The compatibility of the approaches

The three different approaches to the logical problem of truthlikeness are motivated by somewhat different desiderata. An interesting question thus arises as to whether the three approaches are compatible. If they are compatible, then the different desiderata that motivate them might be accommodated in one happy hybrid.

Consider, for example, Hilpinen’s proposal, which is typically located within the likeness approach. Interestingly, Hilpinen himself thought of his proposal as a refined and improved articulation of Popper’s content approach. Popper’s truth factor Hilpinen identified with that world, in the range of a proposition, closest to the actual world. Popper’s content or information factor he identified with that world, in the range of a proposition, furthest from the actual world. An improvement in truthlikeness involves an improvement in either the truth factor or the information factor. His proposal clearly departs from Popper’s in as much as it incorporates likeness into both of the determining factors but Hilpinen was also attempting to capture, in some way or other, Popper’s penchant for content as well as truth. And his account achieves a good deal of that. In particular his proposal delivers a weak version of the value of content for truths: namely, that of two truths the logically stronger cannot be further from the truth than the logically weaker. It fails, however, to deliver the stonger principle of the value of content for truths: that the logically stronger of two truths is closer to the truth.

To answer the compatibility question we need precise characterizations of the approaches. Zwart (2001) characterized the approaches in terms of that proposition they judge to be furthest from the truth. Suppose that $$z$$ is the world furthest from the actual world, and let $$Z$$ be a proposition that is true only in $$z$$. On all likeness approaches $$Z$$ is the proposition that is furthest from the truth. Call this principle Worst. Worst is at least a necessary condition for a theory to lie within the likeness approach, though it seems insufficient. Content theorists judge theories more or less good in terms of two factors: truth value and content. So the worst theory will have to be false. And presumably it will also be weak. Consider $${\sim}T$$, the negation of the truth. It is both false, and it is the logically weakest falsehood. So, according to Zwart 2001, content theorists ought to judge $${\sim}T$$ to be the worst theory on offer. Call this principle Weakest. Weakest assumes something like the separability of content and truth factors in the evaluation of truthlikeness. While that captures Miller’s and Kuiper’s symmetric difference account it would banish from the content-based fold those accounts that judge false theories to be worse the logically stronger they are.

Zwart and Franssen 2007 adopted somewhat stronger characterizations of the approaches. Their characterization of the content approach is essentially that it encompass the Simple Truth Content account: viz that $$A$$ is as close to the truth as $$B$$ if $$A$$ entails all of $$B$$’s truth content, and $$A$$ is closer to the truth than $$B$$ just in case $$A$$ is at least as close as $$B$$, and $$B$$ is not at least as close as $$A$$. This guarantees that any articulation of the content approach will embody the value of content for truths, but it goes somewhat further as we saw above, guaranteeing the value of content for falsehoods as well. (It is thus much stronger than Weakest.)

Their characterization of the likeness approach is that it deliver all the judgments delivered by Hilpinen’s proposal. (This is clearly much stronger than Worst.)

With these characterizations in hand Zwart and Franssen go on to show that Arrow’s famous theorem in social choice theory can be applied to obtain a surprising general result about truthlikeness orderings: that there is a precise sense in which there can be no compromise between the content and likeness approaches, that any apparent compromise effectively capitulates to one paradigm or the other. (Given their characterization of the two approaches, Hilpinen’s apparent compromise is deemed to err on the side of the likeness approach.)

This theorem represents an interesting new development in the truthlikeness debate. As already noted, much of the debate has been conducted on the battlefield of intuition, with protagonists from different camps firing off cases which appear to refute their opponent’s definition while confirming their own. The Zwart-Franssen-Arrow theorem is not only an interesting result in itself, but it represents an innovative and welcome development in the debate, since most of the theorizing has lacked this kind of theoretical generality.

One problem with this incompatibility result lies in Zwart and Franssen’s characterization of the two approaches. If delivering all the judgments that are delivered by the Simple Truth Content is a necessary condition for a proposal to be welcomed in the content camp, then while the symmetric difference proposals of Miller and Kuipers are ruled in, Popper’s original proposal is ruled out. Further, if delivering all the judgments delivered by Hilpinen’s proposal is stipulated to be a necessary for any likeness account then Tichý’s averaging account is ruled out of the likeness camp. So both characterizations appear to be too narrow. They rule out what are perhaps the central paradigms of two different approaches.

A rather more liberal characterization of the content approach would count in any proposal that guarantees the value of content for truths. That, at least, was Popper’s litmus test for acceptability and what primarily motivated his original proposal. A more inclusive characterization of the likeness approach would count in any proposal that makes truthlikeness supervene on a measure or ordering of likeness on worlds.

On these more inclusive characterizations, Popper’s theory qualifies as a content account; Tichý’s theory qualifies as a likeness account. And that is as it should be. Further, Hilpinen’s theory falls within the likeness approach, but fails to qualify as a genuine content account. It does not deliver the full value of content for truths. So on these characterizations Hilpinen’s account is not a genuine hybrid.

As we have seen, one shortcoming which Hilpinen’s proposal shares with Popper’s original proposal is the absolute worthlessness of all falsehoods: that no falsehood is closer to the truth than any truth (even the worthless tautology). This defect of Hilpinen’s qualitative proposal can be remedied by assuming quantitative distances between worlds, and letting $$A$$’s distance from the truth be a weighted average of the distance of the closest world in $$A$$ from the actual world, and the distance of the furthest world in $$A$$ from the actual world. This quantitative version (call it min-max-average) of Hilpinen’s account renders all propositions comparable for truthlikeness, and some falsehoods it deems more truthlike than some truths.

Although min-max-average falls within the likeness approach broadly characterized, it too fails to deliver the value of content for truths. So it does not qualify as a content ordering either. Moreover, it is not entirely satisfactory from a likeness perspective either, despite satisfying the rather weak likeness constraint that truthlikeness supervene on likeness. To illustrate this, let $$A$$ be a true proposition with a number of worlds tightly clustered around the actual world $$a$$. Let $$B$$ be a false proposition with a number of worlds tightly clustered around a world $$z$$ maximally distant from actuality. $$A$$ is highly truthlike, and $$B$$ highly untruthlike and min-max-average agrees. But now let $$B+$$ be $$B$$ plus $$a$$, and let $$A+$$ be $$A$$ plus $$z$$. Considerations of both continuity and likeness suggest that $$A+$$ should be much more truthlike than $$B+$$, but they are deemed equally truthlike by min-max-average.

Part of the problem with min-max-average proposal is that the furthest world in a proposition is, as noted above, a very crude estimator of overall content. It is precisely for this reason that Niiniluoto suggests a different content measure: the (normalized) sum of the distances of worlds in $$A$$ from the actual world. As we have seen, sum is not itself a good measure of distance of a proposition from the truth. However formally, sum is a probability measure, and hence a measure of a kind of logical weakness. But sum is also a content-likeness hybrid, rendering a proposition more contentful the closer its worlds are to actuality. Being genuinely sensitive to size, sum is clearly a better measure of logical weakness than the world furthest from actuality. Hence Niiniluoto proposes a weighted average of the closest world (the truth factor) and sum (the information factor).

Niiniluoto’s measure, min-sum-average, ranks a tautology, $$B+$$ and $$A+$$ in that order of closeness to the truth. min-sum-average also delivers the value of content for truths: if $$A$$ is true and is logically stronger than $$B$$ then both have the same truth factor (0), but since the range of $$B$$ contains more worlds, its sum will be greater, making it further from the truth. So min-sum-average falls within the content approach on this characterization. On the other hand, min-sum-average also seems to fall within the likeness camp, since it deems truthlikeness to be a non-trivial function of the likenesses of worlds, in the range of a proposition, to the actual world.

According to min-sum-average: all propositions are commensurable for truthlikeness; the full principle of the value of content for truths holds provided the content factor gets non-zero weight; the Truth has greater truthlikeness than any other proposition provided all non-actual worlds are some distance from the actual world; some false propositions are closer to the truth than others; the principle of the value of content for falsehoods is appropriately repudiated, provided the truth factor gets some weight; if $$A$$ is false, the truth content of $$A$$ is more truthlike than $$A$$ itself, again provided the truth factor gets some weight. min-sum-average thus seems like a consistent and appealing compromise between content and likeness approaches.

This compatibility result may be too quick and dirty for the following reason. We laid down a somewhat stringent condition on content-based measures (namely, the value of content for truths) but we have only required a very lax, supervenience condition for likeness-based measures (namely, that the likeness of a proposition to the truth be some function or other of the likeness of the worlds in the proposition to the actual world). This latter condition allows any old function of likeness to count. For example, summing the distances of worlds from the actual world is a function of likeness, but it hardly satisfies basic intuitive constraints on the likeness of a proposition to the truth. There might well be more demanding but still plausible constraints on the likeness approach, and those constraints might block the compatibility of likeness and content. It also has to be admitted that there is something a little unsatisfactory with the rather piecemeal method that was used to arrive at an extension from distance between worlds to distance from the truth. A better way of proceeding would be to discover some highly plausible general principles that any likeness theorist would find compelling, which would ideally uniquely identify the correct extension.

The following three constraints on any extension of distances between worlds to distances of propositions from the truth have been proposed (Oddie 2013).

First, suppose that all the worlds in the range of $$A$$ are exactly the same distance from the actual world. What is the overall distance of $$A$$ from the actual world? One very plausible answer is that $$A$$ is exactly the same distance as the worlds it contains:

The uniform distance principle: If the worlds in the range of $$A$$ are of a uniform distance $$d$$ from the actual world then the distance of $$A$$ from the actual world is also $$d$$.

Note that average and min-max-average both obey uniform distance while min-sum-average does not. min-sum-average is based on the intuition that adding new disjuncts decreases truthlikeness, unless the new disjunct improves the minimum distance. For example, on min-sum-average if it is hot and rainy, the false proposition $$(h \amp{\sim}r)\vee({\sim}h \amp r)$$ is further from the truth than either of its two false disjuncts, even though both disjuncts are the same distance from the truth.

Let $$A^{v/u}$$ be any proposition that differs from $$A$$ only in that it contains $$v$$ rather than $$u$$, and suppose that $$v$$ is closer to the actual world than $$u$$. Clearly $$A^{v/u}$$ cannot be further from the actual world than $$A$$ is.

This gives us:

The Pareto principle: If $$v$$ is at least as close to the actual world as $$u$$ is, then $$A^{v/u}$$ is at least as close to the truth as $$A$$ is.

If $$v$$ is closer to the actual world than $$u$$ is then there should be a difference between the distance of $$A$$ from the truth and the distance of $$A^{v/u}$$ from the truth. What should that difference depend on? Given that $$A^{v/u}$$ differs from $$A$$ only over the distance from the actual world of worlds $$u$$ and $$v$$, the difference in closeness to truth of $$A$$ and $$B$$ can certainly depend on the distance of $$u$$ from the actual world and the distance of $$v$$ from the actual world. The following argument shows that the difference may also depend on the size of $$A$$.

The smaller $$A$$ is the more the replacement changes what we might call $$A$$’s distance profile. In the limit if $$A$$ is a singleton (viz. $$\{u\})$$, $$A^{v/u}$$ is also a singleton (viz., $$\{v\})$$. From the uniform distance principle, we know that the difference between the distances of $$A$$ and of $$A^{v/u}$$ in this case is the difference between the distance of $$v$$ and the distance of $$u$$ from the actual world. And that is the largest difference that replacing $$u$$ with $$v$$ could make. The larger $$A$$ is the less of an impact the replacement will have. So size of $$A$$ may make a difference to the impact of replacement. However, we don’t have to stipulate any particular function here, or even that it be a decreasing function of the size of $$A$$ (as indeed it should be). Rather, we merely allow that the difference between the two distances is some function or other of these three factors.

The difference principle: The difference in closeness to the truth of $$A$$ and $$A^{v/u}$$ is some function or other of at most three factors: the distance of $$u$$ from the actual world; the distance of $$v$$ from the actual world; and the size of $$A$$.

These three extension principles individually should be very attractive to a likeness theorist. And it is easy to check that averaging satisfies the extension principles. Interestingly it can also be shown that averaging is the only extension principle to do so. Any other extension will violate one of the three constraints. By relaxing the implicit assumption that all worlds are of equal weight, a generalized argument shows that weighted average distance is the only function to satisfy the extension principles.

Call a distance/likeness function $$\delta$$ flat provided $$\delta vw=1$$ if and only if $$v\ne w$$. A flat distance function embodies an extreme version of likeness nihilism – namely, that as a matter of brute necessity no world is more like the actual world than is any other. It still counts as a possible view of likeness, albeit an extreme view, one which is perhaps supported by a generalized language dependence argument (see section §1.4.4). Given a flat distance function on worlds, together with weighted averaging, the distance of proposition $$A$$ from the truth is $$(1-(P(A)/P(T))$$ if $$A$$ is true, and 1 if $$A$$ is false. Since this is generated by a distance function this measure of distance from the truth falls within the likeness approach broadly construed, and since we used weighted averaging, it also satisfies the distance extension principles. Further, since the ordering delivers the value of content for truths it falls within the content approach, broadly characterized.

So, it turns out that the content and likeness approaches are compatible. Indeed Popper’s original ordering satisfies the strictures of both content and likeness approaches. It is obviously a content ordering, and, since averaging the flat distance function induces an extension of Popper’s ordering, it falls within the likeness approach as well. Notice that averaging a flat distance function delivers both kinds of worthlessness for falsehoods. It yields the result that no falsehood is closer to the truth than any other, and no falsehood is closer to the truth than the least truthlike truth. Furthermore, this is not just a peculiar feature of the flat distance function, for at least one half of this result is completely general:

Any ordering of closeness to truth which is derived from averaging a likeness function, and which delivers the value of content for truths, deems all falsehoods to be absolutely worthless.

Although the three approaches are, strictly speaking, compatible, there is still a deep tension between them. If you accept the three plausible likeness principles (uniform distance, Pareto, and difference) then you either have to reject the principle of the value of content for truths or you have to accept the absolute worthlessness of falsehoods. The latter is not a serious option. Both uniform distance and pareto seem rather compelling. If this is right the choice is between rejecting the difference principle and rejecting the value of content for truths.