Notes to Trust

1. Philip Pettit offers some opposition to this common view about trust (1995: 208).

2. Each of these conditions for trust is relatively uncontroversial. Another uncontroversial element is that trust can be unconscious or tacit (Lagerspetz 1998). Conditions for trust that concern its epistemology, its value, or what sort of mental attitude it is appear under section 2: the epistemology of trust, section 3: the value of trust, and section 4: trust and the will, respectively.

3. Interestingly, in “Trust and Terror”, Karen Jones objects to “three-place analyses” of trust for failing to account for a basic kind of trust that terror often undermines: what Jones calls “basal trust” (2004). Recent objections to the model of trust as a three-place relation come from Peter Faulkner (2015) and Jacopo Domenicucci and Richard Holton (2017).

4. Some authors assume that goodwill is a moral motive (e.g., Goldberg 2020: 99), but I don’t see why that’s necessarily true, given that goodwill could mean just kindly feeling toward others.

5. To return to a previous example: a sexist employer might truly care about his female employees, even though his caring attitude is informed by sexist stereotypes about female intelligence. These stereotypes might prevent him from giving women hard tasks that he thinks would frustrate them but that they would welcome. His female employees might recognize that he means well, but still fail to trust him.

6. Insofar as they see trustworthiness as a moral disposition, philosophers have modeled it on theories other than Aristotle’s, including Kant’s moral theory and consequentialism (see, e.g., Hardin 2002: 36–40).

7. The latter suggests that one can betray someone’s trust without being vicious, and perhaps even while being virtuous. The idea that trustworthiness, the virtue, allows for—indeed sometimes requires—betrayal appears in the work of Karen Frost-Arnold (2014).

8. Kirton uses the example to make this point and to motivate his own “attachment account” of trust, which is not yet prominent in the literature, unlike the other theories outlined in Section 1. 

9. There are exceptions here, including Hardin 2004 and Govier 1992a and 1992b.

10. Notice that the end to which the trust is directed need not be the trustor’s end alone. Trust may be rational in an end-directed way because it contributes to ends shared by people in relationships or even in whole communities. While some philosophers assume that trust is rational only if it conforms to what a rational egoist would do (i.e., someone who acts on a conception of the good that is purely individual), others say that the trust of socially embedded agents (who act on conceptions of the good that are social as well as individual) can be rational, and indeed more rational than the trust of egoists (Hollis 1998).

11. Pettit offers such an explanation as well, although McGeer is not satisfied with it. He argues that people “who desire the good opinion of others” will respond favorably to being trusted, which can give other people reason to think they will be trustworthy without having independent evidence of this fact. But McGeer claims that trust grounded in the “esteem-seeking mechanism” of wanting others’ good opinion is not rational because it is not dependable; as soon as the trustees see it for what it is—a cunning attempt to get them to behave in a certain way—they will refuse to live up to it (2008: 252).

12. One alternative is neither purely internalist nor purely externalist. It is an “inheritance model” of testimony, according to which “by trusting a speaker, audiences allow their beliefs to inherit the evidential support enjoyed by the speaker’s belief” (Keren 2014: 2612; citing McMyler 2011). The trustor/hearer does not gather this support themselves, and thus is not aware of the reasons it provides in favour of their beliefs. Nevertheless, they must have reasons for thinking that the speaker is speaking knowledgeably and sincerely. In this way, some, but not all, of the reasons that justify their trust are internal to them.

13. Similarly, some argue that in democratic societies, people can trust one another more often than they can in other sorts of political societies, including totalitarian ones (Uslaner 1999).

14. For simplicity, there is no distinction made here between trust that is well-grounded and trust that is justified. The assumption is that to benefit overall from trusting, or from being trusted, the trust only needs to be justified.

15. Another good often associated with trust is language, or the ability to acquire language (Hertzberg 1988: 308; Webb 1993: 260). This good is only available, of course, if one can trust people to use words correctly.

16. The kind of trust that is necessary for both knowledge and autonomy is arguably self-directed as well as other-directed. Keith Lehrer claims that to be able to do the epistemic work that his internalist epistemology requires of us (i.e., evaluating the truth of our beliefs and the worth of our desires), we need to trust ourselves to do this work (1997). Richard Foley similarly argues that to have knowledge, including that which is acquired through others’ opinions and our own past opinions, we ultimately need to be able to trust ourselves (2005). (For a related view, one that links self-trust with the “diachronic exercise of practical reason”, see Hinchman 2003.) Trudy Govier (1993) and Carolyn McLeod (2002) both assert that to be motivated to choose and act autonomously, we need to be able to trust ourselves to do so. Although some self-trust might be better than none at all as far as knowledge and autonomy go (because no self-trust would leave us incapacitated and with no opportunity to learn from our mistakes), justified self-trust is best overall. Without being justified in trusting ourselves to be good epistemic or autonomous agents, we can’t be either.

17. The cultivation of any trust will depend on what sort of mental attitude trust is, while the cultivation of justified trust will depend on how trust is justified (see section 2). This section focuses on how to trust at all, rather than on how to trust well (i.e., in a justified way). To receive the goods of trust (see section 3), one has to do both: trust and trust well.

18. The epistemic cause could be minor, as it would be in the case of therapeutic trust, where we decide to trust someone in an effort to make them more trustworthy. On the view that trust is non-voluntary, there has to be some evidence available that can ground our trust—evidence that the trustee will be trustworthy—but it could be a small amount, as it would be in the case of therapeutic trust.

19. For other criticisms of doxastic theories, see Keren 2020.

Copyright © 2020 by
Carolyn McLeod

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