Notes to Weakness of Will

1. Until section 3.3, which discusses some revisionist doubts about understanding weakness of will as action contrary to one’s better judgment, this entry follows the tradition in using the expression “weakness of will” to refer to the phenomenon just described. Note that while the phrase “weakness of will” might suggest a general character trait, contemporary philosophers have generally concentrated on weak-willed action, that is, on individual actions performed against the agent’s better judgment. (See Hill 1986 for discussion of weakness of will as a character trait.) They have often used “incontinent” and “akratic” as synonyms for “weak-willed” in this sense, and until section 3.3 I shall follow tradition in these respects too. (“Akratic” comes from the Greek akrasia, lack of self-control.)

2. The present essay focuses on the contemporary (post-World War II) literature on weakness of will; the reader interested in tracing the history of philosophical discussion of this topic is invited to consult the following additional sources. Within this encyclopedia, the entry on Aristotle’s ethics discusses his views on akrasia at some length, and the entry on medieval theories of practical reason provides pertinent background on medieval views of practical reasoning and the will. Among monographs on weakness of will, those by Charlton (1988) and Gosling (1990) have a significant historical component: Charlton’s chs. 2 and 3, and Gosling’s chs. I–VII, discuss ancient (and, in the case of Gosling, medieval and early modern) work on the topic prior to engaging with the contemporary literature in later chapters. See also, in similar guise, Wilkerson 1997, ch. 1, and Thero 2006, chs. 2–5. Among works more purely historical in nature, Saarinen 1994 is a monograph devoted to medieval treatments of the problem. Bobonich and Destrée 2007 is a collection of essays on ancient discussions of akrasia, the introduction to which gives a useful overview. Another recent collection, Hoffmann 2008, discusses various treatments of weakness of will “from Plato to the present,” with detailed examination of a number of medieval authors. Six of the ten essays in Natali 2009 are devoted to Aristotle’s discussion of akrasia in Book VII of the Nicomachean Ethics; Charles 2011 is a recent discussion of Aristotle’s views on akrasia which offers a moral for contemporary treatments. Fleming 2010 and Marshall 2010 discuss (respectively) Hume and Spinoza on akrasia.

3. Hare sometimes uses weaker terms than “entail” in this connection: see Hare 1952, p. 172 and Hare 1963, p. 56. But his subsequent conclusions follow only if he did truly mean that an action-guiding judgment must entail an answer to the practical question.

4. Hare makes more subtle distinctions among a range of possible cases in Hare 1963, ch. 5, and Hare 2001, but these are the two principal categories.

5. Davidson 1970, p. 22. For consistency with the rest of the text I have re-lettered Davidson’s variables as a and b in this quotation and in principles P1 and P2, quoted below.

6. If I decide it would be best not to turn on the light when checking on my sleeping baby, but then a violent sneeze causes my arm to fly up and hit the light switch, thus turning on the light, this ought not to count as an incontinent action on my part; and it does not, on Davidson’s criteria. Furthermore, condition (a) rules out cases in which, say, a man thinks it best that he not send a valentine to Margery Morningstar, but intentionally sends a valentine to Margery Eveningstar, not knowing that Margery Eveningstar is Margery Morningstar (Davidson 1970, p. 25). Such an act should not count as an instance of akrasia either; and it does not, on Davidson’s criteria, since it is not intentional under the description “sending a valentine to Margery Morningstar.”

7. Davidson seems to endorse the idea that incontinent action must be free (p. 22, n. 1) and, in particular, uncompelled (p. 29), even if his official characterization does not use these terms explicitly. Whether and how weakness of will can be distinguished from compulsion has been a subject of much debate in the literature: see Gary Watson’s classic paper on the subject (1977) and also Audi 1979, Mele 1987, ch. 2, Buss 1997, Tenenbaum 1999, Wallace 1999, Kennett 2001, ch. 6, Mele 2002, Smith 2003, and Mele 2012, ch. 3 for discussion of this issue.

8. Davidson further sketches that picture in section II of Davidson 1970 and in Davidson 1978.

9. Davidson explains the logical distinction between these two types of judgment at 1970, pp. 37–41; my presentation is also indebted to Bratman 1979. Davidson typically calls the first type of judgment “prima facie judgments,” a usage I shall follow.

10. Indeed, not only does he fail to draw an AO conclusion in favor of a; he actually draws an AO conclusion in favor of b. This implication of Davidson’s treatment emerges with greater clarity from Davidson 1978, in which he identifies intentions with all-out or unconditional evaluative judgments. (Recall that the incontinent agent does b intentionally.)

11. Because Davidson does not, strictly speaking, commit himself to P1 and P2 in the precise formulations given in his 1970 (see pp. 23–4; p. 27; p. 31), it is overstating the case to say that his analysis rules out action contrary to an unconditional judgment. At a minimum, though, such action (if possible) is wholly unaccounted for by his treatment, and in light of the totality of the evidence in his 1970 and 1978 it seems reasonable to conclude that he does view it as impossible. I will heretofore speak as if Davidson really had committed himself to the truth of P1 and P2, and hence to the impossibility of such action.

12. Alfred Mele, for instance, focuses on what he calls “strict akratic action” in his 1987 (see esp. chs. 1–3 and 6), and David Pears explores “last-ditch akrasia” at length in his 1984 (see esp. chs. VI–X).

13. Other writers who have especially stressed the role of emotions in akratic action and indeed in rational akratic action include Jones 2003 and Tappolet 2003. In doing so they reprise an idea mooted by the later Davidson (1982), namely that we can make the most sense of akrasia when it involves distinct sub-systems within the mind operating to some degree autonomously. (One of the distinctive features of emotions as psychic forces, according to such writers, is that they arise and influence us relatively independently of conscious judgment.)

14. See Jackson 1984 for a different revisionist understanding of weakness of will which also bypasses the agent’s better judgment.

15. Subsequent writers (see for example Mele 2012, ch. 2) have questioned whether Holton was correct in his interpretation of the folk understanding of weakness of will. Holton himself subsequently grew less sure of this: see Holton and May 2012.

16. This is questioned in Dodd 2009.

17. McIntyre implicitly takes her earlier self to task for having neglected the procedural aspect of rationality and equated what is rational with what we have most reason to do (McIntyre 2006, p. 289; p. 299).

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