Notes to Wang Yangming

1. Among the best sources for Wang's life are the Nianpu, written by Wang's disciple Qian Dehong (1496–1574), found in the Wang Wencheng Gong Quanshu, and the Wang Wencheng Chuanben, by Mao Qiling (1623–1716). Useful English–language accounts may be found in Chan 1963, Chang 1939, and Tu 1976.

2. “This mind” is an expression taken from Mengzi 1A7. Neo–Confucians use the term to refer to our innate moral sense. Consequently, Wang's dying words were not bragging about the quality of his own individual mind, but rather were a call for everyone to recognize the capacity they have within them.

3. Zhu Xi states explicitly that all virtues are ultimately manifestations of benevolence (Collected Commentaries, Mengzi 2A7). See Van Norden 2008, 47–48.

4. This entry follows the convention of referring to the philosopher as “Mencius,” and his collected sayings and dialogues as the “Mengzi.” Neo–Confucians often interpreted Mencius and other ancient Confucians in the light of the concepts they had absorbed from Buddhism. As a result, their readings are sometimes skewed. The situation is analogous to the way in which Augustine's interpretation of the Bible was influenced by Platonism. See Ivanhoe 2002.

5. For more on Zhu Xi's metaphysics and ethics, see Gardner 1990, Kim 2000, Van Norden 2004, Shun 2010, and Van Norden 2013.

6. Kwong-loi Shun (2011) explains part of what is at issue in the claim that “the mind is Pattern”: “For Zhu…the heart/mind has knowledge of pattern, where such knowledge is akin to a form of perceptual relation.” In contrast, for Wang “…there is no pattern for the heart/mind to relate to independently of the heart/mind's responses; instead, pattern resides in the responses of the heart/mind in its original state.”

7. Analects 9.18 is one of a number of passages that use the term se to refer to sexual attractiveness, and in the commentary on this passage in his Sishu jizhu Zhu Xi explicitly links this usage to that in the Great Learning. See Slingerland 2003, 92–93.

8. For Zhu Xi's explanation of the phrase “ge wu,” see his commentary on Great Learning, Classic 4–5, in Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 189. For Wang's interpretation, see his “Questions on the Great Learning,” in Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 249. Unfortunately, the key word “ge” is highly ambiguous, so both interpretations of this phrase (and others besides) are completely defensible. David S. Nivison (1996a, 225) described the phrase as “a philologist's delight,” because of the endless speculation it could provoke, and argued that “[n]o one will ever know what it really meant in its locus classicus.”

9. The phrases Wang quotes are from Mengzi 2A6 and 7A15.

10. For an interesting popular discussion, see Fallon 2013.

11. For selections from Japanese followers of Wang Yangming, see de Bary 2005. For further discussion of Wang's influence in China, see Nivison 1967.

12. On the Evidential Research movement, see Elman 2001. Ironically, the preference of the Evidential Research scholars for concrete particulars over abstract theorizing can be seen as an outgrowth of Wang's own critique of the Cheng–Zhu School. See Nivison 1996b.

13. For representative New Confucian views of Wang, see Chang 1955, and Tang 1988. On New Confucianism in general, see Makeham 2003.

Copyright © 2014 by
Bryan Van Norden <>

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