Notes to Bernard Williams

1. Cp. MSH 156: “the overwhelming Englishness of [Sidgwick’s Methods of Ethics] extends even to a similarity to a cricket match, which has the very sophisticated feature that one can appreciate the significant detail of the monotony that lies before one at a given time only because one understands remote and hypothetical moments of excitement that might grow from it.”

2. In his 1983 ‘The uses of Philosophy’ interview.

3. One might expect the contemporary moral philosophers who call themselves “particularists”—a label that Williams himself was sometimes prepared to wear—to be an exception to this. Ironically enough, they are not. In practice, few normative ethicists have shown less interest in particular issues in applied ethics than the particularists: “Particularism claims, in effect, that there is no such thing as moral theory, in this sense [sc. the existence of a set of moral principles], and so [?] no such subject as practical ethics” (McNaughton 1988: 204).

4. Hare’s prescriptivism is not of course Williams’ only target; but it is a paradigm target, so I can usefully save space by focusing on it. Hare’s Freedom and Reason (OUP 1963) is the main text that I am expounding in this paragraph.

5. In fairness to Hare, it should be pointed out that he, at any rate, did get round to discussing which commitments were right, and hence to talking about applied ethics: see e.g. his Applications of Moral Philosophy (U.Cal. Press, 1972). Williams acknowledges this (PHD: 83): “Hare has always wanted, and earnestly wanted, moral philosophy to have an effect, to make a difference. He does not think it an obstacle to this that on his view moral philosophy is, roughly, a branch of philosophical logic.” Note too that Hare’s most famous pupil is Peter Singer.

6. Hare’s rationale for these views differs from Kant’s. Hare’s is a theory about what agents do desire, Kant’s is a theory about what agents can rationally will. Any adequate critique of Kant should register this distinction. Williams 1985 Ch.4 passes this test, but there are some surprising fails: e.g. Singer 1993: 11 thinks that Kant’s ethics is all about “putting oneself in the position of another”, Blackburn 1998: 214 that one of the two things it is all about is “reciprocity”. Singer and Blackburn support their readings by appeal to the Golden Rule “Do as you would be done by”, even though the only thing Kant says about this rule is that he rejects it: Kant [1997]: 38, footnote.

7. The terminology, in this usage, comes from the sociologist Clifford Geertz’ The Interpretation of Cultures (New York: Basic Books 1973); though Geertz says he got it from Gilbert Ryle. Cf. Ryle 1971: 480–496, which contrasts an action that, under the thinnest description possible, appears simply to be the swift contraction of the eyelid of the right eye, with, under any of a number of thicker descriptions, what could be seen anew as a twitch, conspiratorial wink, or parody of another’s twitch. (Thanks to John Mullarkey for the reference.)

8. Or whatever. I incur no commitments here about the right analysis of knowledge, if there is one.

9. Nietzsche, Twilight [1968]: 69 (cp. Daybreak 132): “In England, in response to every little emancipation from theology one has to reassert one’s position in a fear-inspiring manner as a moral fanatic. That is the penance one pays there.—With us it is different. When one gives up Christian belief one thereby gives up the right to Christian morality. For the latter is absolutely not self-evident…”

10. Anscombe, of course, is not likely to appeal explicitly to Nietzsche to develop her case—though it is striking how close she comes to quoting him. (Anscombe 1958: 26: “If someone professes to be expounding Aristotle and talks in a modern fashion about ”moral“ such-and-such he must be very imperceptive if he does not constantly feel like someone whose jaws have somehow got out of alignment: the teeth don’t come together in a proper bite”; Nietzsche: “‘How much has conscience had to chew on in the past! And what excellent teeth it had! And today--what is lacking?’ A dentist’s question” (Twilight [1968]: 25).

11. See John C. Calhoun, Speech on the Reception of Abolition Petitions: Revised Report, U.S. Senate, February 6, 1837, hosted at Wake Forest University.

12. Of course this is not the only way of summarising it, and of course my summary leaves some important things out; most notably, it leaves out the morality system’s commitment to external reasons. But this is because that is a big enough topic to need a section to itself: see section 4.

13. At a later stage in his career, Williams would surely have written “ethical thought” here: see 1985: 6.

14. Williams argues in another paper, “Consistency and Realism” (PS: 187–206), that no parallel point holds of epistemic demands. It is a requirement of rationality that epistemic conflicts be seen as ultimately eliminable; it is not a requirement of rationality that ethical conflicts be so understood. Hence a contrast between the kinds of realism that can be true in the epistemic and ethical domains. The ethical domain is necessarily less truth-apt, which is not to say that it is not truth-apt at all.

15. Not Williams’ example. One example that Williams does discuss (PS: 173; see also the more extended remarks at 1993: 132–137) is Agamemnon’s sacrifice of his daughter Iphigeneia for the sake of fair winds for his fleet. As Williams recognises, it is tempting to object that this example is too culturally alien to us to be of any use. However, this reaction is a superficial one. As Williams comments, “there is no need of irrational gods to give rise to tragic situations” (PS: 173). It is not hard to see how a warmongering general or politician might find himself facing a choice between making some ruthless sacrifice, and abandoning his warmongering plans altogether—the latter alternative being attended, for him, with such shame and ridicule that there is no realistic prospect of his taking it, so long as he sees himself as a general or politician. (Recall Sophocles’ Ajax, whose very identity as a Homeric warrior is undermined by a related sort of shame and ridicule: Williams 1993: 84–5.)

16. Because of its frequent ironic uses, “regret” is rather too cool a word for what I might feel, or indeed for what Agamemnon might have felt. This is why I go on to use “anguish” and “torment”. I would use “guilt” and “remorse”, except that those words are, at least in some of their uses, too closely associated with the morality system. Both imply “self-blame”, and often remorse about x seems, like repentance, to involve the thought that it was unqualifiedly wrong to do x, which is precisely not the point here.

17. A classic example of this move from a particular to a general obligation is Singer’s (1972) much-debated move from a duty to rescue a child drowning in front of me right now to a duty to rescue, if I can, every dying child, anywhere, at any time.

18. So far, Williams hopes in vain; indeed that day looks further off now than it did in 1973.

19. Williams liked to quote his teacher Gilbert Ryle’s response to a pupil’s suggestion that they discuss logical positivism: “Not interested in isms: we can talk about some things positivists say” (WME 186).

20. Because it primarily considers the agent “qua agent”, as the jargon has it, i.e. “as a rational agent and no more” (1985: 69), without direct interest in the particularities of the agent’s character.

21. Against intending/ foreseeing (the doctrine of double effect): see 2002: 101; against doing/ allowing see MSH Essay 5.

22. Contrast Anscombe 1958, who makes it a defining feature of non-consequentialism to believe in such absolute prohibitions, and so must presumably count Williams, of all people, as a consequentialist.

23. 1981: 51: “If you want the world to contain generous, forceful, resolute, creative and actually happy people, you do not wish it to contain people who uniformly think in such a way that their actions will satisfy the requirements of utilitarianism.”

24. Albert Camus in The Myth of Sisyphus uses a similar phrase, “the point of view of Sirius”.

25. Indeed the incoherence that Williams finds in the indirect utilitarian’s justificatory project has, in his view, a much wider importance. At MSH 170–171 he suggests that it supports an argument not only against indirect utilitarianism, but against any moral theory: “My own view is that no ethical theory can render a coherent account of its own relation to practice: it will always run into some version of the fundamental difficulty that the practice of life, and hence also an adequate theory of that practice, will require the recognition of what I have called deep dispositions; but at the same time the abstract and impersonal view that is required if the theory is to be genuinely a theory cannot be satisfactorily understood in relation to the depth and necessity of those dispositions. Thus the theory will remain, in one way or another, in an incoherent relation to practice. But if ethical theory is anything, then it must stand in close and explicable relation to practice, because that is the kind of theory it would have to be. It thus follows that there is no coherent ethical theory.”

26. Robert Burns, “To a louse”.

27. Skorupski (2006) disagrees with me here. He says the internal reasons thesis is the view that, unless I actually have a given motive M, I cannot have an internal reason corresponding to M. The petrol/ gin case is then to be understood by cashing out the “corresponding”: my motivation to drink gin readily yields a corresponding reason for me not to drink this, since this is petrol, not gin. Here Skorupski’s task of cashing out the “corresponding”, and my task of working out what counts as a sound deliberative route, seem to me to be the same task under two different names; there is also the closely related problem, what it is for me to “actually have” a given motivation.

28. Recall also Augustine’s famous saying: Quia fecisti nos ad te, et inquietum est cor nostrum, donec requiescat in te (Confessions 1.1). For a modern version of the Augustinian idea that all humans have certain desires, and in particular the desire for God, “buried” in them somewhere, see Brewer 2006.

29. Neo-Aristotelians and Thomists are nearly always universalists, believing that all humans have the same basic set of reasons. Aristotle himself was perhaps not a universalist, but the evidence is unclear.

30. For this conclusion see Tollefsen 2004: 33: “Since the starting points of correct deliberation are [on a Thomist view] shared by all agents… it seems true that there is a deliberative path from where any agent is to what that agent ought to do… But since basic goods are objectively good, the subjectivism of Williams’ view is undercut. The resulting picture is not straightforwardly internalist… but it is not straightforwardly externalist either.”

31. Cp. 1985: 54–64 for Williams’ “simplified” and “concretised” account of Kant’s argument, which begins from the question “Is there anything that rational agents necessarily want?”; see also Skorupski (2006) for further discussion.

32. Wider and narrower readings of the internal reasons thesis (IRT) are possible. Most narrowly, IRT could be something like “I don’t have a reason to F unless F-ing furthers some desire that I already have, or would come to have if I had full information”. Most widely, it could be something like “I don’t have a reason to F unless F-ing is mandated by some motivation that I already have, or would come to have if I deliberated fully rationally”. I doubt that anyone is an (unconfused) externalist in the sense of denying this sort of wide reading. Skorupski (forthcoming) explicitly denies the internal reasons thesis, but is evidently denying the narrow reading rather than the wide.

My own sense is that Williams is, or ought to be, more deeply committed to the wide than the narrow reading. One reason in favour of the wide reading is that it doesn’t commit IRT to dubious views about the role of phenomenologically-obvious desires in motivation, nor to a flat instrumentalist account of the nature of practical reasoning or information. And as I say in the main text, it’s not an objection to the wide reading that no one unconfusedly holds its negation. The point is to expose the confusions.

33. See also Singer, How Are We To Live?, p.276: “If we take the point of view of the universe we can recognise the urgency of doing something about the pain and suffering of others, before we even consider promoting other possible values…”

34. A more interesting and more explicit attempt than Singer’s to deny IRT is Hampton 1998: 76–77; she denies IRT on the ground that deliberation involves norms of rationality which generate reasons which cannot be classified as internal reasons. Hampton’s argument why not apparently depends on the false assumption that Williams can’t invoke platitudes about the nature of rationality without committing himself to the Kantian synthetic a priori. However, (1) her argument does point to something important about rationality: its objectivity, the same feature that McDowell is getting at when he attacks IRT for “psychologism”. And (2) Hampton unearths the interesting fact that there are external reasons in epistemic matters: if p, then anyone who has epistemic reason to have a belief whether p has epistemic reason to believe that p, no matter what is in their S, and no matter whether they could arrive at p by a sound deliberative route from what is in their S. Williams, of course, will not be impressed by this point about the epistemic; he will just say that this is another illustration of the contrast he usually draws, between the epistemic and the ethical.

35. Interview with Bernard Williams by Stuart Jeffries in The Guardian, November 30 2002.

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