Notes to Tropes

1. Even to call one’s posits “tropes” is by some considered problematic (cf. esp. Bacon 2011). “Trope” was a label first suggested by D. C. Williams (1997 [1953]), presumably as a joke (at least according to Bacon 2011 and Schaffer 2001). The literature is ripe with alternative labels, including, but not limited to, abstract particular (Campbell 1990), moment (Mulligan et al. 1984), mode (Heil 2003), qualiton (Bacon 2011), quality instance (Segelberg 1999 [1945,1947,1953]), concrete property (Küng 1967), particular property (Denkel 1996), and unit property (Mertz 1996).

2. Near contemporaries to Williams who also posit tropes or trope-like entities include, Cook Wilson (1926), P. F. Strawson (1959), Peter Geach (Geach and Anscombe 1961), Guido Küng (1967), and Nicholas Wolterstorff (1970) (for even more examples, cf. Mulligan et al. 1984: 293).

3. This list of early proponents of trope-like entities could have been made much longer. Mertz (1996) mentions, besides those already listed, Boëthius, Avicenna, and Averroës. Mulligan et al. point to Spinoza, Descartes, Berkeley and Hume.

4. Mulligan et al. (1984) also note the important influence Brentano has had in this context, not just on Husserl, but on other students of his, including Carl Stumpf and Alexius Meinong.

5. G. F. Stout is well-known for his 1923-debate with G. E. Moore on whether properties are particular or universal. At the time, the general impression was that Moore turned out the ‘winner’ in that debate. But according to Fraser MacBride (2011), the impression is in fact the opposite if the discussion is looked upon with contemporary eyes.

6. Although little known by his contemporaries, Ivar Segelberg is arguably one of the clearest examples—after Husserl—of an early ‘trope’-theorist. Segelberg only published in Swedish. A translation into English of his complete works did not appear until 1999 (for a discussion of Segelberg’s work, cf. Hochberg 1999).

7. More precisely, they are fact-generating unifiers or “intensional-determined agent combinators” (Mertz, 2016: xii; cf. also his 1996). Mertz, too, accepts universals in addition to his tropes (or ‘trope-like’) entities. Mertz’s views are intriguing, but arguably too different from those of the ‘main-stream’ trope theorist for me to be able to discuss them in depth here.

8. Ironically enough, Williams himself gives voice to a similar worry when he writes (1997[1953]: 122): “Since there must be, for everything but the World All, at least something, and indeed many things, of which it is a proper part, everything but the World All is ‘abstract’ in this broad sense.” Williams does not think this unduly dilutes talk of tropes as ‘abstract’, though. For, he points out, the ‘abstractness’ he talks of is a more “special sort of incompleteness” (ibid.). More precisely, the sort which pertains to the constituents—like the color and shape—of objects. But then, rather than informing us about the nature of the trope, being told the trope is ‘abstract’ only tells us it is something out of which ordinary objects are ‘made up’. In this context, this is not telling us very much more than what we already knew or assumed.

9. Garcia finds flaws with tropes both on the modifier- and on the module interpretation (although he seems to lean towards adopting a modifier theory, primarily because this would allow him to treat tropes as divine acts able to solve e.g., the problem of sustenance, cf. his 2015b). A problem he sees with the idea that tropes are of the module kind, is that then they must either ground the character of the objects that have them univocally or equivocally; both alternatives which land the trope theorist in trouble. If character is grounded univocally, first, then the trope and the object it characterizes ‘have’ the character they do ‘in the same way’. The problem with this view, is that it implies a systematic duplication of character. And this is problematic because, in the case of causation (and—in particular—in perception), we want to avoid causal overdetermination (cf. Section 4.1 for more on tropes and causation). To say that character is grounded equivocally—i.e., in different ways in the trope and in the object which ‘has’ the trope—arguably does not improve matters much. For what does it even mean to say, e.g., that although a mass trope and its bearer are both massive, they are massive ‘in different ways’ (Garcia 2016: 510f.)? If tropes are modifiers, on the other hand, their nature becomes something of a mystery. If a blueness-trope isn’t blue, then what is it? And how can it make something blue, if it isn’t blue? Good things about modifier tropes, according to Garcia, is that they are better than module tropes at serving as the powers (or dispositions) of objects (2015a: 639). They are also better at playing the role of relations and of fundamental determinables (ibid.). Module tropes, on the other hand, can be the immediate objects of perception and the terms of causal relations (something Garcia thinks modifier tropes cannot, 2015a: 642). Module tropes are also clearly better suited to bundle, which means that a module trope theory will be more ontologically parsimonious than a modifier one (which will need a property-bearer on top of the tropes themselves). And so on.

10. To say that the trope is simple in this sense is different from saying that the concept ‘being a trope’ is primitive.

11. Yet, although most trope theorists seem prepared to accept that some tropes are made up from other tropes, a majority think that, at bottom, there are tropes that are simple also in the sense that they have no parts, period.

12. Some trope theorists even sound as if they think tropes are neither simple nor complex. According to e.g., Molnar (who defends a theory according to which tropes are ‘pure’ powers) (2003: 37):

There are metaphysical facts about properties that cannot be fitted into a theory that recognizes the distinction between derivative and basic properties…, and first-order and higher-order properties… We can explain structural properties as derivative properties, we do not have to say that they are also, additionally, complex. The contrast between simple and complex properties is not needed. However, I am not arguing for the view that ‘all properties are simple’. I am rather claiming that the distinction between simple (= lacks parts) and complex (= has parts) does not apply at all to properties.

And, again (ibid., 44):

Ways and modes also cannot be divided into the mereologically molecular and the mereologically atomic. They are neither-simple-nor-complex, in the strongest sense. They have no proper parts and they do not even have themselves as parts. Perhaps what puts properties, ways, and modes altogether outside the scope of mereology is just the fact that they are dependent entities.

13. Indeed, if a theory of states of affairs is to avoid ending up in vicious Bradleyan regress, it must posit the state of affairs as a third—fundamental—sort of thing, on top of the substrate and universal. Other downsides to positing states of affairs rather than tropes includes having to accept the existence of ‘mysterious’ universals (entities able to, among other things, exist fully in more than one place at one moment in time). For even more reasons to prefer tropes over states of affairs, cf. Sect. 3 and 4 of this entry; cf. also Mulligan (2006) (discussed in Hochberg 2014).

14. By ‘arbitrarily different relations’, Ehring means relations such that realization or variation of one, does not necessitate the realization or variation of the other. And (2011: 178):

…[t]hat numerical difference and exact resemblance for tropes are arbitrarily different relations is confirmed by the fact that tropes can be numerically different but exactly similar or not exactly similar to each other, and tropes can be exactly similar but identical or numerically distinct from each other.

15. Hochberg’s argument must be kept separate from what on the surface looks like the same argument, only delivered by Armstrong (and which he—a bit confusingly—names ‘Hochberg’s argument’). Hochberg’s argument rests on our accepting as true the principle that logically independent atomic propositions must have distinct truthmakers, and shows—rightly, I believe—that the trope theorist must reject that principle. Armstrong does not want to accept this principle in full generality, which means that he does not regard a theory that contradicts it as necessarily flawed. Instead, he prefers to argue “simply from a case” (Armstrong 2004: 44; cf. also his 2005)—basically the same case as that set out by Hochberg—to the considerably weaker conclusion that trope theory is “counter-intuitive” (for a critique of Armstrong’s version of the argument, cf. Maurin 2016).

16. Hakkarainen and Keinänen (2017) distinguish instead between what they call ‘ontological form’ and ‘ontological content’. This distinction they attribute primarily to Lowe (2006: 48). It was brought into the contemporary discussion from Husserl by Smith (1981) and Smith and Mulligan (1983). The distinction is presumably analogous to that between the non-logical content of a proposition and its logical form. Ontological form is then thought of as the form of being in general. Logical form is more restricted; it is the form of the truth-bearers. It is not entirely clear if and how much this distinction differs from that to which MacBride refers.

17. That tropes are complex in an unobjectionable sense has been proposed by Daniel Giberman (2014). According to him, tropes must exemplify a particular, non-repeatable intrinsic spatial volume, spatial shape, and temporal duration. But sizes, shapes and durations are (particular, non-repeatable) features, which means that they, too, are tropes. It follows that tropes are (complex) bundles with size, shape, and duration tropes as members. Giberman admits that his view gives rise to a prima facie puzzle (2014: 456-457): how can an arbitrary trope be a bundle that contains other tropes? To dispel this mystery, Giberman first argues that every trope is bundled with itself and in this sense (reflexively) self-exemplifies. But then every single trope also inter-exemplifies. That is, each member of their bundle exemplifies every other member of their bundle. In fact, Giberman thinks only single tropes inter-exemplify. One reason for this is that we want to avoid ending up with an explosion of size, shape, and duration tropes. If the exemplification of size, shape and duration is a case of inter-exemplification, we get the desired result. For now—just as in the case of ‘ordinary’ nominalism—single (and in this sense, simple) entities can have multiple ‘aspects’. That tropes are complex in this sense does not mean that the view collapses into Quinean nominalism, however. For, Giberman argues, the qualitative variety that the Quinean subsumes under the ‘ostrich’ approach is greater than the qualitative variety that the ‘ostrich’ trope theorist allows. More precisely, on the latter view, the only ‘aspects’ the trope is allowed is precisely its size, shape and duration.

18. Ehring thinks the best way to solve all of these problems is to adopt his version of the trope view (Ehring 2011). On this view, tropes are simple, but rather than resembling in virtue of their primitive nature, tropes have the nature they do—and, hence, resemble (or not)—in virtue of belonging to this or that natural class. As this means that the grounds of their resemblance is distinguished from the grounds of their distinctness, that tropes can be distinct yet exactly resemble each other is no longer a reason to think they are complex.

19. Three clarifications: (1) all of the principles of individuation discussed in what follows concern intra-worldly trope-individuation only (a circumstance that will become relevant when we discuss swapping and piling); (2) they all concern what explains the fact that two tropes at one moment in time are distinct, and; (3) all but PI only hold for exactly resembling tropes. This latter restriction is due to the fact that we want our principle of individuation to allow for what seems clearly possible: distinct (and different) tropes characterizing the same object (or, in the case of SI, inhabiting the same spatiotemporal position).

20. Other reasons cited against SI include: (1) SI rules out as impossible the existence of enduring stationary and moving tropes, enduring time-travelling tropes, and tropes that extend over space without having any spatial parts (all of which, according to Ehring 2011: 25ff. are possible kinds of entities); (2) Given SI, the relation between tropes and their location either amounts to complexity in the trope (which is independently problematic) or it leads to the collapse of distinct yet exactly similar tropes or of distinct yet co-localized tropes (Moreland 1985: 39ff.); (3) SI entails a problematically substantial notion of space-time (Schaffer 2001: 251), and; (4) SI provides us with the means to individuate tropes only if we assume that such a principle of individuation is already in place (Stout 1952: 76–77).

21. Campbell later (1990: 56) abandons this idea in favor of an outright rejection of SI, mainly because he thinks it results in an individuating condition for non-spatiotemporal individuals that would be “too formal to carry conviction” (a claim that is criticized in Schaffer 2001: 252).

22. Interestingly enough, Husserl thinks what Armstrong calls ‘swapping’ is a genuine possibility, and therefore presents it as a positive reason for positing what he calls ‘moments’ (cf. Denkel 1996: 173-174 for a discussion).

23. Two things to note here: First, that there are more ways of getting to the conclusion that swapping is impossible than via an acceptance of the Eleatic principle. An alternative is possibly to accept anti-Haecceitism (cf. Lewis 1986), according to which there can be no purely haecceistic differences between worlds (thanks to an anonymous reviewer for this entry for pointing this out). The second thing to note is that his objection can be put either in terms of object swapping (the two tropes swap object), or in terms of position swapping (the two tropes swap position). Armstrong formulates the objection in terms of object swapping, but as Ehring has pointed out (2011: 79; cf. also Schaffer 2001: fn. 8), the objection is strenthened if formulated in terms of position. For, to rule out object swapping, all you need to do is add that tropes, besides being primitively individuated, are ‘non-transferable’ in the sense that they must belong to some specific object. But this does not solve the problem with position swapping. For, even if tropes are non-transferable in that sense, two exactly similar objects, including the tropes that make them up, could still swap position with the same presumably problematic result.

24. Proponents of tropes that accept the existence of universals as well as tropes include Husserl (2001[1900/1913]) and, more recently, Lowe (2006).

25. A third possibility is to regard exact resemblance as a non-relational tie. But this view has not been explicitly defended by any trope proponent and it has been criticized by some trope critics. Hochberg (1988: 189f.) argues that it lends all of its support from a supposed analogy with the view that the exemplification which holds a substrate and a universal together in a state of affairs is a non-relational tie, but that this analogy—for several reasons—fails. Indeed, even if the analogy is successful, the idea of a ‘non-relational tie’ remains obscure.

26. Critics have complained that, from the fact that exact resemblance must obtain simply given the existence of its relata, it does not follow that it is no ontological addition to them (Daly 1997: 152). However, even if it is true that what supervenes does not have to be considered as a mere ‘pseudo-addition’ to its subvenient base, the important thing here is that it can be.

27. Another reason is given by Campbell, according to whom the regress is benign because “[i]t proceeds in a direction of greater and greater formality and less and less substance” (1990: 35-36). This is not a very good reason for thinking that the regress is unproblematic, however. It is hard to see why there should be any difference in ‘substance’ between the resemblances at the different stages of the regress. In fact, it is hard to understand what such a difference in ‘substance’ could amount to in the first place (Daly 1997: 151-152).

28. Note that this response only works if the nature of individual tropes—their being what they are—is primitive and not further analyzable (i.e., it only works if we assume a standard view of the nature of tropes). To see this, compare the standard view with a view with which it is often confused: resemblance nominalism. On trope theory, tropes have the same nature if they resemble each other, and they resemble each other (or not) in virtue of the (primitive) nature they each ‘have’ (or ‘are’). According to resemblance nominalism, on the other hand, two objects have the natures they do in virtue of the resemblance relations which obtain between them. This means that, whether they resemble or not, is not decided given the existence and nature of the objects themselves. Rather, the pattern of dependence is the other way around. And this—arguably—makes the regress vicious. Perhaps for that reason, resemblance nominalism has no explicit proponent among the trope theorists.

29. Some trope critics have argued that the fact that sameness of property is accounted for in terms of resemblance also means that the trope theorist must face versions of both the companionship and the imperfect community problems (first formulated by Goodman 1951 against classic resemblance nominalism). According to the original companionship problem, first, if everything that is F is G, and everything that is G is F then if having a certain property means belonging to a certain resemblance class, being F = being G, even in cases where—intuitively—we would say those properties are distinct. And according to the imperfect community problem, if we suppose the world contains only three things—one that is F and G, one that is F and H, and one that is G and H—then these three objects will resemble each other to an equal degree, and no non-member will resemble each member to the same degree. Still, the class they make up is hardly a natural class, since the only candidate for the property it picks out is disjunctive and gerrymandered. On the other hand, the class consisting of the object that is F and G and the object that is F and H might be thought to be just that: natural. For, intuitively, it picks out the property of being F. Problem is that that this is not a resemblance class. For the object that is G and H resembles the objects in that class to an equal degree. That these objections can be formulated also against tropes is perhaps not immediately obvious. Indeed, according to Campbell (1990: 32f.; cf. also Williams 1997[1953]: 118), both the companionship and the imperfect community problems arise precisely because the members of the relevant ‘similarity circles’ are complexly natured, something the trope is not. To show that tropes nevertheless fall prey to (versions of) these objections, Manley (2002; cf. also Moreland 1985, 1989, 1997) suggests we consider, first, a possible world in which every object is red. In this world, the class of all red tropes will coincide with the class of all colored tropes, yet it seems that the property of being red and the property of being colored are distinct. And (to get a version of the imperfect community problem) he asks us to imagine a possible world which contains only three things (trope-bundles): one pink, one baby-blue, and one deep purple. All these tropes (inexactly) resembles each other. Pink and purple are both reddish, purple and baby-blue are both bluish, and pink and baby-blue are both pale. Hence, together they pick out a resemblance class. But what property is that? Suppose the answer is ‘coloredness’. Then what resemblance class will we identify with being bluish? None seems available, for as soon as we set on a degree of resemblance high enough to group together the bluish colors, pink (which resembles purple and baby-blue to that very degree) comes along for the ride. In response to the first, companionship, problem, Manley admits that it may seem tempting simply to bite the bullet. After all, the sort of co-extension the trope theorist will have to live with seems much less problematic than that which the original argument points to. Manley still finds the suggestion “prohibitively odd”. Among other things because it follows that, whether two properties are distinct will depend on things that are completely external to the issue at hand, such as the existence (or not) of non-red things in the world (Manley 2002: 84). A similarly evasive strategy (if not a biting of the bullet) might seem feasible in the case of the imperfect community. Perhaps the problem is that the example focuses on ‘higher-order’ or ‘constructed’ properties (like that of being bluish), yet the only properties there (really) are are absolutely determinate. According to Manley, this, too, is a dead end, however. For the same problems that could be formulated on the ‘manifest’ level, can now be formulated ‘further down the line’. For more suggestions on how to get around these problems, cf. e.g., Giberman (2014: 470) and Garcia (2015a: 152).

30. Obvious contenders—all up for debate—include: not depending on something else (or, not depending on something else belonging to a different category) for your existence; having a (complex) character; being spatiotemporally located; monopolizing your position in space-time (i.e., being such that so-called interpenetration with another concrete particular is ruled out); being able to survive change; having causal powers; being the ultimate subject of predication; being the basic object of reference; etc. (cf. Simons 1998 for a discussion).

31. Not all parts are created equal, though. According to e.g., Robb (2005), trope-parts are not the sorts of parts that are “independent, additive, and arranged”, which means that at least some of the usual axioms of mereology will have to be given up or at least modified. Why call them parts, then? According to Robb (ibid., 471) we should call them parts because, on the most general conception of parthood, the parts of something exhaust its being in the sense that it is nothing more than its parts related in some way or other. According to Paul (2002: 578), moreover, thinking of the parts of an object, not just as its spatial parts, but also as its qualitative parts (she uses ‘logical part’ to cover both), results in a more “fundamental account”. According to her—not a trope theorist—thus understanding the structure of objects also allows us to, in a sense, ‘collapse’ the distinction between universals and tropes (Paul bid: 583; cf. also her 2017): “Logical parts allow us to argue that characterizations of properties as tropes and universals are just different sides of the same coin, and combine the benefits of tropes and universals without their attendant problems.” Take two cups that are both red. Some would say that we then have two exactly resembling tropes and some would say that we have the same universal instantiated in both. Paul says that they would all be right. When we have resembling tropes we have two different objects with overlap with respect to (at least one of) their logical parts. Once we subtract away the other parts of the objects, we are left with one object that has no location properties as parts. This object (R), partly overlaps objects that include location properties as parts. R itself does not have any particular location. According to McDaniel (2001), adopting a mereological trope theory can in fact help solve a number of well-known puzzles for material constitution, including that involving the alleged colocation of material objects. He also thinks that both Heller’s argument for 4-dimensionalism (Heller 1992) and Van Inwagen’s argument against mereological universalism (Van Inwagen 1990) fail on his version of the bundle view.

32. Some have argued that the Identity of Indiscernibles is not just not necessarily true, but that it—as a matter of empirical fact—fails in the quantum domain (French 1988).

33. Why not internal? Because if compresence is internal the following possibilities are ruled out: First, that what happens to constitute this concrete particular could exist and not constitute any particular whatsoever. This is however a possibility most trope theorists wouldn’t mind if it came out empty (although some have defended the possibility of so-called ‘free-floaters’, cf. e.g., Campbell 1990 and Schaffer 2003). Second, that the tropes which constitute the concrete particular could exist and (partly) constitute some other concrete particular(s). This is a possibility most trope theorists regard as genuine. Because they do, they regard compresence as external.

34. Keinänen and Hakkarainen, although generally very positive to Simons’ way of understanding the nature of the concrete particular, nevertheless develop their own version of the theory, primarily in order to avoid what they see as three major weaknesses with Simons’ view (cf. esp. Keinänen 2011: 433): (i) that it allows that there can be substances solely constituted by a nucleus, but does not specify what kinds of nuclear tropes could make up a substance of that kind; (ii) that it does not rule out the possibility of two or more tropes falling under the same determinable, making up the same object at the same time and; (iii) that the dependence relations it posits do not constrain the spatiotemporal location of tropes in any way, with the consequence that tropes must not be colocated with the substance they make up. Especially this third difficulty is a serious flaw according to Keinänen and Hakkarainen.

35. According to Giberman (2014), when some tropes are compresent, this is because one trope—the largest one—instead of being colocated with the others, spatiotemporally contains them. On this suggestion, some tropes form a bundle just in case all and only its members are contained ‘in’ the biggest one. Bundling is hence not colocation, but cocontainment. Cf. also McDaniel (2001) and (for an extension of the view that tropes are spatiotemporal to the realm of the possible, McDaniel 2006).

36. A rather different version of this response is given in Lowe 2006. According to Lowe—who defends a substrate-attribute view of concrete particulars, and who accepts the existence of universals as well as tropes—the unity of Fa is effected, not by a compresence-relation, but by a non-relational trope which (asymmetrically) depends for its existence both on the existence of the universal of which it is an instance, and on the existence of the substrate it characterizes. Lowe’s view arguably struggles with what some trope theorists would consider an unnecessarily inflated ontology (although Lowe himself would argue that all his posits are independently justified).

37. Other solutions to the problem include the radical proposal that the regress is benign because it is infinite (cf. Orilia 2009; Orilia and Swoyer 2017). Cf. also the holistic view proposed in Schneider 2002 (inspired by Bacon 1995) and the view that compresence is ‘self-relating’ put forward in Ehring 2011.

38. According to some philosophers, events are tropes (Bennett 2002) or trope sequences (Campbell 1997[1981]) or relational tropes (Mertz 1996) or even higher-order tropes (Moltmann 2013b). If so, the fact (if indeed it is a fact) that every reason to posit tropes is also a reason to posit events is obviously not a problem for the trope theorist.

39. According to McDaniel (2001)—who defends a theory (TOPO) according to which ordinary physical objects are mereological fusions of monadic and polyadic tropes—adopting (his version of) the trope view can even be used to argue for one particular theory of persistence: 3-dimensionalism. For, McDaniel thinks, his version of the trope-view solves the problems with 3-dimensionalism which Heller (1992) famously pointed out. And it does so by allowing you to deny that, if 4-dimensionalism is false, then if I exist after t, I have all of the same parts after t that I had prior to t minus the now detached particle. Reason: there were polyadic tropes inhering in the various particles that were my parts prior to t, inclduing the then undetached particle, that do not inhere in them after t (precisely because one particle detached). After t, new polyadic tropes inhere in the particles that are my parts after t; these polyadic tropes are also parts of me after t.

40. Schneider agrees that couching your ontology in terms of (mathematical) bundles and cross-sections (i.e., fields) is productive. The only problem, from the perspective of trope theory, is that the best way to achieve all of that while staying mathematically adequate is in terms of an ontology that does not include anything that can in any obvious sense be categorized as tropes (2006: 11).

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Anna-Sofia Maurin <>

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