Notes to Teleological Arguments for God’s Existence

1. The following is a somewhat controversial construal of Paley. At some later points in Natural Theology, Paley’s language sounds very comparative (see, e.g., Paley 1802 [1963], 37ff). Note also that Paley was accused of plagiarizing this material from the Dutch author Bernard Nieuwentyt (Jantzen 2014, 168-69).

2. In this connection, see also Glass and Wolfe 1986 (17–19). See also McPherson 1965 (79), and Sober 1993 (34–5).

3. As Elliott Sober notes, if the argument is not analogical, then “Hume’s criticisms entirely lose their bite.” (Sober 1993, 33).

4. “[In early 19th century Germany] a very coherent body of theory based on a teleological approach was worked out, and it did provide a constant fertile source for the advance of biological science on a number of different research fronts” (Lenoir 1982, 2). John Hedley Brooke and others advance similar contentions.

5. See Ratzsch 2001, e.g., Chapter 8.

6. In fact, John Foster claims that: “The only primitive rational form of empirical inference is inference to the best explanation.” [my emphasis] (Foster 1982–3, 89). In a later piece, the same line appears but with the addition of “(non-deductive)” after “empirical” (Foster 1985, 227)

7. We should note that while chance variation and random mutation entail that the events at issue were unplanned, appeals to chance do not mean that such events are unexplained. There typically is at least a partial explanation of random events in science, but at a deeper level of explanation. The random behavior of ping-pong balls used in a lottery machine is explained in part by the nature of elastic collisions and the geometry of the balls. Similarly, random mutations have biochemical explanations which include environmental influences (e.g., radiation) and copy errors in cell production.

8. Some of the directions explored here were initially suggested to Ratzsch by David van Baak (personal communication). For more on the distinction between explaining and explaining away, see Rott 2010 (67–68) and Glass 2012.

9. One nice description of this move as resulting from science itself comes from Whewell:

We have shown, we trust, that the notion of design and end is transferred by the researches of science, not from the domain of our knowledge to that of our ignorance, but merely from the region of facts to that of laws. (Whewell 1834, 349)

10. As C.D. Broad notes in this connection (Broad 1925, 86):

[S]o long as we take a material system as a going concern and do not raise questions about its origin, there is no reason whatever why its characteristic behavior should not be at once teleological and capable of complete mechanistic explanation.

11. Jantzen (2014a) and Sober (2019) offer critiques of both Behe and Dembski’s approaches to complexity and design. See Jantzen’s chapter 14 on the difficulty of making ‘complexity’ into a rigorous notion.

12. See Ratzsch 2001 and 2005. For instance, even were it true that ID efforts were religiously motivated (and that is not true in all cases) that would imply little about the propriety of ID theories themselves.

13. See Ratzsch 2003, for more detailed discussion of Reid.

Copyright © 2023 by
Del Ratzsch
Jeffrey Koperski <>

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