Notes to Boltzmann’s Work in Statistical Physics

1. Cf. the following words of E.G.D. Cohen, (a student of Uhlenbeck, who was a student of Ehrenfest who studied with Boltzmann): “The depth of ill-feelings … and the resistance to [Boltzmann's] ideas … still resonated for me when Uhlenbeck said to me one day in some mixture of anger and indignation ‘that damned Zermelo, a student of Planck's nota bene’ an echo after two generations of past injustice and pain inflicted on Boltzmann by his hostile environment.” (Cohen 1996, 5).

2. The remarkable degree of consent between Mach and Boltzmann has led one commentator (Blackmore 1982) into thinking that Boltzmann abandoned realism altogether.

3. Note that the recent thoughtful biography by Cercignani (1998) carries the subtitle: “the man who trusted atoms”, not “the man who believed in atoms”.

4. Sommerfeld writes: “The battle between Boltzmann and Ostwald resembled the battle of the bull with the supple fighter. However, this time the bull was victorious … . The arguments of Boltzmann carried the day. We, the young mathematicians of that time, were all on the side of Boltzmann …” (Höflechner 1994, I, 167). A similar opinion was voiced by Arrhenius.

5. For example, the well-known passage in Boltzmann (1896b) in which he heaps praise on Zermelo, for providing the first evidence that Boltzmann's papers were actually being read at all in Germany, cannot be taken seriously, coming 8 years after he had been offered Kirchhoff's chair in Berlin and membership of the Prussian Academy. Another example of Boltzmann's love of provocation is his article on Schopenhauer which he entitled “Proof that Schopenhauer is an empty-minded, ignorant, nonsense-spreading philosophaster who thoroughly degenerates heads by selling hollow talk”, but was published, after editorial intervention, as ‘On a thesis by Schopenhauer’ (Boltzmann 1905, 240).

6. It has even been suggested that “Maxwell apparently never read any of the papers that Boltzmann wrote after about 1870” (Klein 1973). But this is not true. There are several occasions where Maxwell refers to the Boltzmann equation and H-theorem from 1872 and to other Boltzmann papers from 1874 and 1876.

7. This is not to say that he always conflated these two interpretations of probability. Some papers employ a clear and consistent choice for one interpretation only. But then that choice differs between papers, or even in different sections of a single paper. In fact, in (1871c) he even multiplied probabilities with different interpretations into one equation to obtain a joint probability. But then in (1872) he conflates them again. Even in his last paper (Boltzmann and Nabl 1904) we see that Boltzmann identifies the two kinds of probability with a simple minded argument.

8. The literature contains some surprising confusion about how the hypothesis got its name. The Ehrenfests borrowed the name from Boltzmann's concept of an Ergode, which he introduced in (Boltzmann 1884) and also discussed in his Lectures on Gas Theory (Boltzmann 1898). But what did Boltzmann actually understood by an Ergode? Brush points out in his translation of (Boltzmann 1898, 297) and similarly in (Brush 1976, 364), that Boltzmann used the phrase to denote a stationary ensemble, characterized by the microcanonical distribution in phase space. In other words, in Boltzmann's (1898) usage an Ergode is just an micro-canonical ensemble, and has very little to do with the so-called ergodic hypothesis. Brush criticized the Ehrenfests for causing confusion by their terminology.

However, in his original (1884) introduction of the phrase, an Ergode is a stationary ensemble with only a single integral of motion. As a consequence, its distribution is indeed micro-canonical, but, what is more, every member of the ensemble satisfies the hypothesis of traversing every phase point with the given total energy. Indeed, in that text, being an element of an Ergode and satisfaction of this hypothesis are equivalent. The Ehrenfests were thus completely justified in baptizing the hypothesis “ergodic”.

Another dispute has emerged concerning the etymology of the term. The common opinion, going back at least to the Ehrenfests has always been that the word derived from ergos (work) and hodos (path). Gallavotti (1994) has argued however that “undoubtedly” it derives from ergos and eidos (similar). Now one must grant Gallavotti that one would expect the etymology of the suffix “ode” of ergode to be identical to that for Boltzmann's “holode”, “monode”, “orthode” and “planode”, and that a reference to path would be somewhat unnatural in these last four cases. However, I don't believe a reference to eidos would be more natural. Moreover, it seems to me that if Boltzmann intended this etymology, he would have written “ergoide” in analogy to “planetoide”, “ellipsoide”, etc. That he was familiar with this common usage is substantiated by him coining the term “momentoide” for momentum-like degrees of freedom (i.e., those that contribute a quadratic term to the Hamiltonian) in (Boltzmann 1892). The argument mentioned by Cercignani (that Gallavotti's father is a classicist) fails to convince me in this matter.

9. Indeed, in the rare occasion in which he later did mention external disturbances, it was only to say that they are “not necessary” (Boltzmann 1895b). See also (Boltzmann 1896, §91).

10. Or some hypothesis compatible with the quasi-ergodic hypothesis. As it happens, Boltzmann's example is also compatible with the measure-theoretical hypothesis of ‘metric transitivity’.

11. Actually Boltzmann formulated the discussion in terms of a distribution function over kinetic energy rather than velocity. We have here transposed this into the latter, nowadays more common formulation.

12. The term “cyclic” is missing in Brush's translation.

13. Actually, as the Ehrenfests showed more clearly, there is also a third possible case, namely (c): H0 lies on a local minimum of the curve. But that case is even more improbable than case (b) above.

Copyright © 2014 by
Jos Uffink <>

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