First published Mon Nov 4, 2002; substantive revision Mon Mar 4, 2024

Supererogation is the technical term for the class of actions that go “beyond the call of duty.” Roughly speaking, supererogatory acts are morally good although not (strictly) required. Although common discourse in most cultures allows for such acts and often attaches special value to them, ethical theories have only rarely discussed this category of actions directly and systematically. A conspicuous exception is the Roman Catholic tradition, which gave rise to the concept of supererogation, and the virulent attacks on it by Lutherans and Calvinists. Surprisingly, the history of supererogation in non-religious ethical theory is fairly recent, starting only in 1958 with J. O. Urmson’s seminal article, “Saints and Heroes.”

The Latin etymology of “supererogation” is paying out more than is due (super-erogare), and the term first appears in the Latin version of the New Testament in the parable of the Good Samaritan. Although we often believe that Good Samaritanism is praiseworthy and non-obligatory at the same time, philosophical reflection raises the question whether there can be any morally good actions that are not morally required, and even if there are such actions, how come they are optional or supererogatory. Thus, the substantial literature on supererogation since the 1960s demonstrates that even though the class of actions beyond duty is relatively small and the philosophical attention paid to it is only recent, the status of supererogation in ethical theory is important in exposing deep problems about the nature of duty and its limits, the relationship between duty and value, the role of ideals and excuses in ethical judgment, the nature of moral reasons, and the connection between actions and virtue. Supererogation raises interesting problems both on the meta-ethical level of deontic logic and on the normative level of the justification of moral demands.

1. The Two Faces of Morality: Values and Duties

Moral discourse is normative in nature, that is, concerned with guiding behavior rather than describing the world. But this normative character of moral judgment falls broadly speaking under two categories, the axiological and the deontic. The former refers to goodness, ideals and virtues; the latter to what ought to be done, to duties and obligations, to justice and rights. Whereas the object of axiological assessment is primarily states of affairs and human agents, the object of deontic evaluation is human actions. For instance, the state of affairs of a world with no war is a moral ideal and the individual Socrates is virtuous, whereas the practice of paying back debts is obligatory and acts of theft are prohibited.

The axiological face of morality, unlike its deontic counterpart, is open-ended. Virtuous character traits, ethical ideals, or the goal of promoting human happiness have no fixed measure and can in principle be always improved and further perfected or realized. Moral requirements are relatively fixed and well defined, having clear criteria of fulfillment and violation. Consequently, the deontic sphere of morality is often taken as describing the minimal conditions of morality, the basic requirements of social morality that secure a just society, while the axiological sphere aims at higher ideals which can only be commended and recommended but not strictly required. In its deontic nature, morality is closely associated with the legal, while the axiological is closer to the ideal or the ideological (sometimes referred to as “the ethical”). Furthermore, the way in which deontic norms are fixed and universally expected of all members of society presupposes the general ability of all moral agents to act in the light of these norms. Ideals of goodness and virtue, in their open-ended texture, cannot be similarly expected of everyone and their determination is not subjected to the strict condition of “‘ought’ implies ‘can’.”

Most ethical theories maintain some form of this two-tier structure of the moral system, although admittedly in different versions and emphases. But this double role of normative discourse inevitably raises the idea of supererogation, the category of actions that are praiseworthy (either in creating good states of affairs or in reflecting a particularly virtuous trait of character) yet at the same time not obligatory. Supererogation lies at the intersection of the axiological and the deontic, the ‘good’ and the ‘ought’. Since moral theories of the past (like Aristotle, Kant and utilitarianism) all appeal in some form to both deontic and axiological concepts, the scant and cursory discussion of supererogation in those theories is all the more surprising.

The most notable exception to this historical generalization is the long-standing and elaborate Roman Catholic doctrine of opera supererogationis. The general background of this doctrine is the recognition of the two faces of morality under the concepts of “precepts” and “counsels.” The origins of this distinction go back to the New Testament, in which to the question what one should do to gain eternal life, Jesus replies: “if thou wilt enter into life, keep the commandments,” but adds “if thou wilt be perfect, go sell what thou hast and give to the poor and thou shalt have treasure in Heaven” (Matthew xix, 16–24). Beyond charity, the Church Fathers detected in the New Testament two additional evangelical counsels, chastity and obedience: taking a wife or a husband is no sin, but virginity has a superior value; the life of an ordinary Christian cannot be blamed, but that of absolute monastic dedication is far better. Forgiveness and love of one’s enemies are also religious ideals that originate in the New Testament and were sometimes given a supererogatory interpretation in later Church doctrine.

The Old Law of the Old Testament is regarded by early Catholic thinkers as reflecting the rigid and minimal demands of religious morality, typically formulated in the negative terms of prohibitions and precepts (the violation of which entails punishment). The New Law, that of the New Testament, sometimes called the Law of Liberty, leaves the individual free to pursue more edifying ideals of perfection. Tertullian called this freedom licentia. According to the Catholic doctrine, the special merit of supererogatory acts accredited to their agent can be used both for that individual’s own salvation and for the salvation of others. The “superabundant merit,” most typically collected by the actions of Jesus and the saints, who far exceeded what was required for their own salvation, is deposited in the Spiritual Treasury of the Church to be disposed by the Pope and the bishops for remitting the sins of other, ordinary believers. This is how the institution of Indulgences gradually developed in the late middle ages: sinners could buy the remission of their sins, first by joining the Crusades and later by contributing money to the coffers of the Church.

The most articulate exposition of the doctrine of supererogation in the Christian tradition is found in Thomas Aquinas (Summa Theologica). Thomas mentions two distinct sources of merit of supererogatory behavior. On the one hand supererogation serves as a more expedient or guaranteed way of achieving everlasting life; on the other, it is intrinsically good in being aimed at higher ends than the mere fulfillment of the commandments. Precepts are universal in their scope, whereas counsels are addressed to the few who have the capacity and inclination to pursue the life of perfection. For Thomas, the open-texture character of the counsels of supererogation is what makes the morality of love superior to the authoritarian nature of the strict law. But Thomas does not draw a clear borderline between duty and supererogation. It is, for example, not clear whether “love thy enemy” is a precept or a supererogatory counsel. It is similarly unclear whether beneficence (almsgiving) is a duty or lies beyond duty. Nor is the role of virtue in demarcating the supererogatory from the obligatory explained. Thomas says that both natural law and positive law prescribe acts of virtue in general but they do not prescribe every specific virtuous act (except for those that promote the social good of justice and peace). And as for divine law, it prescribes also other, non-social actions that belong to the relations between man and God but leaves those actions of perfect virtue to the realm of supererogatory counsel. For a more comprehensive survey of the Catholic doctrine, see Dentsoras 2023.

The Catholic doctrine of supererogation met with an extremely fierce opposition in the times of the Reformation. Luther, Calvin and Anglican theologians attacked both the theory of “super-meritorious” actions and the corruption involved in the commercialization of the institution of indulgences for which the theory served as a cover. No human being, not even a saint, can do all that is strictly required as a duty, let alone hope to go beyond that. The way to salvation is not through “works” but through divine grace alone (Luther 1957). Even the most dramatic acts of martyrdom and self-sacrifice, which served the Catholics as paradigm examples of supererogation, are strictly speaking obligatory. Protestant ethics thus undermines the distinction between the two faces of morality: on the one hand, normative requirements cannot be defined in terms of rules fixing minimally prescribed behavior; on the other hand, every religiously good behavior is obligatory. Saints and sinners are equally dependent on God’s grace for their salvation. Paradoxically, it may be noted, exactly because human actions can never fulfill God’s commandments, divine grace is never due or ethically called for: it is typically supererogatory, a free gift of God!

An interesting parallel to the Christian concept of supererogation can be found in Jewish thought in the notion of “lifnim mishurat hadin”. Typically, the rabbis dispute its philosophical meaning since it could be literally understood as either “within the line of law” or – as it is more often understood – “beyond the line of law”. Some philosophers (like Nahmanides) follow the former reading, arguing that moral acts of piety or charity are obligatory, that is to say duties that apply to everybody. Others (notably Maimonides) adhere to the latter, more supererogatory understanding, holding that such acts are either obligatory only for the “pious” few or even not obligatory for anyone (Shilo 1978). This debate regarding the possibility of supererogatory acts reflects the deep underlying problem of the whole normative discourse in Jewish thought, namely is there an independent system of moral norms and ideals which is not directly derived from the Halakhic, commandment-based, legally binding (and enforceable) law (Lichtenstein 1975 and Lebens 2023).

The hostile attitude of the Reformation to supererogation and the disappearance of the institution of indulgences in the Catholic Church led to the rapid decline in the theological and philosophical interest in the concept of supererogation in the modern era. But for a novel view of the Protestant recognition of some forms of supererogation, see Mellema 2023. Other religious traditions can also be interpreted as leaving room for supererogation – Islam (Abu Sway 2023, and Zaroug 1985), Buddhism (Hongladarom 2023) and Confucianism (Zhong 2016) – mostly in terms of virtue ethics. However, the great theological debates about actions beyond the call of duty set the stage for the contemporary discussion of the subject. The revived interest in supererogation since the 1960s has completely shifted the focus from the theological context to the ethical, but the structure of the argumentation is often reminiscent of the traditional Christian debate.

2. What is Supererogation: Problems of Definition

The conceptual question of what we mean by supererogation and the substantive question of whether there actually are supererogatory acts (and how their normative value can be justified) are inextricably interrelated. Consequently, although the following discussion will try to separate the two questions, addressing first the conceptual issue and only later the normative, the division is only didactic. Much of the disagreement about the nature of supererogation and its proper definition is informed by normative views about the scope of moral duty, the legitimate expectations of altruistic behavior, and the value of the autonomy of the individual in pursuing personal goals. This interdependence of the meta-ethical and the normative levels of discourse on supererogation becomes particularly evident when paradigm examples are discussed: for instance, is forgiveness obligatory or supererogatory is both a conceptual and a normative issue, and the same applies to charity, to acts of self-sacrifice and even to toleration, as will be shown below.

J.O. Urmson opened the contemporary discussion of supererogation (although hardly mentioning the term itself!) by challenging the traditional threefold classification of moral action: the obligatory, the permitted (or indifferent) and the prohibited (Urmson 1958). A more general schema of this classification runs thus (Chisholm 1963):

  1. actions that are good to do and bad not to do
  2. actions that are neither good to do nor bad not to do
  3. actions that are bad to do and good not to do

Urmson argued that a morally significant class of actions, to which he referred as saintly and heroic (such as throwing oneself on an exploding hand grenade in order to save the lives of others), does not fall under any of these categories. He referred to this class as praiseworthy though non-obligatory acts, or in terms of the above general schema as

  1. actions that are good to do but not bad not to do

The scope of this further category became, however, the focus of debate (Chisholm 1964). Supererogatory acts in Urmson’s sense (which is reminiscent of the Catholic doctrine) include only actions that are morally praiseworthy, valuable, although not obligatory in the sense that their omission is not blameworthy. But the general formulation (iv) could consist also of small acts of favor, politeness, consideration and tact, which are good though not morally praiseworthy, which can be expected of people even though not strictly demanded. The latter, wider, definition of supererogation, covers a larger scope of actions that we tend to view as good-though-not-obligatory; but the former, narrow, definition of supererogation as having a unique moral merit better captures the essential value and hence justification of supererogation as a distinct category of moral action, to which Urmson referred as saintly and heroic.

The general schema underlying (iv), i.e. the combination of some positive assessment of the action with a non-negative assessment of its omission, can be filled in various ways. “Good to do, but not bad not to do” appears to be too weak a definition for supererogation, at least in the sense that some omissions of supererogatory action are (or lead to) bad states of affairs. “Right to do, but not wrong not to do” responds to this concern but seems an equally weak definition for supererogatory action, this time due to the overly wide characterization of the positive condition (e.g. “right” falls short of the proper description of the act of volunteering to risk one’s life in order to save a stranger). “Praiseworthy to do, but not blameworthy not to do” seems closer to what we wish to say about supererogatory acts. However, praiseworthiness is associated with the evaluation of the agent rather than the act, while supererogation refers primarily to the act. Furthermore, we often praise agents for doing their duty (e.g. in overcoming obstacles like natural fear) and we often do not praise agents of supererogatory action (e.g. when no particular effort, cost, or risk is involved). There is no necessary connection between supererogation and praiseworthiness, as some philosophers argue (Archer 2015). It seems, therefore, that the neat schema of deontic logic, comprising of pairs of normative concepts applied symmetrically to commission and omission must be broken if we hope to arrive at a more useful characterization of supererogation (Schumaker 1972). This can be done by either mixing concepts from different pairs, such as “good to do but not wrong not to do,” or by enriching the schema itself by adding further conditions, such as the beneficent intentions of the agent and her altruistic motives (Heyd 1982, Zimmerman 1996).

Definitions that are motivated by a skeptical attitude to supererogation often try to salvage the three-fold classification of obligation-permission-prohibition as exhausting the realm of moral actions. Some philosophers identify supererogation with imperfect duty, or with a weak duty, or with duty that is personal and non-universalizable, or with duty that has no correlative right, or with an ethical rather than legal duty, or with an “ought” which is not enforceable. Some even use the oxymoronic term “supererogatory duty” in trying to do justice to the phenomenon of supererogation without giving up the typically Kantian framing of all moral judgments in terms of duty. These are, however, mostly unsuccessful attempts. Imperfect duties, as many Kant scholars have noted, are no less compelling than perfect duties and the distinction between perfect and imperfect duty lies only in the mode of application (to what degree the conditions of its fulfillment are fixed or left to personal choice) rather than in the prescriptive force of the duty itself. And since Kant sometimes defines imperfect duties as duties to adopt ends (rather than engage in particular acts), supererogation and imperfect duty do not belong to the same level of discourse: by doing many acts of charity one does not act supererogatorily, since one cannot be more charitable than required (Guevara 1999, Baron 1987). Douglas Portmore follows Kant in seeing imperfect duties as applying to the adoption of “attitudes” (in analogy to Kant’s adoption of ends). Adopting attitudes that are morally better than those that we must have so as to be able to fulfill our perfect duties is supererogatory – for example, showing more compassion to others than expected from a morally just person. Thus we can go beyond our imperfect duties (Portmore 2023). Furthermore, if supererogation is a personal (rather than universal) duty, then is it by a subjective judgment that it is made to be so? If not, there must be some (universalizable) characteristic which lays the duty on this kind of individual. Finally, there are many duties that have no correlative rights that have nothing to do with supererogation (e.g., at least for some philosophers, duties to animals or to future people), so the test of the correlativity of duties to rights cannot account for the distinction between obligation and supererogation.

Another issue raised by attempts to subject the concept of supererogation to some version of the general schema is that of “offence” or “suberogation”: if there are non-obligatory well-doings (supererogation), are there also – as their mirror image – non-prohibited wrong-doings (“permissive ill-doings”)? Or in other words, are there

  1. actions that are bad to do but not good not to do

Some philosophers (Chisholm 1963, Richards 1971, Forrester 1975, and Driver 1992) were attracted to the logically neat symmetry of supererogation and suberogation, but a critical examination of this artificially invented category demonstrates both the difficulty in filling it with content and flaws in the general schema itself (Heyd 1982, Mellema 1991). Examples for typical “offences” are hard to come by. At most one can think of permissible bad action in relatively trivial cases, like taking too long in a restaurant while others are waiting, which is inconsiderate rather than immoral (Ullmann-Margalit 2011). These are uninteresting cases from a moral point of view as are their supererogatory counterparts of small favors or acts of politeness. Chisholm and Sosa (1966) suggest the distinction between moral neutrality and moral indifference:

For an indifferent act is one such that its intentional performance as well as its intentional nonperformance is morally neutral; but an act will be morally neutral but not indifferent if its intentional performance is morally neutral and its intentional nonperformance either morally good or morally bad (p. 330).

But see on that point Stocker’s critique of Chisholm for not distinguishing between badness and wrongness (Stocker 1967). An interesting, though controversial, example is ingratitude, which is traditionally considered as a grave sin (gratitude being a duty, or for Hobbes, even a natural duty), but which some treat as typically suberogatory (Wellman 1999). But once we look for examples of morally vicious or villainous action that is nevertheless permissible (which is the counterpart of a morally heroic action), we find it difficult to come up with an example (Stangl 2020, chap. 2). This should hardly be surprising. By its nature, a moral system does not leave patently bad action as morally permissible. In that respect, good and bad, the virtuous and the vicious, are not symmetrical from the deontic point of view: the good is open-ended in a way that the bad is not. The extremely good cannot be required, but the extremely bad (vicious) is the prime target of prohibition. Horgan and Timmons introduce the pair of “the expected” and the “contra-expected” as tools for understanding supererogation as well as the a-symmetry between supererogation and suberogation. One is morally expected to express gratitude for receiving a free gift although it is not one’s duty. Acting inconsiderately is contra-expected despite not being a violation of a particular duty. But acting according to what one is expected to do is not praiseworthy while acting in a contra-expected way is blameworthy. Hence the a-symmetry between supererogation and suberogation (Horgan and Timmons 2023). Note, however, that these concepts do not capture the paradigm cases of supererogation. The heroic self-sacrifice of Urmson’s soldier cannot be said to be morally expected of him. Although the expected/contra-expected pair is deontically weaker than the obligatory/permissible, it is not weak enough to characterize the completely free nature of a supererogatory act. Paul McNamara has suggested a rich conceptual analysis of the deontic neighborhood of the supererogatory which although leaving the question of a-symmetry open, points to important analogies between the supererogatory and the suberogatory. These can be shown once we switch our attention from the agent-evaluative component of suberogation as “offence” to the objective, act-evaluative element of “permissible suboptimality” (McNamara 2011 and McNamara 2023).

Wider definitions of supererogation, which refer to any non-obligatory good action, are at risk of losing sight of the specifically moral value usually associated with “acting beyond the call of duty” or “going the second mile.” Although “supererogatory” in English also means superfluous, the technical Roman-Catholic meaning of the concept is closer to what moral philosophy wishes to highlight as a separate category of action. A typical ethically informed definition of supererogation relates both to the element of over-subscription (doing literally more than duty requires) and to the high cost or risk involved in the action (Feinberg 1968). There is a debate whether cost to the agent is a necessary condition of supererogation, for some minor supererogatory acts do not seem to involve costs, let alone risks. However some cost to the agent, even if marginal, is part and parcel of supererogatory behavior, even if the agent enjoys engaging in it (Benn 2018b). Risk is not necessarily the source of the value of supererogation. But risk forms part of the definition of supererogation: an action is supererogatory if and only if it is better than some permissible alternative and better than (or at least as good as) all permissible alternatives that are as costly or less costly (where the sense in which it is better is relative to a particular beneficiary) (Benn 2023). Yet it is true that, unlike definitions offered by deontic logicians, an ethical definition of supererogation must include a condition that the action be of a particularly moral value. The source of this particular value is double: the good intended consequences on the one hand, and the optional nature of the act on the other. The good promoted is typically of an altruistic nature and thus an act may be supererogatory even if the overall good in the world is not promoted (as might be the case in extreme acts of self-sacrifice for the sake of another). Supererogatory behavior is typically other-regarding: even if there are duties “to oneself” (which many ethical theorists doubt), it is hard to see how they can be transcended in a supererogatory way. In that respect, most definitions of supererogation in modern ethics diverge from the Christian tradition: whereas for the latter paradigm examples of supererogation are piety and chastity, for the former these are altruistic deeds of extreme beneficence. There are, however, contemporary non-religious views which leave room for self-regarding actions of supererogation (Kawall 2003).

An illustrative case for this altruistic characterization of supererogation is the understudied issue of whether governments can act supererogatorily (for an exception, see Weinberg 2011). Weinberg examines all the possible objections to such a possibility, primarily in terms of the government’s exclusive role to implement justice, but still wishes to leave the door open for some possible governmental acts which go beyond duty – such as throwing a block party or investing money in the preservation of the historical legacy of the nation. But these examples are not intuitively clear cases of government supererogation and even if they were, they would always be entangled (as the author admits) with questions of the way the money for these projects was collected and now spent (which is typically a matter of justice). Furthermore, if the definition of supererogatory action consists of a condition of beneficent intention or altruism (like in Heyd), governments cannot be considered as agents able to show these attitudes. For they are impersonal institutions. For that reason it is dubious whether governments, or other institutions like the courts, can show forgiveness since their function is to do justice and promote the good according to the law rather than break the rules from an altruistic intention. And of course it is hard to see how the government can “sacrifice itself” or its own interests for the sake of another individual or state.

As for the second source of value of supererogatory action, its optional nature, it should first be noted that such action must be voluntary (unlike obligatory action, which is often forced or enforced). But again, the neutral deontic description of “neither obligatory nor forbidden” fails to capture the kind of freedom involved in such action. The agent has full discretion whether to go beyond what is required and makes a personal choice to do so. She is neither under any external constraint (like the law), nor under internal demands (of rationality or of the Kantian moral law). In other words, supererogatory behavior is fully optional. Thus, it would be absurd to force a person to do a supererogatory act, even if that act had extremely beneficial consequences. The permission not to do the best we can is not derived from the unenforceability of supererogatory conduct but from agent-centred restrictions which limit the force of the impersonal maximizing principle (Haydar 2002). This does not mean that the agent herself necessarily believes that her action is optional. Many agents of supererogatory acts report that all they did was what they felt they “had to do,” or what they thought was their duty although when asked whether they would expect such an action to be performed by everybody else in the same circumstances they would probably answer in the negative, thus getting entangled in an inconsistency typical of moral modesty. Such modesty raises a puzzle: how can it be that a person who acts supererogatorily is no less virtuous (and maybe even more virtuous) than a person who acts supererogatorily with full awareness of the act being supererogatory? (Archer and Ridge 2015).

Doing one’s duty does not win the agent any credit. She only did what she had to do. But going beyond the call of duty is meritorious exactly in the sense that the agent did something “extra,” breaking the balance of justice or that of respect for claim-rights and the fulfillment of duties. This merit of supererogatory action should be held distinct from the praise we often assign to the agent. Praise is a subjective assessment or recognition of the particular way in which the agent faced a moral challenge and acted as she did (e.g. overcoming special difficulties or obstacles, or sacrificing herself in the course of doing either what was her duty or what lay beyond it). Merit is an objective property of the act itself. It is typically attached to heroic and saintly acts, but it can also be gained by minor supererogatory acts of kindness or gifts, and is thus not necessarily associated with particular praise for the agent (cf. Montague 1989, Trianosky 1986). Recent works on supererogation refer to “moral-merit-conferring reasons” for action, i.e. reasons which are neither “requiring” nor “justifying” as a way to untie “the knot” (or alleged paradox) of supererogation (Horgan and Timmons 2010, Dreier 2004). But unlike the Catholic doctrine, few theorists of supererogation believe that this merit is transferable or can serve as compensation for other people’s moral failures. And although supererogation cannot be hoped to simply offset even one’s own violations of duty, the merit of actions beyond the call of duty definitely plays an important role in the overall evaluation of one’s moral record. In cases of a high potential benefit we may sometimes even be permitted to act supererogatorily rather than do our duty (Kamm 1985). Furthermore, the traditional idea of merit (or “superabundance”) associated with supererogation is reflected in secular ethical theory in the duty of gratitude: acknowledging the meritorious nature of a gift or any non-obligatory well doing is the morally obligatory response (irrespective of the moral praise which might or might not accrue to the agent of the supererogatory act).

The characterization of supererogatory acts is highly controversial and cannot be captured by a strict formal definition. Furthermore, as has already come up in the discussion in this section, the way we describe supererogation is closely dependent on the way we justify (or deny) its moral value. Most typically, definitions of supererogation that introduce conditions of altruistic intention, free choice and good consequences are constructed in a way that betrays an underlying view about its special moral value and hence justification. On the other hand, definitions that are merely formal (deontic) in nature are not committed to the intrinsic value, indeed to the very existence of supererogatory actions.

3. Three Views of Supererogation: Problems of Justification

The modern debate whether there actually are supererogatory acts has lost its traditional fervor typical of the great religious disputes between Catholics and Reformers in the 16th and 17th centuries. One reason is that there are no direct political or institutional stakes involved in the contemporary discussions, such as Church power in granting indulgences (although there is a supererogatory dimension in the contemporary idea of Truth and Reconciliation Commissions). Yet, the issue between supererogationists, as they are often called, and their opponents still runs deep and involves the general relationship between the “good” and the “ought”.

The views about the possibility and value of supererogatory acts can be grouped under three categories:

  1. Anti-supererogationism: since all morally good action is obligatory, there cannot be a separate class of morally good action the omission of which is not wrong.
  2. Qualified supererogationism: there are actions which lie beyond the call of duty, but their value is derived from their being hypothetical duties, subjective duties, duties from which one may be excused, that is, duties in a weaker sense.
  3. Unqualified supererogationism: supererogatory actions lie entirely and without qualification beyond the requirements of morality and that is the source of their unique value.

Like any classification, this one is somewhat artificial and arbitrary. Some particular views of supererogation cannot be easily and neatly subsumed under one of its categories. The distinction between (1) and (2) hinges on the nature of the relevant “qualification”: even the rigorous deniers of supererogation are willing to accept some form of excuse for not engaging in particularly difficult or demanding moral action, and qualified supererogationists may often admit that a heroic action is obligatory even if it is unrealistic for society to expect individuals to perform it. The borderline between (2) and (3) is also often vague, since when one tries to explain what makes a class of actions supererogatory, in the unqualified sense of being fully optional, one is often drawn back to the difficulty or risk in performing it, to the particular personal virtue required to do so, or in general terms to certain qualifying conditions which justify leaving them beyond the demands of morality.

The three views of supererogation are three responses to the “paradox of supererogation,” namely how can the moral good not be required as a duty. The first view recognizes the paradox and addresses it by denying the very possibility of supererogation; the second resolves what it sees as an apparent paradox by explaining the conditions under which duty loses its prescriptive force; the third view denies that there is in the first place any paradox in the gap between the “good” and the “ought,” thus leaving room for an independent category of supererogation.

3.1 Anti-supererogationism

The denial of supererogation is basically associated with the rejection of the idea of the two faces of morality. Normativity is one and cannot be split into two levels, that of the good (the desirable, the ideal, the recommended) and that of the required (the obligatory, the prescribed). What “ought to be the case” also “ought to be done.” A possible good state of affairs creates a reason for action. Furthermore, the fact that human beings, due to their limitations and flawed character, often fail to live up to the standards of the ideally good behavior is a deplorable fact that does not undermine the normative power of the moral demands.

This “good-ought tie-up” is a theoretically attractive principle: whatever is good, ought to be done. If an action is good, then there must be reasons for doing it. If it is the best possible action, the reasons for doing it are conclusive, that is outweighing all other reasons for not doing it (or doing something else). Failing to do the best action cannot therefore be immune from blame or condemnation. Or, in other words, doing the best is always obligatory, never optional. Supererogation is impossible (Moore 1948, New 1974, Feldman 1986, Pybus 1982).

The principled denial of supererogation was central in the theological conception of Lutherans and Calvinists. The demands of God are so extensive that human beings have not the slightest chance of ever satisfying them, let alone going beyond them. But there are also non-theological adherents to this idea of the “totalitarian” dominion of duty. Kantian ethics is based on the general idea of an all-encompassing moral law and conceives of duty as the only expression of moral value in human action. Universalizability of the maxim of action and acting from the sense of duty (or respect for the law) as a motive are two constitutive hallmarks of moral action according to Kant. But the two are incompatible with the nature of supererogatory action, which is optional and personal on the one hand and not motivated by the subjection to the moral law on the other. Classical utilitarianism may also be interpreted as denying any space for supererogation. If promoting the overall good in the world is the fundamental principle of action, there can be no (non-utilitarian) exemption from the duty to do so. Both Kantians and utilitarians are highly suspicious of acts of great personal self-sacrifice (typical of some paradigm examples of supererogation). For Kant they may reflect moral self-indulgence and vanity unbound by the moral law or even be a violation of one’s duties to oneself (Kant 1949, Timmermann 2005). For utilitarians such acts may end up decreasing the overall happiness in the world (since the loss to the agent could outweigh the gain for the beneficiary, either in the specific individual case, or when adopted as a general rule of behavior). It should, however, be noted that there are serious attempts to interpret Kant’s theory as leaving some room for supererogation (Hill 1971, Eisenberg 1966, Heyd 1980) and there are utilitarians like Mill who specifically hail the value of non-obligatory meritorious action (Mill 1969). Furthermore, the idea of “satisficing” (rather than optimizing or maximizing), i.e. aiming at the good enough rather than at the best, is a contemporary version of utilitarianism which leaves ample room for supererogation (Slote 1989, Vessel 2010).

Susan Hale argued for a straightforward denial of supererogation. Every morally good act is required of us as a duty. All supererogatory actions fall under the category of imperfect duties. Only when they conflict with a perfect duty can one be excused from doing the imperfect (allegedly supererogatory) act. Usually, the allegedly supererogatory act conflicts with another imperfect duty, and then one should balance which of the two is more important. But using my money for a pleasant holiday is not something I have an imperfect duty to myself and hence if called to donate this money for the relief of suffering of people in Africa is a duty – not a supererogatory act. Furthermore, moral saints are right when they consider their own behavior as obligatory, even if they realize that they cannot expect it from most other people (Hale 1991). A similar denial of supererogation is based on the argument that all major ethical theories have never allowed room for this moral category and that it is difficult to accommodate supererogation in these theories. A better alternative is perfectionism which does not leave room for the sharp distinction between supererogation and duty (Fritts and Miller 2023).

The denial of the value of supererogatory action also appeals to its incompatibility with the fundamental requirement of impartiality. Actions beyond the call of duty are not expected of everybody on an equal basis and are not bestowed on everybody in an impartial way. In other words, there are no general rules regarding either the agent or the recipient of supererogatory conduct. Thus, no general specification as to who deserves or is entitled to be the recipient of supererogatory giving can be formulated, and those who, for instance, are not given charity cannot complain for being discriminated against. Furthermore, some philosophers have noted (Wolf 1982) that despite the traditional aura associated with saintly action, “moral saints” are not very attractive human characters and most of us do not take them as role models for the way we lead our lives. They are fanatically one-track minded in their pursuit of moral ideals, tending to disparage the more personal (non-moral) values which we tend to appreciate in ourselves and in others (such as achieving athletic excellence or dedicating one’s life to music). We feel similar repugnance towards a person who always goes beyond her duty as we feel towards the person who never does anything beyond what is strictly required of her. However, if a well-rounded life is the ideal, then devoting one’s whole life to athletic excellence is equally one-track minded. And furthermore, supererogation is not even from the saint’s perspective a universal ideal of the good life overall, but only a moral standard of excellence (Grigoletto 2019).

Despite its theoretical and moral purity, the anti-supererogationist view is open to criticism. The good-ought tie-up rests on an ambiguity in the concept of ought, which may be interpreted either in a commendatory sense or in a prescriptive sense. In their commendatory sense reasons allow latitude which permits us to choose the less commended course of action rather than the most commended (Little and MacNamara 2017). “You ought to see the current Caravaggio exhibition” provides one with a reason for action, an advice, a recommendation that is not binding. “You ought to attend the next faculty meeting” may be a conclusive reason for action, a prescription. To further complicate matters, “ought” is often used impersonally, as in “it ought to be nice weather for our picnic tomorrow,” but also personally, as in “you ought to buy wine for the picnic.” And “the picnic ought to have been better organized” lies between the personal and the impersonal senses of “ought,” referring to some unspecified agent without addressing a prescription to any particular individual.

The good-ought tie-up works for the commendatory use of “ought” as well as for the impersonal, but not for the prescriptive and personal. “Ought” in the personal sense involves human agency as well as personal responsibility. Laying a duty on an individual requires both having a particularly strong (not just a) reason and showing how the reason is related to the particular agent. Just being a good state of affairs (even the best) does not create a reason for x to bring it about. X must stand in a particular position to the desirable state of affairs to make her have a (conclusive) reason to bring it about. Once the good-ought tie-up is broken in those central prescriptive contexts of personal “ought,” anti-supererogationism loses much of its bite. Supererogation is exactly what one does not personally have to do, even if it either ought to be done by someone or would lead to a state of affairs which “ought to exist.” However it remains for the supererogationist view to explain why the personal ought does not extend to the whole scope of the good.

3.2 Qualified Supererogationism

Completely denying the existence and value of supererogatory action does not fit with most people’s intuitions. One way to account for supererogation without giving up the moral and theoretical principle relating the ‘good’ to the ‘ought’, value to duty, is to distinguish between different kinds of duties and obligations or to specify conditions and limits of the application of duties. Supererogation is a legitimate class of moral action but only in a qualified sense, i.e. due to certain conditions that make the moral ‘ought’ inapplicable or not fully prescriptive. This intermediate position seems to be the most common in the literature on supererogation, but it has many forms and variations.

Accounts of supererogation belonging to this group typically appeal to the linguistic hybrid “supererogatory requirements” or even “supererogatory duties.” Thus, for instance, contract theorists (Richards 1971) describe principles of supererogation as those that ideal contractors in the original position would consent not to enforce in society. Supererogatory behavior is a requirement, but punishing those who do not fulfill the requirement would be too costly in terms of the relative pain incurred to the agent as against the benefit to the potential beneficiary. Failure to act supererogatorily is blameworthy and wrong, but lends itself only to informal criticism rather than to institutionalized sanction. Supererogation is justified only in qualified, circumstantial terms relating to the limited effectiveness of its enforcement. It has no intrinsic value. The idea of ‘Forced supererogation’ belongs to this kind of account: there are actions which are praiseworthy and although their omission not blameworthy it is plainly wrong not to do them (Cohen 2013).

Another line of justifying supererogation without relinquishing the principle of ‘good’-entails-‘ought’ goes back to Thomas Aquinas but has some contemporary followers who sometimes speak in terms of vocation. Supererogatory behavior is required, but not of everybody. It can be expected only from those who subjectively feel the commitment to do it or from those who are objectively blessed with the necessary strength of character and virtue. Unlike the previous view, which distinguished between duty and supererogation in terms of the overall costs of enforcing duty, this approach is based on a principle of excuse: most human beings, due to their frail moral nature and imperfection are excused from omitting what from an ideal (religious, ethical) point of view is prescribed as a duty. The problem with this excused-based view of supererogation is that it is either subjectivist (the individual chooses her duties) or aristocratic (distinguishing between classes of moral agents). Furthermore, it fails to distinguish between the common appeals to excuses from obligatory action based on the particular difficulty or risk involved in its performance and the general exemption from supererogatory action that is sometimes easy and possible for everybody (like doing a small favor or showing forgiveness). Rawls’ analysis of supererogation also appeals to an argument from exemption: “Supererogatory acts are not required, though normally they would be were it not for the loss or risk involved for the agent himself. A person who does a supererogatory act does not invoke the exemption which the natural duties allow” (Rawls 1971, p. 117).

A structurally similar analysis of supererogation is offered in terms of reasons for action. We may have a good (even a conclusive) reason to act in a certain way, but also a second-order permission not to act on that good reason. This permission, called “exclusionary,” is based on a second-order reason and allows the agent to disregard the balance of first order reasons for action. An agent acts supererogatorily if despite the permission to ignore these reasons, decides to act on them (Raz 1975). Typically, other-regarding considerations such as promoting the overall good serve as the kind of first-order conclusive reasons for an action (making it prima facie obligatory), whereas self-regarding considerations of the individual’s autonomy to pursue her own goals in life support the second-order permission not to engage in that action. Self-sacrifice is again a paradigm example of supererogation. Although personal autonomy is not strictly speaking an excuse, it creates a kind of exemption from doing the morally required act. But the autonomy of the individual cannot serve to break the good-ought tie-up, since it presupposes the independent value of the personal good from what ought to be done rather than establish it (Dancy 1988). Furthermore, supererogationists of the unqualified kind would resist this exemption-based analysis as playing down the positive moral value of supererogation and relegating it to the morally neutral category of the “permitted” (Heyd 1982). According to another critique of the purely reason-based account is that it “must include prerogatives, which can make an action permissible without counting in favor of doing it” (Baron-Schmitt and Muñoz 2023, p. 165). Raz might answer that his exclusionary reasons may exactly provide the explanation of these prerogatives in terms of reasons. But then the question would be why these second-order reasons override the first order reasons for doing the supererogatory act.

There is an interesting suggestion that supererogatory action is grounded in moral reasons which are opposed by rational reasons of a nonmoral kind (Portmore 2003, Portmore 2008). Thus, I have a perfectly good moral reason to help an AIDS stricken community, but such a choice would, all things considered, be irrational due to the risk to my life and health or to the loss in achieving personal projects with which I identify. Thus, nonmoral reasons can prevent moral reasons from having a morally requiring force. Theoretically this analysis opens a wide gap between rationality and morality which philosophers are reluctant to accept. Moral requirements according to this view have force only when they are backed not only by direct moral reasons but also by the entire scheme of reasons by which I make practical choices and these might point to a conclusive reason not to act morally. “Supererogatory actions just are those that are morally good, but for which one does not have decisive practical reason” (Dorsey 2013, pp. 381–2). Critics of this approach have pointed out that first, not all supererogatory action is irrational and secondly, a moral theory which encourages us to perform irrational action is defective (Postow 2005). But note that this critique implies a qualified form of supererogationism since the only way to explain why we are free not to act on the best reason overall is that we are excused or exempted from the action supported by the set of moral and rational reasons.

Qualified versions of supererogationism try to salvage a prescriptive element in the analysis of the concept without collapsing supererogation into duty (which would amount to denying its separate existence). Identifying supererogation with a weaker kind of duty, an imperfect duty, a non-universalizable duty, an ‘ought’ rather than a duty are all forms of recognition of supererogatory acts but only as being an integral part of an overall conception of duty. They maintain the deontic integrity of the moral system but by that run the risk of losing sight of what makes supererogatory action uniquely meritorious, sometimes praiseworthy, and often touching.

3.3 Unqualified Supererogationism

Imagine a world in which all morally good acts are also obligatory and in which individuals are capable of carrying out their duties with ease (and with no conflict with their personal goals and aims). Is something of moral value missing in such a world? Both anti-supererogationists and qualified supererogationists would answer in the negative. Those who believe in the intrinsic value of supererogatory conduct would disagree. What would be missing in such a world is what Tertullian referred to as licentia, that special field of liberty, which allows human beings to exercise their power of moral choice. Even Kant, who suggests the ideal of the Kingdom of Ends in which members of the moral community exercise their free will (Wille) by the necessity of their nature, believes that imperfect moral creatures like us have a free choice (Willkür) between good and evil. In this discretionary power to adopt the moral law (or reject it) lies the particular value of morality, at least for human beings. Going beyond duty might be considered as a display of this power of free choice. The pure or unqualified version of supererogationism highlights the moral potential of good human action not prescribed or commanded, imposed or demanded in any sense. In other words, supererogation is good, not only due to the promotion of overall value in the world (which would not be denied by the other two views either), but also due to the kind of liberty in which it is performed. If that is the case, then an inherent part of the value of supererogation lies exactly in its lying beyond duty. The supererogatory is something that is not required in any sense and its omission does not call for an appeal to a special permission, exemption or excuse.

Rather than argue that a supererogatory act is that which the agent is permitted not to do, the unqualified analysis argues that it is an option for the agent. Permissions, at least “strong permissions,” are given to people to act in a way which there is some reason not to, whereas options are the positive counterparts of permissions. Options, as the etymology of the term attests, are actions the agent wishes to do, actions that seem to him good and worthy of choice. The point of supererogatory action lies, accordingly, in the good will of the agent, in his altruistic intention, in his choice to exercise generosity or to show forgiveness, to sacrifice himself or to do a little uncalled favor, rather than strictly adhering to his duty. Supererogatory action is a matter of personal initiative; it is spontaneous (i.e. originating in personal choice rather than in any external or universal demands). It allows for the expression of personal care or concern for another individual and thus may either reflect a particular personal relationship to another or create such a relationship. Supererogation is valuable because we believe that beyond the impersonal and egalitarian social web created by the universal morality of duty, there is space left for particular relationships that are not governed by the principles of justice and rights. From society’s point of view, leaving a separate space for supererogatory action may strengthen mutual trust and communal bonds since it often indicates and promotes love and personal concern rather than mere respect for persons and a sense of justice. This view of supererogation locates it in the open-ended dimension of morality, that of ideals rather than principles, what Urmson calls “the higher flights of morality” and Bergson (1956) “the morality of aspiration.” The Talmud suggests this idea epigrammatically: “Jerusalem was only destroyed because judgments were given strictly upon Biblical Law and did not go beyond the requirements of the law”.

Furthermore, supererogation is closely related to the ideal of moral perfection. For the anti-supererogationist we are under a duty to do the very best, to be perfect. But this may be a demand with which people would not be always able to comply but a counter-productive expectation which would lead to despair and constant fear of failure (Benn 2018a). Allowing space for the supererogatory enables human beings to try to go beyond the required and towards perfection without a sense of guilt and failure.

The justification of a principled (rather than pragmatic or circumstantial) demarcation between duty and supererogation is reminiscent of the analogous demarcation between the legal and the moral. Beyond the obvious reasons for avoiding the legal enforcement of all moral duties, many philosophers believe that part of the value of acting on one’s moral duty has to do with the intention to do the right act, with acting for duty’s sake. This serves as a principled ground for leaving morality free from legal enforcement. Similarly, unqualified supererogationists argue that the value of some virtuous actions like giving and forgiving would be lost if these become morally obligatory, demands whose omission entails blame and condemnation. The optional nature of supererogatory behavior is one step beyond the Kantian-like freedom of acting from moral duty. The moral non-enforcement of the supererogatory is analogous to the legal non-enforcement of the moral.

All this leaves the question of the substantive demarcation of duty and supererogation unsettled. Those who deny the existence of supererogation are not bothered by the issue. Those who explain it in terms of exemptions and excuses can appeal to cost-benefit analyses of the enforcement of high standards of behavior on morally weak human beings. But for those who ground supererogation in the intrinsic value of individual autonomy and altruistic intention, personal concern and the expression of virtue, there are no easy criteria for establishing the limits of duty and the space of the supererogatory. One method of drawing this line is phenomenological, that is to say to proceed from “the inside of the agent” and her experience which attests to the difference between the sense of external requirement and the free choice of the individual (Horgan and Timmons 2010). However advocates of this method are fully aware that it can at most serve as an empirical support to the possibility of supererogation, but not as its philosophical justification.

The recent renewal of interest in virtue ethics led philosophers to examine whether there is a place for supererogation in such virtue-based theories. On the face of it, Aristotelian ethics cannot accommodate supererogation since it does not share the deontic conditions on which the idea of transcending duty is based. However, Roger Crisp argues that this view is based on a misreading of Aristotle, for whom both doing the virtuous act (fitting the circumstances) and being a virtuous person are obligatory. It is the duty of a virtuous person to become angry when it is fitting to feel so. Thus, Crisp is led to a sharp anti-supererogationist view. Since virtue is itself a kind of excess, one cannot go beyond it (Crisp 2013). But then, one may wonder, how would Aristotle (according to Crisp’s reading) evaluate the act of throwing oneself on a hand-grenade in order to save the lives of others? Aristotle should either judge it as plainly wrong, wasteful or unfitting (and hence contrary to duty), or as “a noble” deed which is ultimately self-serving, adding glory to the agent, even if only posthumously. This understanding of virtue ethics is extremely demanding in comparison to theories which recognize the separate realm of the supererogatory. However, there are proponents of virtue ethics who believe that supererogation is not only possible but can be analyzed in Aristotelian terms (Stangl 2016, Stangl 2020). This includes even the Urmsonian cases of particularly heroic acts, which seem to resist a virtue-ethical analysis. Thus Stangl defines a supererogatory act as virtuous act for which “there is some overall virtuous action that is less virtuous than it and whose performance in its place would not be overall vicious” (Stangl 2023, p. 117).

It should be noted that in virtue-based ethics (for example Aristotle’s) the demarcation issue becomes moot: supererogatory transcendence of the demands of morality does not play a major role since ethical norms do not consist of well-defined moral duties with which supererogation is correlated. There are contemporary attempts to analyze supererogation in terms of virtue (Kawall 2009), but they seem to fall into circularity: if the supererogatory is defined as what the (idealized) perfectly virtuous person would judge to be so, we still have to decide, independently of a theory of supererogation, who this ideal moral agent is. The ideal of virtue is therefore not very helpful in providing us with criteria for supererogation and for its demarcation from duty. A similar problem faces Michael Slote’s theory based on empathy. If supererogatory behavior is that performed out of an exceptional level of empathy, how do we decide the normal level which underlies people’s normal moral behavior (of fulfilling their duties)? Isn’t some normative principle involved in the choice of that level and the demarcation between the obligatory and the supererogatory? For a critique of this position, see Roberts 2014.

Thirty years after publishing his ground-breaking article “Saints and Heroes”, J. O. Urmson (1988) expressed regret for having introduced the theological term “supererogation” into moral philosophy since he reached the conclusion that it only replaced “the old over-simple trichotomy” with “a new over-simple tetrachotomy”. This change of heart for the philosopher most associated with the modern revival of the debate on supererogation is striking. His late view cannot, however, be categorized as anti-supererogationist since he does not deny the special moral value of saintly and heroic actions which are by no way obligatory. Yet, he wishes “to dissociate” himself from using the concept of supererogation as a “blanket-term” which covers both saintly and heroic acts and acts of considerateness, decency, chivalry and self-denial. Urmson believes that these kinds of actions are too heterogeneous to be treated under a distinct category in moral theory. The response to Urmson’s (self) critique is that the less dramatic cases of “non-obligatory well doings” are a significant challenge to deontological theory no less than the rare acts of extraordinary sacrifice and altruism. At least this seems to be the assumption in most of the literature on the subject following Urmson’s retraction.

There is no knockout argument for any of the three views of supererogation. The relative merits and defects in each have to do with the kind of definition of the supererogatory as well as with some fundamental beliefs about the nature of morality and the source of moral value. However, a more “local,” less abstract, discussion of paradigm examples of supererogatory action may be of help in the overall assessment of the three views.

4. Paradigm Examples

The analysis of concrete cases or examples is methodologically important in the philosophical discussion of supererogation. Unlike other subjects in ethics, like justice or duty, in which there is wide agreement about some core cases, supererogation is a concept the applicability of which is controversial. Unlike the concepts of justice and duty, which have deep roots in both ordinary language and everyday moral judgment, the idea of supererogation is only tenuously anchored in common moral discourse and the concept itself is a theoretical construct. Examples cannot in themselves prove the truth of any of the previously discussed analyses of supererogation, but they can definitely help in revising the various definitions of the concept as well as make a case for one or another of its justifications. Admittedly, some measure of circularity is inevitable in such a method, since the way examples are understood and analyzed is also informed by the definition and the construction of the theoretical concept.

Beneficence and charity are often considered as typical examples of supererogation. Unlike giving what is the recipient’s due (or what is owed to him as his right), charity is not required by justice, lies beyond one’s duty. As the term “gratuity” indicates, it is not necessary but optional. Charity is typically open-ended (i.e. there is no specified limit to how much one may give), is driven by altruistic intention, and is judged to be morally praiseworthy in a different sense than the fulfillment of a duty or respect for others’ rights. But anti-supererogationists hold a harsher view of charity. Some regard charity as a condescending attitude; others expose the underlying expectation of return involved in any system of gifts (Mauss 1954) or even the logical impossibility of a real, free and gratuitous gift relationship, since every giving involves an expectation of return – of both gratitude and a future gift (Derrida 1992). There are ethical theorists who believe that our standards of distributive justice are far too minimalist and that much of what is considered supererogatory in the transference of wealth from the rich to the poor should really be considered obligatory. The more extreme version of this critique suggests a principle of giving according to which one should give all one’s luxuries in order to satisfy the basic needs of others. Thus, the realm of the supererogatory is radically narrowed down, although it is hard to see how anti-supererogationists can completely abolish it. Supererogationists for their part argue that some distinction between justice and charity, between market exchange and voluntary giving, is good for both society and individuals because it creates a sense of community and good will, not to speak of more utilitarian benefits. One classical example is the system of the provision of blood for medical purposes. Social scientists as well as philosophers have argued for the advantages of a completely voluntary (supererogatory) system of blood donation over the commercialized or “enforced” systems (Titmuss 1973). But it seems that the issue of the deontic status of charity is often of a normative rather than conceptual kind. It focuses on the demarcation line between the obligatory and the gratuitous, both on the personal level of the behavior of the individual and on the social and political level (e.g. how much do rich countries owe poor countries and how much should be left to voluntary charity).

The problem of demarcation also plagues the paradigm case of supererogatory behavior, the so-called saintly and heroic acts. Fire fighters rushing to a burning house to save its residents risk their lives in a way that moves every spectator. But are they not paid for it? Is it not “their job”? Are they not justified when in a later response to a journalist’s question they insist that they only did their duty? The supererogationist might respond by turning our attention to a similar risk taken by a by-stander who joins the professional emergency forces and literally jumps into the fire. Deniers of supererogation might argue that although such an action is heroic, it ought not to have been performed, since the slight chances of saving the victims of the fire do not justify the very high risk of loss of life of the volunteer. Kant at one point expresses his doubts about the moral motive behind some of the extreme cases of moral heroism and warns against moral fanaticism and sentimentalism (Kant 1949).

There are however examples of morally good actions which can be denied a supererogatory status only with much difficulty. Volunteering is a typical act that cannot be reduced to a duty, even not in a hypothetical manner as qualified supererogationism might try to do. When a job or a task must be done by a group of people, the group might select the individual who will do the job on the basis of some principle of justice or desert or, in the absence of such principle, by lot. In extreme cases, such as taking part in a highly risky medical experiment, it may be the case that no selection process, including lottery, should be deployed. If an individual volunteers to take upon herself the task rather than leaving it to the selected person, and particularly when it is wrong to select anyone, then clearly her act is supererogatory. Volunteering highlights the optional nature of supererogatory action in its purest form (the agent can hardly hide behind the morally modest expression “I only did my duty”). Dale Dorsey discusses a case of collective duty which gives rise to the question which individual in the collective ought to fulfill it. A frail woman struggles with her luggage on the escalator in a station crowded with people. She may have a claim for help by someone in the crowd. But who is it? The person who ultimately stops to help the lady is one who has developed a “disposition of attunement”, which consists of the ability to pay attention or to be sensitive to such circumstances. This disposition is not common among people due to the psychological constitution of most people and hence this person is regarded as performing a supererogatory act (Dorsey 2023).

Promising is similar to volunteering in its optional nature which is not associated with the demarcation problem. One ought to fulfill one’s promises, but making them in the first place is supererogatory (Heyd 2023). This might solve a paradox which has been raised: is a promise to do a supererogatory act possible? It seems not, since the promise fulfilling act cannot be both an obligatory act of promise keeping and a supererogatory act at the same time (Kawall, 2005). This may lead us to the conclusion that it is impossible to promise to do a supererogatory act since no act can secure the bare minimum of the obligation created by the promise maker: only a supererogatory act would be considered as promise fulfilling and such an act is by definition not obligatory (Benn 2014). However, if the act of promising itself is supererogatory, then so is its fulfillment, even though the expectation created by the promise means that after being made it must be fulfilled. The paradox may prove to be illusory once we distinguish between the general supererogatory nature of the content of the act (e.g. giving you a ride to the airport in the middle of the night) and the obligatory nature of its performance under the specific circumstances of having promised to do so (Heyd 2005b).

Of course, anti-supererogationists could argue that volunteering and promising are both imperfect duties, i.e. not obligatory in any given individual case but nevertheless general requirements of virtue. People who never volunteer are morally condemnable; people who never commit themselves by promising are morally defective and fall short of standards of friendship and social behavior.

There are cases in which the supererogatory response is expressed in omission rather than in action. Forgiveness is a prime example of supererogatory forbearance. The offended party refrains from reacting negatively to the wrong done to him. Rather than the morally justified hostility and resentment that he was entitled to express, he shows forgiveness. There is, however a heated debate in ethical theory about the deontic nature of forgiveness. Many philosophers and non-philosophers alike believe that forgiveness is a moral duty, particularly if certain conditions like expressions of regret by the offender have been satisfied (e.g. Rashdall 1924). An unforgiving person is, accordingly, morally blameworthy. But for others, forgiveness is the epitome of supererogatory action since it is completely gratuitous, dependent on the good will of the offended party (Heyd 1982). There is also a middle way (Gamlund 2010) which considers “unconditional forgiveness” (that which is shown to unrepenting wrongdoers) as typically supererogatory, but “conditional forgiveness” (granted to offenders who express regret) as possibly a duty (depending on other considerations; see also Cowley 2023, and a critique of Gamlund’s analysis in Archer 2017). For supererogationists the touching aspect of forgiveness lies exactly in its optional nature. Since the offender deserves punishment (or at least resentment), he cannot at the same time deserve (or have the right to) forgiveness. Despite the close similarity between giving and forgiving, it seems that the latter is a purer example of supererogatory act since it has a better chance of breaking what Derrida (see Heyd 2005a) refers to as an endless circle: while a gift imposes a duty (debt) which can be satisfied only by a slightly larger counter-gift (which would initiate yet another round of giving), forgiveness is more a matter of attitude and has no measure.

It has also been suggested that toleration is, like forgiveness, an act of supererogatory forbearance: although the tolerator has a good reason for intervening in the wrong behavior of another, she chooses to refrain from such interference, letting the other lead her life as she wants (Newey 1997, Benbaji & Heyd 2001). Thus, an analysis of toleration as supererogatory is a possible solution of the “paradox of toleration,” viz. how can refraining from intervening in the wrong beliefs or behavior of others be considered desirable. Note, though, that if toleration is taken as as supererogatory, it cannot, for the reasons discussed above, be ascribed to governments but only to individuals and groups of individuals.

However, even if certain acts of forgiveness and toleration exemplify a supererogatory response, there surely are cases in which both are forbidden (the unforgivable and the intolerable) and there may be cases in which they are both obligatory (persistent pleas of the offender to be forgiven or the political demands of toleration of minorities in a multi-cultural society). A conceptually neat case for testing our intuitions about the deontic status of forgiveness (and toleration) is God’s attitude to human sinners: is God bound by the principles of just retribution, i.e. not to forgive? Does he have a duty to forgive? Or is divine forgiveness a pure act of gratuitous grace? If God can act supererogatorily, how does that reflect on the perfection of divine justice that it transcends? The application of the concepts of forgiveness on the political level raise further questions. Even if the universal and unbiased rules of justice can be surpassed by individuals who show forgiveness or toleration, can institutions like the state or the courts exercise such supererogatory restraint without violating the demands of impartiality and equality before the law (Heyd 1978)? Legal pardon granted by kings and presidents reflects this tension between the wish to leave some measure of individual discretion in showing mercy to some public figures and the concern for the impartial application of such supererogatory grace.

There are of course many other examples of supererogatory action although the length and nature of the list is dependent on the definition of supererogation we adopt and the view of its value. We may add to the above-mentioned examples, some practices in bioethics: blood donation, organ donation, serving as a surrogate mother, and taking part in medical experiments. There are of course arguments for the prohibition of organ donation and surrogacy, and some arguments for the commercialization of the practice, which also undermines the supererogatory nature of the act. But social scientists and philosophers often point to the value of altruism in society and the creation of social solidarity through the exercise of supererogatory giving (Heyd 1995). However to the extent that actions and forbearances are supererogatory we may summarize their source of value as belonging either to their good consequences (as in the case of giving and charity) or to the strength of character or virtue of the agent (as in the risky acts of heroism) or to the pure good will involved in choosing to do what lies beyond duty (volunteering, forgiveness, small favors).

Beyond the complex philosophical debate about the nature and scope of supererogation, the discussion of paradigm examples indicate that any ethical system which does not allow for any actions beyond the call of duty would prove to be distressingly impoverished, even if coherent.

5. Complications and Extensions

As early as 1982 Derek Parfit raised the following question: imagine that you can save the right arm of another person at a great cost to yourself; but if you decide to do so, you can save also his left arm at no extra cost to you; are you under a duty to save both arms? Parfit’s answer is the intuitive one: yes, you ought to do so (Parfit 1982, pp. 131–2). Yet this answer does not easily fit theories of supererogation according to which if saving one arm is supererogatory, saving two arms must a fortiori be supererogatory. This seeming paradox was called The All or Nothing Problem (Horton 2023). The paradox is that if you save only one arm you are doing something wrong, while if you do nothing in the first place you do nothing wrong since there is nothing wrong in failing to do a supererogatory act. Frances Kamm added a similar paradox, that of intransitivity: You promised to meet a friend in a cafe; on your way you saw a burning house with a child trapped in it. You can at immense risk to your life save the child. This would mean that you cannot fulfill your promise to meet your friend, but it is morally acceptable reason for violating your promise. But if you decide not to save the child you ought to proceed to fulfill your promise. Now, I am permitted to either save the child or do nothing and I am permitted to save the child thus violating my promise; yet I am not permitted to do nothing (i.e. avoid saving the child and violate my promise). Daniel Muñoz (2021) offers a solution to both Horton and Kamm’s paradoxes in terms of his above-mentioned concept of prerogatives. Transitivity does not work here for the simple reason that we are have a ranking of options based on two dimensions: wrongness and value. We have a prerogative to do nothing to save the child but we do not have the prerogative to violate our promises.

This problem also gave rise to more recent debates about “Effective Altruism”. The idea is that even if there is no duty to give to charity, it is wrong to give to a charity which is ineffective; or in other words, once the bounds of duty are crossed and one’s action is supererogatory, it ought to be optimal, especially if the extra costs and risks are only marginal or non-existent (Pummer 2016). If two children are stranded in a burning house and you risk your life by entering the house and save one child, you ought to save also the other child if that does not incur further risk to you. The two children have no claim on you as long as you stand outside just doing what your duty demands (calling the fire fighters); but once you are inside, the second child has a claim on you to be saved too. The same justification not to save a child from a burning house (the extreme risk) must apply to both children. But once you are inside the house and have already risked your life, this justification does not work if you choose not to save the other (Horton 2017). Against this demand for optimization (limited only by agent-relative qualifications) there is the unqualified, non-consequentialist argument that one needs no excuse or exemption from avoiding entering the burning house and that optimization is not a duty. Thus neither the two children together, nor the second child separately, have a claim against the bystander for not acting in the optimal way (Sinclair 2018). Although for the non-consequentialist there is no duty of optimizing the good, he or she admits that once one gave up the justification for not entering the burning house, one cannot use the risk in order to avoid saving the second child because the risk has already been undertaken in saving the first child (Sinclair 2018). Muñoz and Pummer (2022) introduce the idea of conditional obligations and permissions. If you have decided to save only one child you are permitted to prefer saving that child than to save no child at all.

A similar case of effective altruism is the following: By donating $0 you save no one; by donating $50 you save 1 person; by donating $5000 you save 500 people (which is proportionate to the previous option); by donating $10,000 you save 101 (which is irrational and a waste of money in comparison to the previous option); by donating $10,050 you save 200 people (Wessels 2015, p. 90). Now, although the last option is very “effective” and makes excellent use of the extra $50 (in comparison to the second option), the question is whether adding the extra $50 donated by the generous donor who gives $10,000 is obligatory. The poor person is commended for his supererogatory act of giving $50 to save one person; cannot we regard the extra $50 of the rich person who donated $10,000 as his duty, especially in light of the possibility of saving 100 more people by this small sum? Once you donate $10,000 it is reasonable to expect of you to give the extra marginal addition of another $50 so as to double the benefit of your donation (i.e. saving 200 people). This demonstrates that the threshold conception of the supererogatory as everything lying beyond the obligatory requires some refinement. There are circumstances in which in the realm of the supererogatory some new obligations may be created (Wessels 2015). As we have seen, such circumstances exist in the case of promises: promising itself is supererogatory; but once a promise is made, actions fulfilling the promise become obligatory.

It is usually thought that one may perform a supererogatory act only after having fulfilled all her obligatory commitments or duties, i.e. go the second mile only after completing the first. Frances Kamm has challenged this assumption. If by getting a minor cut in my finger I can save one life, I obviously have at least an imperfect duty to do so. But if instead of saving that one life I can save a hundred lives by sacrificing my life, this is definitely supererogatory. Now, once I am willing to do the heroic supererogatory act, my duty to the single person does not serve as an inhibition to the supererogatory act and the single person who is not going to be saved has no claim against me (Kamm 2023). In cases of perfect duties, things may become more complicated and the single person can for example claim compensation for the losses she incurred due to my violation of the obligation (like a promise) to her.

In recent years there have been attempts to extend the scope of the category of the supererogatory to non-moral normative domains. Some discuss the idea of epistemic supererogation, the idea that in one’s search for knowledge one goes beyond some reasonable measure of epistemic responsibility by being more diligent or looking for more evidence than is usually required in such search (Hedberg 2014). All that is needed for such an extension of the applicability of the supererogatory is a normative domain which has a scale of value on the one hand (e.g. degrees of epistemic responsibility) and standards of expected time and energy involved in the search of the relevant value (e.g. knowledge). We can also say that based on the very same evidence Watson forms a certain belief which turns out to be false while Sherlock Holmes, with his creative epistemic skills, forms the correct doxastic state. We may say that Watson’s belief was rational, even if ultimately wrong, because it followed normal standards of inference from the given evidence; but Holmes showed epistemic supererogation (Li 2017). Similarly one may also speak of supererogation in the context of prudence, when one does more than can be expected of a normal level of care and self-control in sticking to a medically desirable diet (McElwee 2017 and McElwee 2023). Even in business ethics the category of supererogation is used to describe behavior of firms which not only go beyond legal and economic norms but also beyond corporate social responsibility and “positive deviance” (such as philanthropic activities) (Mazutis 2014). One example is Johnson&Johnson’s decision to the recall of Tylenol after the 1982 poisoning affair, in which legal counsels, consumers and even the media did not consider it as morally necessary. This was an unprecedented decision which meant a huge financial sacrifice on part of the firm. Finally, supererogation is also applied in the sphere of professional ethics, such as the behavior of doctors. As against Rawls and Heyd, it is argued that supererogatory behavior is not confined to the domain of natural duties but may hold also in cases of surpassing professional duties. For example, a nurse who brings books from home to a patient in her ward is acting beyond her professional duty but she is still acting as a nurse and in that sense her act is “continuous” with her professional duties. The good promoted beyond the normal professional standard is “profession specific” (Eriksen 2015). There are now suggestions to apply the category of the supererogatory to aesthetics and sports (see Archer 2023). Think of a soccer player who, knowing that the opponent player did not foul him and and hence was unjustly accorded a foul kick, intentionally kicks the ball so as to miss the goal.

Another recent perspective which has not been given any attention in the past work on supererogation is feminism. Some theorists correctly note that the heroic (although not necessarily the saintly) model of supererogatory sacrifice is typically male-centered, with some military overtones. But obviously, as noted in the variety of examples of supererogatory behavior, this model should be abandoned in favor of the recognition of some typically female contexts in which supererogation is demonstrated, such as motherhood and other forms of personal sensitive altruism (Naumann, Raters and Reinhardt 2023).

These complications and possible extensions of the category of the supererogatory challenge the “standard model” of supererogation by questioning the assumptions about the specifically moral nature of supererogation and the clear demarcation between the obligatory and the supererogatory.


Monographs and Collections

  • Cowley, C. (ed.), 2015, Supererogation (Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 77), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Flescher, A. M., 2003, Heroes, Saints, and Ordinary Morality, Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
  • Grigoletto, S., 2019, Only Through Complexity: Morality and the Case of Supererogation, Padova: University of Padova Press.
  • Heyd, D., 1982, Supererogation: Its Status in Ethical Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Heyd, D. (ed.), 2023, Handbook of Supererogation, Singapore: Springer.
  • Mellema, G., 1991, Beyond the Call of Duty: Supererogation, Obligation, and Offence, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Schumaker, M., 1977, Supererogation: An Analysis and Bibliography, Edmonton: St. Stephen’s College.
  • Stangl, R., 2020, Neither Heroes nor Saints, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Jahrbuch für Recht und Ethik, 1998, vol. 6 (“Altruism and Supererogation”), edited by Sharon Byrd et al.
  • Ethics and Politics, 2017, vol. 19 (“Supererogation and the Limits of Moral Obligation”), edited by Simone Grigoletto.

Articles and Books Relating to Supererogation

  • Abu Sway, M., 2023, “Islamic Narratives of Duty, Supererogation, and Ithar”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 349–360.
  • Aquinas, T., Summa Theologica, Westminster, MD.: Christian Classics, 1948. (See I, II, Q. 107, 108 and II, II, Q. 106.)
  • Archer, A., 2015, “Are Acts of Supererogation Always Praiseworthy?”, Theoria, 82: 238–255.
  • Archer, A. and Ridge M., 2015, “The Heroism Paradox: Another Paradox of Supererogation”, Philosophical Studies, 172: 1575–1592.
  • –––, 2017, “Forgiveness and the Limits of Duty”, Ethics and Politics, 19: 225–244.
  • –––, 2023, “What’s the Use of Non-moral Supererogation?”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 237–253.
  • Attfield, R., 1979, “Supererogation and Double Standards”, Mind, 88: 481–499.
  • Baron, M., 1987, “Kantian Ethics and Supererogation”, Journal of Philosophy, 84: 237–262.
  • –––, 2015, “Supererogation and Kant’s Imperfect Duties”, in Reason, Value, and Respect: Kantian Themes from the Philosophy of Thomas E. Hill, Jr., M. Timmons and R. Johnson (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Baron-Schmitt, N., and D. Muñoz, 2023, “Supererogation and the Limits of Reasons”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 165–180.
  • Benn, C., 2014, “What Is Wrong with Promising to Supererogate”, Philosophia, 42: 55–61.
  • –––, 2018a, “The Enemy of the Good: Supererogation and Requiring Perfection”, Utilitas, 30: 333–354.
  • –––, 2018b, “ Supererogation, Optionality and Costs”, Philosophical Studies175: 2399–2417.
  • –––, 2023, “The Evaluative Condition for Supererogation”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 181–198.
  • Benbaji, H. and Heyd, D., 2001, “The Charitable Perspective: Forgiveness and Toleration as Supererogatory”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 31: 567–585.
  • Bergson, H., 1956, Two Sources of Morality and Religion, Garden City, NY: Doubleday.
  • Chisholm, R., 1963, “Supererogation and Offence: A Conceptual Scheme for Ethics”, Ratio, 5: 1–14.
  • –––, 1964, “The Ethics of Requirement”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 1: 147–153.
  • Chisholm, R. and Sosa, E., 1966, “Intrinsic Preferability and the Problem of Supererogation”, Synthese, 16: 321–331.
  • Cohen, S., 2013, “Forced Supererogation”, European Journal of Philosophy, 23: 1006–1024.
  • Cowley, C., 2023, “Supererogation and Forgiveness”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 199–219.
  • Crisp, R., 2013, “Supererogation and Virtue”, in Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics (vol. 3), M. Timmons (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dancy, J., 1988, “Supererogation and Moral Realism”, in Human Agency, J. Dancy and others (eds.), Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Dentsoras, D., 2023, “Supererogation in Christianity”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, 293–314.
  • Derrida, J., 1992, Given Time: I. Counterfeit Money, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Dorsey, D., 2013, “The Supererogatory, and How To Accommodate It”, Utilitas, 25: 355–382.
  • –––, 2023, “The Staircase Scene: Supererogation and Moral Attunement”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 87–104.
  • Dreier, J., 2004, “Why Ethical Satisficing Makes Sense and Rational Satisficing Doesn’t”, in M. Byron (ed.), Satisficing and Maximizing, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Driver, J., 1992, “The Suberogatory”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 70: 286–295.
  • Eisenberg, P., 1966, “From the Forbidden to the Supererogatory: The Basic Ethical Categories in Kant’s ‘Tugendlehre’”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 3: 255–269.
  • Eriksen, A., 2015, “Beyond Professional Duty: Does Supererogation Belong to the Morality of Roles?”, International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 29: 85–101.
  • Feinberg, J., 1968, “Supererogation and Rules”, in Ethics, J. Thomson and G. Dworkin (eds.), New York: Harper and Row.
  • Feldman, F., 1986, Doing the Best We Can. Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Forrester, M., 1975, “Some Remarks on Obligation, Permission, and Supererogation”, Ethics, 85: 219–226.
  • Fritts, M. and Miller, C., 2023, “Must We Be Perfect?: A Case against Supererogation”, Inquiry, 66: 1728–1757.
  • Gamlund, E., 2010, “Supererogatory Forgiveness”, Inquiry, 53: 540–564.
  • Guevara, D., 1999, “The Impossibility of Supererogation in Kant’s Moral Theory”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 59: 593–624.
  • Hale, S., 1991, “Against Supererogation”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 28: 272–285.
  • Haydar, B., 2002, “Forced Supererogation and Deontological Restrictions”, Journal of Value Inquiry, 36: 445–454.
  • Hedberg, T., 2014, “Epistemic Supererogation and Its Implications”, Synthese, 191: 3621–3637.
  • Heyd, D., 1978, “Ethical Universalism, Justice, and Favouritism”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 56: 25–31.
  • –––, 1980, “Beyond the Call of Duty in Kant’s Ethics”, Kant-Studien, 71: 308-324.
  • –––, 1995, “Obligation and Supererogation”, in Encyclopedia of Bioethics, W. Reich (ed.), New York: Macmillan.
  • –––, 2005a, “Supererogatory Giving: Can Derrida’s Circle Be Broken?”, in Philosophia Practica Universalis, B. Sharon Byrd and Jan C. Joerden (eds.), Berlin: Duncker & Humblot.
  • –––, 2005b, “A Comment on Kawall’s ‘Promising and Supererogation’”, Philosophia, 32: 399–403.
  • –––, 2023, “Promise-Making and Supererogation”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 221–236.
  • Hill, T., 1971, “Kant on Imperfect Duty and Supererogation”, Kant-Studien, 62: 55-76.
  • Hongladarom, S., 2023, “Supererogation in Buddhism”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 361–372.
  • Horgan, T. and Timmons, M., 2010, “Untying a Knot from the Inside Out: Reflections on the ‘Paradox’ of Supererogation”, Social Philosophy and Policy, 27: 29–63.
  • –––, 2023, “The Expected, the Contra-Expected, the Supererogatory, and the Suberogatory”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 119–130.
  • Horton, J., 2017, “The All or Nothing Problem”, Journal of Philosophy, 114: 94–104.
  • –––, 2023, “Supererogation, Conditional Obligation, and the All or Nothing Problem”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 51–61.
  • Kamm, F., 1985, “Supererogation and Obligation”, Journal of Philosophy, 82: 118–138.
  • –––, 2023, “Supererogation and Duty”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 29–49.
  • Kant, I., 1949, Critique of Practical Reason (translated and edited by L. W. Beck),Chicago: University of Chicago Press, the last part of the Analytic and the Methodology.
  • Kawall, J., 2003, “Self-Regarding Supererogatory Actions”, Journal of Social Philosophy, 34: 487–498.
  • –––, 2005, “Promising and Supererogation”, Philosophia, 32: 389–398.
  • –––, 2009, “Virtue Theory, Ideal Observers, and the Supererogatory”, Philosophical Studies, 146: 179–196.
  • Lebens, S., 2023, “Does Judaism Recognize the Supererogatory?”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 329–348.
  • Li, H., 2018, “A Theory of Epistemic Supererogation”, Erkenntnis, 83: 349–367.
  • Lichtenstein, A., 1975, “Does Jewish Tradition Recognize An Ethic Independent of Halakha?”, in Modern Jewish Ethics: Theory and Practice, M. Fox (ed.), Ohio State University Press.
  • Little, M. and MacNamara, C., 2017, “For Better or Worse: Commendatory Reasons and Latitude”, Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics, 7: 138–160.
  • Luther, M., 1957, “Explanation of The Ninety Five Theses” (Thesis 58), in Works (vol. 31), H. Grimm (ed.), Philadelphia: Muhlenberg Press.
  • Mauss, M., 1954, The Gift, London: Cohen and West.
  • Mazutis, D., 2014, “Supererogation Beyond Positive Deviance and Corporate Social Responsibility”, Journal of Business Ethics, 119: 517–528.
  • McElwee, B., 2017, “Supererogation Across Normative Domains”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 95: 505–516.
  • –––, 2023, “Going Above and Beyond: Non-moral Analogues of Moral Supererogation”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 255–270.
  • McNamara, P., 1996, “Making Room for Going Beyond the Call”, Mind, 105: 415–450.
  • –––, 2011, “Supererogation, Inside and Out: Toward an Adequate Scheme for Common-Sense Morality”, in Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics (Vol. 1), M. Timmons (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2023, “Supererogation and Its Conceptual Neighborhood Through a DWE Lens”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 131–163.
  • Mellema, G., 2023, “Supererogation and Protestantism”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 315–327.
  • Mill, J. S., 1969, “Auguste Comte and Positivism”, in The Collected Works of J. S. Mill (vol. 10), Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Moore, G. E., 1948, Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Montague, P., 1989, “Acts, Agents, and Supererogation”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 26: 100–111.
  • Muñoz, D. and Pummer, T., 2022, “Supererogation and Conditional Obligation”, Philosophical Studies, 79: 1429–1443.
  • Muñoz, D., 2021, “Three Paradoxes of Supererogation”, Nous, 55: 699–716.
  • Naumann, K., M.-L. Raters, and K. Reinhardt, 2023, “Feminist Perspectives on Supererogation”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 271–291.
  • New, C., 1974, “Saints, Heroes and Utilitarians”, Philosophy, 49: 179–189.
  • Newey, G., 1997, “Against Thin-Property Reductivism: Toleration as Supererogatory”, Journal of Value Inquiry, 31: 231–249.
  • Parfit, D., 1982, “Future Generations: Further Problems”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 11: 113–172.
  • Portmore, D. W., 2003, “Position-Relative Consequentialism, Agent-Centered Options, and Supererogation”, Ethics, 113: 303–332.
  • –––, 2008, “Are Moral Reasons Morally Overriding?”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 11: 369–388.
  • –––, 2023, “Latitude, Supererogation, and Imperfect Duties”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 63–86.
  • Postow, B. C., 2005, “Supererogation Again”, Journal of Value Inquiry 39: 245–253.
  • Pummer, T., 2016, “Whether and Where to Give”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 44: 77–95.
  • Pybus, E., 1982, “‘Saints and Heroes’”, Philosophy, 57: 193–199.
  • Rashdall, H., 1924, A Theory of Good and Evil, London: Oxford University Press.
  • Rawls, J., 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Raz, J., 1975, “Permissions and Supererogation”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 12: 161–168.
  • Richards, A. J., 1971, A Theory of Reasons for Action, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Roberts, R. 2014, “Supererogation in an Ethics of Care”, Philosophia, 42: 597–602.
  • Schumaker, M., 1972, “Deontic Morality and the Problem of Supererogation”, Philosophical Studies, 23: 427–428.
  • Shilo, S., 1978, “On One Aspect of Law and Morals in Jewish Law: Lifnim Mishurat Hadin”, Israel Law Review, 13: 359–390.
  • Sinclair, T., 2018, “Are We Conditionally Obligated to Be Effective Altruists”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 46: 36–59.
  • Slote, M., 1989, Beyond Optimizing, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Stangl, R., 2016, “Neo-Aristotelian Supererogation”, Ethics, 126: 339–365.
  • –––, 2023, “Must Virtue Be Heroic? Virtue Ethics and the Possibility of Supererogation”, in Heyd (ed.) 2023, pp. 105–118.
  • Stocker, M., 1967, “Professor Chisholm on Supererogation and Offence”, Philosophical Studies, 18: 87–93.
  • Tertullian, On Exhortation to Chastity, New York: The Fathers of the Church.
  • Timmermann, J., 2005, “Good but Not Required? – Assessing the Demands of Kantian Ethics”, Journal of Moral Philosophy, 2: 9–27.
  • Titmuss, R., 1973, The Gift Relationship, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
  • Trianosky, G., 1986, “Supererogation, Wrongdoing and Vice: On the Autonomy of the Ethics of Virtue”, Journal of Philosophy, 83: 26–40.
  • Ullmann-Margalit, E., 2011, “Considerateness”, Iyyun, 60: 205–244.
  • Urmson, J., 1958, “Saints and Heroes”, in Essays in Moral Philosophy, A. Melden (ed.), Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • –––, 1988, “Hare on Intuitive Moral Thinking”, in Hare and Critics, D. Seanor and N. Fotion (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Vessel, J.-P., 2010, “Supererogation for Utilitarianism”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 47: 299–317.
  • Weinberg, J., 2011, “Is Government Supererogation Possible?”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 92: 263–281.
  • Wellman, C., 1999, “Gratitude as a Virtue”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 80: 284–300.
  • Wessels, U., 2015, “Beyond the Call of Duty:The Structure of a Moral Region”, Supererogation, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 77: 87–104.
  • Wolf, S., 1982, “Moral Saints”, Journal of Philosophy, 79: 419–439.
  • Zimmerman, M., 1996, The Concept of Moral Obligation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, particularly Chapter 8.
  • Zaroug, A. H., 1985, “The Concept of Permission, Supererogatory Acts and Asceticism in Islamic Jurisprudence”, Islamic Studies, 24: 167–180.
  • Zhong, L., 2016, “A Confucian Virtue Theory of Supererogation”, Philosophy East and West, 66: 328–341.

Other Internet Resources

  • Church of England, Articles of 1571 (mark-up in HTML by Gavin Koh) [Article XIV relates to work of supererogation. These articles formed the basis of the Articles of the Protestant Episcopal Church of America and were also adapted by John Wesley to form the Twenty-five Articles of the Methodist Church]

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