Notes to Theory and Bioethics

1. Robert K. Fullinwider also holds this view. Mary Warnock is a relevant figure here. In her obituary her practical approach to policy work on reproductive ethics in Britain is noted. That approach involved “pragmatic solutions” rather than attempts to “deliver moral guidance from axiomatic principles” (Sandomir 2019). Sandomir is here quoting Andrew Brown’s 2003 piece on Warnock in The Guardian, “The Practical Philosopher”.

2. Jonathan Dancy’s particularism is an example. The version of particularism set out in his book Moral Reasons (1993) holds that there are no moral principles. The less extreme version of his view, according to which moral principles are not necessarily non-existent but that moral thought and practice do not require such principles, is set out in his more recent book Ethics Without Principles (2004).

3. In Moral Reasons (p. ix) Dancy describes himself as doing moral theory. As well, the description on the back cover of Margaret Little and Brad Hooker’s edited volume describes particularism as a “theoretical approach that seeks to transform moral philosophy” (Hooker & Little 2000). By contrast, Margaret Little writes that moral particularism calls into question the very possibility of doing moral theory (where moral theory is clearly connected with a reliance upon moral generalization) (Little 2001). David McNaughton tells us that the truth of particularism shows us that there is no such thing as moral theory. His rejection of moral theory seems to be a rejection of the project of developing and applying moral principles (McNaughton 1998: 204).

4. Returning to Will Kymlicka’s thinking on this, the development of public policy on bioethical issues should be independent of moral theory. This is partly because he believes that public bodies should steer clear of endorsing any one moral theory. But besides that, on his view, public policy makers ought to take morality seriously, but this is not the same thing as taking moral philosophy seriously. In fact, Kymlicka argues that taking moral philosophy seriously—whether that involves making recourse to moral theory, or emphasizing the value of philosophical skill, or both—can actually run counter to taking morality seriously (Kymlicka 1993 [1996]).

5. The distinction between applied ethics and normative theory has more recently been challenged by Archard and Lippert-Rasmussen (2013).

6. Other so-called principlist approaches to bioethics include those of H. Tristram Engelhardt Jr. (1986 [1996]) and Robert Veatch (1995).

7. Fletcher’s approach was close to act-utilitarianism, with Ramsey’s more akin to a rules-based deontology. For more on Fletcher and Ramsey’s relevant work, its underlying theological assumptions, and the suitability of Beauchamp and Childress’ framework for advancing arguments “in the public square”, see Arras 2017: 3. For Beauchamp and Childress’ own account of their motivations for writing Principles of Biomedical Ethics in the first place, see Beauchamp and Childress 2019a.

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Jennifer Flynn <>

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