#### Supplement to Hermann Weyl

## Weyl’s metric-independent construction of the symmetric linear connection

Weyl characterizes the notion of a symmetric linear connection as follows:

**Definition A.1 (Affine Connection)**

Let \(T(M_{p})\) denote the tangent space of \(M\) at \(p \in M\). A
point \(p \in M\) is affinely connected with its immediate
neighborhood, if and only if for every vector \(v_{p} \in T(M_{p})\),
a vector at \(q\)

is determined to which the vector \(v_{p} \in T(M_{p})\) gives rise under parallel displacement from \(p\) to the infinitesimally neighboring point \(q\).

Of the notion of parallel displacement, Weyl requires that it satisfy the following condition.

**Definition A.2 (Parallel Displacement)**

The transport of a vector \(v_{p} \in T(M_{p})\) to an infinitesimally
neighboring point \(q \in M\) constitutes a parallel displacement if
and only if there exists a coordinate system \(\overline{x}^{i}\)
(called a *geodesic* coordinate system) for the neighborhood of
\(p \in M\), relative to which the transported vector
\(\overline{v}_{q}\) possesses the same components as
\(\overline{v}_{p}\); that is,

The requirement that there exist a geodesic coordinate system such that (45) is satisfied, characterizes the essential nature of parallel transport.

It is natural to require that for an arbitrary coordinate system the components \(dv^{i}_{p}\) in (44) vanish whenever \(v^{i}_{p}\) or \(dx^{i}_{p}\) vanish. Hence, the simplest assumption that can be made about the components \(dv^{i}_{p}\) is that they are linearly dependent on the two vectors \(v^{i}_{p}\) and \(dx^{i}_{p}\). That is, \(dv^{i}_{p}\) must be bilinear in \(v^{i}_{p}\) and in \(dx^{i}_{p}\); that is,

\[\tag{46} dv^{\,i}_{p} = - \Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x)v^{\,j}_{p}dx^{k}_{p}, \]where the \(n^{3}\) coefficients \(\Gamma^{i}_{jk}\)(x) are coordinate functions, that is functions of \(x^{i}\) \((i = 1, \ldots ,n)\), and the minus sign is introduced to agree with convention.

The \(v^{\,j}_{p}\) and \(dx^{k}_{p}\) in (46) are vectors, but \(dv^{\,i}_{p} = v^{\,i}_{q} - v^{\,i}_{p}\) is not a vector since the vectors \(v^{\,i}_{q}\) and \(v^{\,i}_{p}\) lie in different tangent planes and cannot be subtracted. Hence the coefficients \(\Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x)\) do not constitute a tensor; they conform to a linear but non-homogeneous transformation law. The vector

\[ v^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + dv^{\,i}_{p} = v^{\,i}_{p} - \Gamma^{i}_{jk}v^{\,j}_{p}dx^{k}_{p} \]
is called the *parallel displaced vector*.

Weyl (1918b, 1923b) proves the following theorem.

**Theorem A.3**

If for every point \(p\) in a neighborhood \(U\) of \(M\), there
exists a geodesic coordinate system \(\overline{x}\) such that the
change in the components of a vector under parallel transport to an
infinitesimally near point \(q\) is given by

then locally in any other coordinate system \(x\),

\[\tag{48} dv^{\,i}_{p} = - \Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x)v^{\,j}_{p}dx^{k}_{p}, \]where \(\Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x) = \Gamma^{i}_{kj}(x)\), and conversely.

The idea of parallel displacement leads immediately to the idea of
the *covariant derivative* of a vector field. Consider a vector
field \(v^{i}(x)\) evaluated at two nearby points \(p\) and \(q\) with
arbitrary coordinates \(x^{i}\) and \(x^{i} + \delta x^{i}\)
respectively. A first-order Taylor expansion yields

If we set

\[\tag{50} \frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}} \delta x^{\,j}_p = \delta v^{\,i}_p(x), \]then

\[\tag{51} \delta v^{\,i}_{p}(x) = v^{\,i}_{p}(x + \delta x) - v^{\,i}_{p}(x), \]and

\[\tag{52} u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p}. \]The array of derivatives

\[ \frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}} \]do not constitute a tensorial entity, because the derivatives are formed by the inadmissible procedure of subtracting the vector \(v^{\,i}_{p}(x)\) at \(p\) from the vector \(u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p}(x + \delta x)\) at \(q\). Their difference \(\delta v^{\,i}_{p}(x)\) is not a vector since the vectors lie in the different tangent spaces \(T(M_{p})\) and \(T(M_{q})\), respectively. Since \(\delta x^{\,i}_{p}\) is a vector whereas \(\delta v^{\,i}_{p}\) is not, the array of derivatives

\[ \frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}} \]
in (50) cannot therefore be a tensorial entity. To form a derivative
that is tensorial, that is *covariant* or *invariant*,
we must subtract from the vector
\(u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p}\) not
the vector \(v^{\,i}_{p}\), but another vector
**at** \(q\) which “represents” the original
vector \(v^{\,i}_{p}\) as “unchanged” as we proceed from
\(p\) to \(q\). Such a representative vector at \(q\) may be obtained
by *parallel transport* of the vector \(v^{\,i}_{p}\) to the
nearby point \(q\), and will be denoted, given an arbitrary coordinate
system \(x\), by

Since \(dv^{\,i}_{p}\) is the difference between \(v^{\,i}_{p}\) and \(v^{\,i}_{q}\), \(dv^{\, i}_{p}\) is also not a vector for the for the reasons given above; however, the difference

\[\begin{align} u_{q} - v_{q} &= v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p} - [v^{\,i}_{p} + dv^{\,i}_{p}] \\ \tag{54} &= \delta v^{\,i}_{p} - dv^{\,i}_{p} \end{align}\]
*is* a vector and is therefore a tensorial entity.

Figure 16: Covariant differentiation

The covariant derivative can now be defined by the limiting process

\[\begin{align} \nabla_{k}v^{\,i}_{p} &= \lim_{\delta x^{k}_{p} \rightarrow 0} \frac{(v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p} - v^{\,i}_{p} - dv^{\,i}_{p})}{\delta x^{k}_{p}} \\ \tag{55} &= \lim_{\delta x^{k}_{p} \rightarrow 0} \frac{(\delta v^{\,i}_{p} - dv^{\,i}_{p})}{\delta x^{k}_{p}} \\ &= \frac{\partial v^{\,i}_p}{\partial x^k} + \Gamma^i_{jk} v^{\,j}_{p}. \end{align}\]In general, one writes the covariant derivative of a vector field \(v^{i}\) simply as

\[\tag{56} \nabla_{k}v^{\,i} = \partial_{k}v^{\,i} + \Gamma^{i}_{jk}v^{\,j}. \]Weyl (1918b, §3.I.B) also provided a more synthetic argument to establish the symmetry of the affine connection. He considers two infinitesimal vectors \(\overline{PP}_{1}\) and \(\overline{PP}_{2}\) at a point \(P\). The vector \(\overline{PP}_{1}\) under parallel transport along \(\overline{PP}_{2}\) goes into \(\overline{P_{2}P}_{21}\). Similarly, the vector \(\overline{PP}_{2}\) under parallel transport along \(\overline{PP}_{1}\) goes into \(\overline{P_{1}P}_{12}\). These relationships are illustrated in figure 17.

Figure 17: Symmetry of Parallel Transport

The condition imposed on parallel transport is that the four vectors \(\overline{PP}_{1}\), \(\overline{P_{1}P}_{12}\), \(\overline{PP}_{2}\) and \(\overline{P_{2}P}_{21}\) form a closed parallelogram; that is, the points \(P_{12}\) and \(P_{21}\) coincide. It follows that

\[\tag{57} \overline{PP}_{1} + \overline{P_{1}P}_{12} = \overline{PP}_{2} + \overline{P_{2}P}_{21}. \]Denote the coordinates of \(\overline{PP}_{1}\) and \(\overline{PP}_{2}\) by \(dx^{i}\) and \(\delta x^{i}\), respectively. The coordinates of \(\overline{P_{2}P}_{21}\) and \(\overline{P_{1}P}_{12}\) are respectively denoted by \(dx^{i} + \delta dx^{i}\) and \(\delta x^{i} + d\delta x^{i}.\) Substitution into (57) yields

\[\tag{58} dx^{i} + \delta x^{i} + d\delta x^{i} = \delta x^{i} + dx^{i} + \delta dx^{i}, \]or

\[\tag{59} d\delta x^{i} = \delta dx^{i}. \]From the assumption that the vectors transform linearly, one has

\[\tag{60} \begin{matrix} \delta dx^{i} = - \delta \gamma^{i}_{r}dx^{r} & \text{and} & d\delta x^{i} = - d\gamma^{i}_{r}\delta x^{r} \end{matrix}\]From the assumption that the infinitesimal transformation coefficients \(\delta \gamma^{i}_{r}\) and \(d\gamma^{i}_{r}\) are of the same order as the corresponding differentials \(\delta x^{i}\) and \(dx^{i}\), one obtains

\[\tag{61} \begin{matrix} \delta \gamma^{i}_{r} = \Gamma^{i}_{rs}\delta x^{s} & \text{and} & d\gamma^{i}_{r} = \Gamma^{i}_{rs}dx^{s}. \end{matrix}\]Substitution of (60) and (61) into (59) yields

\[\tag{62} \Gamma^{i}_{jk} = \Gamma^{i}_{kj} \]