning what its essence is. Conceiving it as as an isolated whole or as being contained within any number of greater wholes delivers different verdicts concerning whether it is an individual and whether it is contingent or necessary. These verdicts are, for Newlands's Spinoza, equally legitimate, truly characterizing the mode's reality, albeit relative to the way it is conceived. In one statement drawing a conclusion of his interpretation, Newlands says, “not only will each finite thing need to have infinitely many essences across and within infinitely many fundamental attributes, now each one will need to be a proper part [in a way that disqualifies it from being an individual] of infinitely many composite individuals in each of infinitely many attributes.” (p. 167). Della Rocca (1996) had taken a similar tack with respect to the representational content of modes of thought: their content is relative to how the mind to which they belong is conceived. The overall strategy of Newlands's reading of Spinoza seems to be to extend Della Rocca's approach beyond representational content, applying it to as many vexed interpretative problems in Spinoza as possible. Whether or not the resulting view is intelligible (one wants to know whose conceptual activity is supposed to have the power to issue these essence and individuality constituting verdicts, and Newlands's treatment of Spinozistic conceptual relations is concededly negative and promissory), it is unclear how such radically relativized notions of essence and individuality could account for what I have called the “robust persistence” of bodies in anything like a realistic way.

14. See MacKeon (1987), Klever (1990) and Gabbey (1996) for discussions of Spinoza's attitude towards observation and experiment, and Deleuze (1990) on Spinoza's attitude notions of quantity, time measure and number.

15. Gabbey (1996) presents strong arguments in support of the view that for Spinoza “randomness” or “vagueness” in experience is not a matter of the disorderliness with which it occurs, but of the logical status of the individual experiences on which a judgment is based. If this is right, then we may have a conception of experientia non-vaga, or determinatio, but not one on which such experience could be the basis of adequate ideas.

16. For further discussion of the irrelevance of observation to scientific knowledge, especially concerning the impossibility that anything genuinely universal (such as Newton's law of gravitation) could be induced from observation, see Schliesser (2012a, 2012b, 2012c, 2017) and Peterman (2017a).

17. It is an interesting question the extent to which developments in the theory of transfinite numbers vitiates the reasons Spinoza had to be suspicious of numerical treatments of the continua that are space, time, and the limited extensive magnitudes that characterize the existence and duration of bodies. It is also an interesting question to what extent Spinoza's own thinking about the infinite contained glimmers of the central insights behind those developments. See Ariew (1990), for discussion.

18. Schmaltz (2020. pp. 232ff) has criticized Peterman's view for ignoring the possibility of extensive quantities that are divisible into modal, rather than substantial, parts, and argues that Spinoza means to rule out the latter but not the former.

Copyright © 2021 by
Richard Manning <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free