Notes to Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Value

1. Epicurus 1926. This formulation of hedonism is rough, since hedonists often allow for the intrinsic goodness and badness of things other than, but containing, pleasure and pain (things such as lives and worlds, for example).

2. Although this is how the term “intrinsic value” is often understood, it has been understood in other ways, too. Sometimes it appears to be used simply as a synonym of “nonderivative value” after all. Also, at one point G. E. Moore uses it to refer to any kind of value that supervenes solely on the intrinsic nature of the value-bearer. See Moore 1922, p. 260.

3. Again, this is to put matters only roughly. See note 1 above.

4. Kant could avoid this implication only by positing the existence of something infinitely bad whose value would counterbalance that of rational beings, or by denying that the value of our world is proportional to that of its contents. He nowhere indicates that he is prepared to make either move.

5. Rønnow-Rasmussen 2002 pursues the implications of this distinction in detail.

6. Geach 1956. Geach does not in fact identify Moore by name but aims his criticism at those he calls “moral philosophers known as Objectivists.”

7. This view is discussed but not endorsed in Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen 2003.

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Ben Bradley <>

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