Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Fri Feb 23, 2007; substantive revision Wed Jan 31, 2018

Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics is undoubtedly the most unknown and under-appreciated part of his philosophical opus. Indeed, more than half of Wittgenstein’s writings from 1929 through 1944 are devoted to mathematics, a fact that Wittgenstein himself emphasized in 1944 by writing that his “chief contribution has been in the philosophy of mathematics” (Monk 1990: 466).

The core of Wittgenstein’s conception of mathematics is very much set by the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (1922; hereafter Tractatus), where his main aim is to work out the language-reality connection by determining what is required for language, or language usage, to be about the world. Wittgenstein answers this question, in part, by asserting that the only genuine propositions that we can use to make assertions about reality are contingent (‘empirical’) propositions, which are true if they agree with reality and false otherwise (4.022, 4.25, 4.062, 2.222). From this it follows that all other apparent propositions are pseudo-propositions of various types and that all other uses of ‘true’ and ‘truth’ deviate markedly from the truth-by-correspondence (or agreement) that contingent propositions have in relation to reality. Thus, from the Tractatus to at least 1944, Wittgenstein maintains that “mathematical propositions” are not real propositions and that “mathematical truth” is essentially non-referential and purely syntactical in nature. On Wittgenstein’s view, we invent mathematical calculi and we expand mathematics by calculation and proof, and though we learn from a proof that a theorem can be derived from axioms by means of certain rules in a particular way, it is not the case that this proof-path pre-exists our construction of it.

As we shall see, Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics begins in a rudimentary way in the Tractatus, develops into a finitistic constructivism in the middle period (Philosophical Remarks (1929–30) and Philosophical Grammar (1931–33), respectively; hereafter PR and PG, respectively), and is further developed in new and old directions in the manuscripts used for Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics (1937–44; hereafter RFM). As Wittgenstein’s substantive views on mathematics evolve from 1918 through 1944, his writing and philosophical styles evolve from the assertoric, aphoristic style of the Tractatus to a clearer, argumentative style in the middle period, to a dialectical, interlocutory style in RFM and the Philosophical Investigations (hereafter PI).

1. Wittgenstein on Mathematics in the Tractatus

Wittgenstein’s non-referential, formalist conception of mathematical propositions and terms begins in the Tractatus.[1] Indeed, insofar as he sketches a rudimentary Philosophy of Mathematics in the Tractatus, he does so by contrasting mathematics and mathematical equations with genuine (contingent) propositions, sense, thought, propositional signs and their constituent names, and truth-by-correspondence.

In the Tractatus, Wittgenstein claims that a genuine proposition, which rests upon conventions, is used by us to assert that a state of affairs (i.e., an elementary or atomic fact; ‘Sachverhalt’) or fact (i.e., multiple states of affairs; ‘Tatsache’) obtain(s) in the one and only real world. An elementary proposition is isomorphic to the possible state of affairs it is used to represent: it must contain as many names as there are objects in the possible state of affairs. An elementary proposition is true iff its possible state of affairs (i.e., its ‘sense’; ‘Sinn’) obtains. Wittgenstein clearly states this Correspondence Theory of Truth at (4.25):

If an elementary proposition is true, the state of affairs exists; if an elementary proposition is false, the state of affairs does not exist.

But propositions and their linguistic components are, in and of themselves, dead—a proposition only has sense because we human beings have endowed it with a conventional sense (5.473). Moreover, propositional signs may be used to do any number of things (e.g., insult, catch someone’s attention); in order to assert that a state of affairs obtains, a person must ‘project’ the proposition’s sense—its possible state of affairs—by ‘thinking’ of (e.g., picturing) its sense as one speaks, writes or thinks the proposition (3.11). Wittgenstein connects use, sense, correspondence, and truth by saying that “a proposition is true if we use it to say that things stand in a certain way, and they do” (4.062; italics added).

The Tractarian conceptions of genuine (contingent) propositions and the (original and) core concept of truth are used to construct theories of logical and mathematical ‘propositions’ by contrast. Stated boldly and bluntly, tautologies, contradictions and mathematical propositions (i.e., mathematical equations) are neither true nor false—we say that they are true or false, but in doing so we use the words ‘true’ and ‘false’ in very different senses from the sense in which a contingent proposition is true or false. Unlike genuine propositions, tautologies and contradictions “have no ‘subject-matter’” (6.124), “lack sense”, and “say nothing” about the world (4.461), and, analogously, mathematical equations are “pseudo-propositions” (6.2) which, when ‘true’ (‘correct’; ‘richtig’ (6.2321)), “merely mark … [the] equivalence of meaning [of ‘two expressions’]” (6.2323). Given that “[t]autology and contradiction are the limiting cases—indeed the disintegration—of the combination of signs” (4.466; italics added), where

the conditions of agreement with the world—the representational relations—cancel one another, so that [they] do[] not stand in any representational relation to reality,

tautologies and contradictions do not picture reality or possible states of affairs and possible facts (4.462). Stated differently, tautologies and contradictions do not have sense, which means we cannot use them to make assertions, which means, in turn, that they cannot be either true or false. Analogously, mathematical pseudo-propositions are equations, which indicate or show that two expressions are equivalent in meaning and therefore are intersubstitutable. Indeed, we arrive at mathematical equations by “the method of substitution”:

starting from a number of equations, we advance to new equations by substituting different expressions in accordance with the equations. (6.24)

We prove mathematical ‘propositions’ ‘true’ (‘correct’) by ‘seeing’ that two expressions have the same meaning, which “must be manifest in the two expressions themselves” (6.23), and by substituting one expression for another with the same meaning. Just as “one can recognize that [‘logical propositions’] are true from the symbol alone” (6.113), “the possibility of proving” mathematical propositions means that we can perceive their correctness without having to compare “what they express” with facts (6.2321; cf. RFM App. III, §4).

The demarcation between contingent propositions, which can be used to correctly or incorrectly represent parts of the world, and mathematical propositions, which can be decided in a purely formal, syntactical manner, is maintained by Wittgenstein until his death in 1951 (Zettel §701, 1947; PI II, 2001 edition, pp. 192–193e, 1949). Given linguistic and symbolic conventions, the truth-value of a contingent proposition is entirely a function of how the world is, whereas the “truth-value” of a mathematical proposition is entirely a function of its constituent symbols and the formal system of which it is a part. Thus, a second, closely related way of stating this demarcation is to say that mathematical propositions are decidable by purely formal means (e.g., calculations), while contingent propositions, being about the ‘external’ world, can only be decided, if at all, by determining whether or not a particular fact obtains (i.e., something external to the proposition and the language in which it resides) (2.223; 4.05).

The Tractarian formal theory of mathematics is, specifically, a theory of formal operations. Over the past 20 years, Wittgenstein’s theory of operations has received considerable examination (Frascolla 1994, 1997; Marion 1998; Potter 2000; and Floyd 2002), which has interestingly connected it and the Tractarian equational theory of arithmetic with elements of Alonzo Church’s \(\lambda\)-calculus and with R. L. Goodstein’s equational calculus (Marion 1998: chapters 1, 2, and 4). Very briefly stated, Wittgenstein presents:

  1. … the sign ‘[\(a, x, O \spq x\)]’ for the general term of the series of forms \(a\), \(O \spq a\), \(O \spq O \spq a\)…. (5.2522)
  2. … the general form of an operation \(\Omega\spq(\overline{\eta})\) [as] \[ [\overline{\xi}, N(\overline{\xi})]\spq (\overline{\eta}) (= [\overline{\eta}, \overline{\xi}, N(\overline{\xi})]). (6.01) \]
  3. … the general form of a proposition (“truth-function”) [as] \([\overline{p}, \overline{\xi}, N(\overline{\xi})]\). (6)
  4. The general form of an integer [natural number] [as] \([0, \xi , \xi + 1]\). (6.03)

adding that “[t]he concept of number is… the general form of a number” (6.022). As Frascolla (and Marion after him) have pointed out, “the general form of a proposition is a particular case of the general form of an ‘operation’” (Marion 1998: 21), and all three general forms (i.e., of operation, proposition, and natural number) are modeled on the variable presented at (5.2522) (Marion 1998: 22). Defining “[a]n operation [as] the expression of a relation between the structures of its result and of its bases” (5.22), Wittgenstein states that whereas “[a] function cannot be its own argument,… an operation can take one of its own results as its base” (5.251).

On Wittgenstein’s (5.2522) account of ‘[\(a, x, O \spq x\)]’,

the first term of the bracketed expression is the beginning of the series of forms, the second is the form of a term \(x\) arbitrarily selected from the series, and the third [\(O \spq x\)] is the form of the term that immediately follows \(x\) in the series.

Given that “[t]he concept of successive applications of an operation is equivalent to the concept ‘and so on’” (5.2523), one can see how the natural numbers can be generated by repeated iterations of the general form of a natural number, namely ‘[\(0, \xi , \xi +1\)]’. Similarly, truth-functional propositions can be generated, as Russell says in the Introduction to the Tractatus (p. xv), from the general form of a proposition ‘[\(\overline{p}\), \(\overline{\xi}\), \(N(\overline{\xi})\)]’ by

taking any selection of atomic propositions [where \(p\) “stands for all atomic propositions”; “the bar over the variable indicates that it is the representative of all its values” (5.501)], negating them all, then taking any selection of the set of propositions now obtained, together with any of the originals [where \(x\) “stands for any set of propositions”]—and so on indefinitely.

On Frascolla’s (1994: 3ff) account,

a numerical identity “\(\mathbf{t} = \mathbf{s}\)” is an arithmetical theorem if and only if the corresponding equation “\(\Omega^t \spq x = \Omega^s \spq x\)”, which is framed in the language of the general theory of logical operations, can be proven.

By proving

the equation “\(\Omega^{2 \times 2}\spq x = \Omega^{4}\spq x\)”, which translates the arithmetic identity “\(2 \times 2 = 4\)” into the operational language (6.241),

Wittgenstein thereby outlines “a translation of numerical arithmetic into a sort of general theory of operations” (Frascolla 1998: 135).

Despite the fact that Wittgenstein clearly does not attempt to reduce mathematics to logic in either Russell’s manner or Frege’s manner, or to tautologies, and despite the fact that Wittgenstein criticizes Russell’s Logicism (e.g., the Theory of Types, 3.31–3.32; the Axiom of Reducibility, 6.1232, etc.) and Frege’s Logicism (6.031, 4.1272, etc.),[2] quite a number of commentators, early and recent, have interpreted Wittgenstein’s Tractarian theory of mathematics as a variant of Logicism (Quine 1940 [1981: 55]; Benacerraf & Putnam 1964a: 14; Black 1964: 340; Savitt 1979 [1986: 34]; Frascolla 1994: 37; 1997: 354, 356–57, 361; 1998: 133; Marion 1998: 26 & 29; and Potter 2000: 164 and 182–183). There are at least four reasons proffered for this interpretation.

  1. Wittgenstein says that “[m]athematics is a method of logic” (6.234).
  2. Wittgenstein says that “[t]he logic of the world, which is shown in tautologies by the propositions of logic, is shown in equations by mathematics” (6.22).
  3. According to Wittgenstein, we ascertain the truth of both mathematical and logical propositions by the symbol alone (i.e., by purely formal operations), without making any (‘external’, non-symbolic) observations of states of affairs or facts in the world.
  4. Wittgenstein’s iterative (inductive) “interpretation of numerals as exponents of an operation variable” is a “reduction of arithmetic to operation theory”, where “operation” is construed as a “logical operation” (italics added) (Frascolla 1994: 37), which shows that “the label ‘no-classes logicism’ tallies with the Tractatus view of arithmetic” (Frascolla 1998: 133; 1997: 354).

Though at least three Logicist interpretations of the Tractatus have appeared within the last 20 years, the following considerations (Rodych 1995; Wrigley 1998) indicate that none of these reasons is particularly cogent.

For example, in saying that “[m]athematics is a method of logic” perhaps Wittgenstein is only saying that since the general form of a natural number and the general form of a proposition are both instances of the general form of a (purely formal) operation, just as truth-functional propositions can be constructed using the general form of a proposition, (true) mathematical equations can be constructed using the general form of a natural number. Alternatively, Wittgenstein may mean that mathematical inferences (i.e., not substitutions) are in accord with, or make use of, logical inferences, and insofar as mathematical reasoning is logical reasoning, mathematics is a method of logic.

Similarly, in saying that “[t]he logic of the world” is shown by tautologies and true mathematical equations (i.e., #2), Wittgenstein may be saying that since mathematics was invented to help us count and measure, insofar as it enables us to infer contingent proposition(s) from contingent proposition(s) (see 6.211 below), it thereby reflects contingent facts and “[t]he logic of the world”. Though logic—which is inherent in natural (‘everyday’) language (4.002, 4.003, 6.124) and which has evolved to meet our communicative, exploratory, and survival needs—is not invented in the same way, a valid logical inference captures the relationship between possible facts and a sound logical inference captures the relationship between existent facts.

As regards #3, Black, Savitt, and Frascolla have argued that, since we ascertain the truth of tautologies and mathematical equations without any appeal to “states of affairs” or “facts”, true mathematical equations and tautologies are so analogous that we can “aptly” describe “the philosophy of arithmetic of the Tractatus… as a kind of logicism” (Frascolla 1994: 37). The rejoinder to this is that the similarity that Frascolla, Black and Savitt recognize does not make Wittgenstein’s theory a “kind of logicism” in Frege’s or Russell’s sense, because Wittgenstein does not define numbers “logically” in either Frege’s way or Russell’s way, and the similarity (or analogy) between tautologies and true mathematical equations is neither an identity nor a relation of reducibility.

Finally, critics argue that the problem with #4 is that there is no evidence for the claim that the relevant operation is logical in Wittgenstein’s or Russell’s or Frege’s sense of the term—it seems a purely formal, syntactical operation. “Logical operations are performed with propositions, arithmetical ones with numbers”, says Wittgenstein (WVC 218); “[t]he result of a logical operation is a proposition, the result of an arithmetical one is a number”. In sum, critics of the Logicist interpretation of the Tractatus argue that ##1–4 do not individually or collectively constitute cogent grounds for a Logicist interpretation of the Tractatus.

Another crucial aspect of the Tractarian theory of mathematics is captured in (6.211).

Indeed in real life a mathematical proposition is never what we want. Rather, we make use of mathematical propositions only in inferences from propositions that do not belong to mathematics to others that likewise do not belong to mathematics. (In philosophy the question, ‘What do we actually use this word or this proposition for?’ repeatedly leads to valuable insights.)

Though mathematics and mathematical activity are purely formal and syntactical, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein tacitly distinguishes between purely formal games with signs, which have no application in contingent propositions, and mathematical propositions, which are used to make inferences from contingent proposition(s) to contingent proposition(s). Wittgenstein does not explicitly say, however, how mathematical equations, which are not genuine propositions, are used in inferences from genuine proposition(s) to genuine proposition(s) (Floyd 2002: 309; Kremer 2002: 293–94). As we shall see in §3.5, the later Wittgenstein returns to the importance of extra-mathematical application and uses it to distinguish a mere “sign-game” from a genuine, mathematical language-game.

This, in brief, is Wittgenstein’s Tractarian theory of mathematics. In the Introduction to the Tractatus, Russell wrote that Wittgenstein’s “theory of number” “stands in need of greater technical development”, primarily because Wittgenstein had not shown how it could deal with transfinite numbers (Russell 1922[1974]: xx). Similarly, in his review of the Tractatus, Frank Ramsey wrote that Wittgenstein’s ‘account’ does not cover all of mathematics partly because Wittgenstein’s theory of equations cannot explain inequalities (Ramsey 1923: 475). Though it is doubtful that, in 1923, Wittgenstein would have thought these issues problematic, it certainly is true that the Tractarian theory of mathematics is essentially a sketch, especially in comparison with what Wittgenstein begins to develop six years later.

After the completion of the Tractatus in 1918, Wittgenstein did virtually no philosophical work until February 2, 1929, eleven months after attending a lecture by the Dutch mathematician L.E.J. Brouwer.

2. The Middle Wittgenstein’s Finitistic Constructivism

There is little doubt that Wittgenstein was invigorated by L.E.J. Brouwer’s March 10, 1928 Vienna lecture “Science, Mathematics, and Language” (Brouwer 1929), which he attended with F. Waismann and H. Feigl, but it is a gross overstatement to say that he returned to Philosophy because of this lecture or that his intermediate interest in the Philosophy of Mathematics issued primarily from Brouwer’s influence. In fact, Wittgenstein’s return to Philosophy and his intermediate work on mathematics is also due to conversations with Ramsey and members of the Vienna Circle, to Wittgenstein’s disagreement with Ramsey over identity, and several other factors.

Though Wittgenstein seems not to have read any Hilbert or Brouwer prior to the completion of the Tractatus, by early 1929 Wittgenstein had certainly read work by Brouwer, Weyl, Skolem, Ramsey (and possibly Hilbert) and, apparently, he had had one or more private discussions with Brouwer in 1928 (Finch 1977: 260; Van Dalen 2005: 566–567). Thus, the rudimentary treatment of mathematics in the Tractatus, whose principal influences were Russell and Frege, was succeeded by detailed work on mathematics in the middle period (1929–1933), which was strongly influenced by the 1920s work of Brouwer, Weyl, Hilbert, and Skolem.

2.1 Wittgenstein’s Intermediate Constructive Formalism

To best understand Wittgenstein’s intermediate Philosophy of Mathematics, one must fully appreciate his strong variant of formalism, according to which “[w]e make mathematics” (WVC 34, note 1; PR §159) by inventing purely formal mathematical calculi, with ‘stipulated’ axioms (PR §202), syntactical rules of transformation, and decision procedures that enable us to invent “mathematical truth” and “mathematical falsity” by algorithmically deciding so-called mathematical ‘propositions’ (PR §§122, 162).

The core idea of Wittgenstein’s formalism from 1929 (if not 1918) through 1944 is that mathematics is essentially syntactical, devoid of reference and semantics. The most obvious aspect of this view, which has been noted by numerous commentators who do not refer to Wittgenstein as a ‘formalist’ (Kielkopf 1970: 360–38; Klenk 1976: 5, 8, 9; Fogelin 1968: 267; Frascolla 1994: 40; Marion 1998: 13–14), is that, contra Platonism, the signs and propositions of a mathematical calculus do not refer to anything. As Wittgenstein says at (WVC 34, note 1), “[n]umbers are not represented by proxies; numbers are there”. This means not only that numbers are there in the use, it means that the numerals are the numbers, for “[a]rithmetic doesn’t talk about numbers, it works with numbers” (PR §109).

What arithmetic is concerned with is the schema \(||||\).—But does arithmetic talk about the lines I draw with pencil on paper?—Arithmetic doesn’t talk about the lines, it operates with them. (PG 333)

In a similar vein, Wittgenstein says that (WVC 106) “mathematics is always a machine, a calculus” and “[a] calculus is an abacus, a calculator, a calculating machine”, which “works by means of strokes, numerals, etc”. The “justified side of formalism”, according to Wittgenstein (WVC 105), is that mathematical symbols “lack a meaning” (i.e., Bedeutung)—they do not “go proxy for” things which are “their meaning[s]”.

You could say arithmetic is a kind of geometry; i.e. what in geometry are constructions on paper, in arithmetic are calculations (on paper).—You could say it is a more general kind of geometry. (PR §109; PR §111)

This is the core of Wittgenstein’s life-long formalism. When we prove a theorem or decide a proposition, we operate in a purely formal, syntactical manner. In doing mathematics, we do not discover pre-existing truths that were “already there without one knowing” (PG 481)—we invent mathematics, bit-by-little-bit. “If you want to know what \(2 + 2 = 4\) means”, says Wittgenstein, “you have to ask how we work it out”, because “we consider the process of calculation as the essential thing” (PG 333). Hence, the only meaning (i.e., sense) that a mathematical proposition has is intra-systemic meaning, which is wholly determined by its syntactical relations to other propositions of the calculus.

A second important aspect of the intermediate Wittgenstein’s strong formalism is his view that extra-mathematical application (and/or reference) is not a necessary condition of a mathematical calculus. Mathematical calculi do not require extra-mathematical applications, Wittgenstein argues, since we “can develop arithmetic completely autonomously and its application takes care of itself since wherever it’s applicable we may also apply it” (PR §109; cf. PG 308, WVC 104).

As we shall shortly see, the middle Wittgenstein is also drawn to strong formalism by a new concern with questions of decidability. Undoubtedly influenced by the writings of Brouwer and David Hilbert, Wittgenstein uses strong formalism to forge a new connection between mathematical meaningfulness and algorithmic decidability.

An equation is a rule of syntax. Doesn’t that explain why we cannot have questions in mathematics that are in principle unanswerable? For if the rules of syntax cannot be grasped, they’re of no use at all…. [This] makes intelligible the attempts of the formalist to see mathematics as a game with signs. (PR §121)

In Section 2.3, we shall see how Wittgenstein goes beyond both Hilbert and Brouwer by maintaining the Law of the Excluded Middle in a way that restricts mathematical propositions to expressions that are algorithmically decidable.

2.2 Wittgenstein’s Intermediate Finitism

The single most important difference between the Early and Middle Wittgenstein is that, in the middle period, Wittgenstein rejects quantification over an infinite mathematical domain, stating that, contra his Tractarian view, such ‘propositions’ are not infinite conjunctions and infinite disjunctions simply because there are no such things.

Wittgenstein’s principal reasons for developing a finitistic Philosophy of Mathematics are as follows.

  1. Mathematics as Human Invention: According to the middle Wittgenstein, we invent mathematics, from which it follows that mathematics and so-called mathematical objects do not exist independently of our inventions. Whatever is mathematical is fundamentally a product of human activity.
  2. Mathematical Calculi Consist Exclusively of Intensions and Extensions: Given that we have invented only mathematical extensions (e.g., symbols, finite sets, finite sequences, propositions, axioms) and mathematical intensions (e.g., rules of inference and transformation, irrational numbers as rules), these extensions and intensions, and the calculi in which they reside, constitute the entirety of mathematics. (It should be noted that Wittgenstein’s usage of ‘extension’ and ‘intension’ as regards mathematics differs markedly from standard contemporary usage, wherein the extension of a predicate is the set of entities that satisfy the predicate and the intension of a predicate is the meaning of, or expressed by, the predicate. Put succinctly, Wittgenstein thinks that the extension of this notion of concept-and-extension from the domain of existent (i.e., physical) objects to the so-called domain of “mathematical objects” is based on a faulty analogy and engenders conceptual confusion. See #1 just below.)

These two reasons have at least five immediate consequences for Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics.

  1. Rejection of Infinite Mathematical Extensions: Given that a mathematical extension is a symbol (‘sign’) or a finite concatenation of symbols extended in space, there is a categorical difference between mathematical intensions and (finite) mathematical extensions, from which it follows that “the mathematical infinite” resides only in recursive rules (i.e., intensions). An infinite mathematical extension (i.e., a completed, infinite mathematical extension) is a contradiction-in-terms
  2. Rejection of Unbounded Quantification in Mathematics: Given that the mathematical infinite can only be a recursive rule, and given that a mathematical proposition must have sense, it follows that there cannot be an infinite mathematical proposition (i.e., an infinite logical product or an infinite logical sum).
  3. Algorithmic Decidability vs. Undecidability: If mathematical extensions of all kinds are necessarily finite, then, in principle, all mathematical propositions are algorithmically decidable, from which it follows that an “undecidable mathematical proposition” is a contradiction-in-terms. Moreover, since mathematics is essentially what we have and what we know, Wittgenstein restricts algorithmic decidability to knowing how to decide a proposition with a known decision procedure.
  4. Anti-Foundationalist Account of Real Numbers: Since there are no infinite mathematical extensions, irrational numbers are rules, not extensions. Given that an infinite set is a recursive rule (or an induction) and no such rule can generate all of the things mathematicians call (or want to call) “real numbers”, it follows that there is no set of ‘all’ the real numbers and no such thing as the mathematical continuum.
  5. Rejection of Different Infinite Cardinalities: Given the non-existence of infinite mathematical extensions, Wittgenstein rejects the standard interpretation of Cantor’s diagonal proof as a proof of infinite sets of greater and lesser cardinalities.

Since we invent mathematics in its entirety, we do not discover pre-existing mathematical objects or facts or that mathematical objects have certain properties, for “one cannot discover any connection between parts of mathematics or logic that was already there without one knowing” (PG 481). In examining mathematics as a purely human invention, Wittgenstein tries to determine what exactly we have invented and why exactly, in his opinion, we erroneously think that there are infinite mathematical extensions.

If, first, we examine what we have invented, we see that we have invented formal calculi consisting of finite extensions and intensional rules. If, more importantly, we endeavour to determine why we believe that infinite mathematical extensions exist (e.g., why we believe that the actual infinite is intrinsic to mathematics), we find that we conflate mathematical intensions and mathematical extensions, erroneously thinking that there is “a dualism” of “the law and the infinite series obeying it” (PR §180). For instance, we think that because a real number “endlessly yields the places of a decimal fraction” (PR §186), it is “a totality” (WVC 81–82, note 1), when, in reality, “[a]n irrational number isn’t the extension of an infinite decimal fraction,… it’s a law” (PR §181) which “yields extensions” (PR §186). A law and a list are fundamentally different; neither can ‘give’ what the other gives (WVC 102–103). Indeed, “the mistake in the set-theoretical approach consists time and again in treating laws and enumerations (lists) as essentially the same kind of thing” (PG 461).

Closely related with this conflation of intensions and extensions is the fact that we mistakenly act as if the word ‘infinite’ is a “number word”, because in ordinary discourse we answer the question “how many?” with both (PG 463; cf. PR §142). But “‘[i]nfinite’ is not a quantity”, Wittgenstein insists (WVC 228); the word ‘infinite’ and a number word like ‘five’ do not have the same syntax. The words ‘finite’ and ‘infinite’ do not function as adjectives on the words ‘class’ or ‘set’, (WVC 102), for the terms “finite class” and “infinite class” use ‘class’ in completely different ways (WVC 228). An infinite class is a recursive rule or “an induction”, whereas the symbol for a finite class is a list or extension (PG 461). It is because an induction has much in common with the multiplicity of a finite class that we erroneously call it an infinite class (PR §158).

In sum, because a mathematical extension is necessarily a finite sequence of symbols, an infinite mathematical extension is a contradiction-in-terms. This is the foundation of Wittgenstein’s finitism. Thus, when we say, e.g., that “there are infinitely many even numbers”, we are not saying “there are an infinite number of even numbers” in the same sense as we can say “there are 27 people in this house”; the infinite series of natural numbers is nothing but “the infinite possibility of finite series of numbers”—“[i]t is senseless to speak of the whole infinite number series, as if it, too, were an extension” (PR §144). The infinite is understood rightly when it is understood, not as a quantity, but as an “infinite possibility” (PR §138).

Given Wittgenstein’s rejection of infinite mathematical extensions, he adopts finitistic, constructive views on mathematical quantification, mathematical decidability, the nature of real numbers, and Cantor’s diagonal proof of the existence of infinite sets of greater cardinalities.

Since a mathematical set is a finite extension, we cannot meaningfully quantify over an infinite mathematical domain, simply because there is no such thing as an infinite mathematical domain (i.e., totality, set), and, derivatively, no such things as infinite conjunctions or disjunctions (G.E. Moore 1955: 2–3; cf. AWL 6; and PG 281).

[I]t still looks now as if the quantifiers make no sense for numbers. I mean: you can’t say ‘\((n) \phi n\)’, precisely because ‘all natural numbers’ isn’t a bounded concept. But then neither should one say a general proposition follows from a proposition about the nature of number.

But in that case it seems to me that we can’t use generality—all, etc.—in mathematics at all. There’s no such thing as ‘all numbers’, simply because there are infinitely many. (PR §126; PR §129)

‘Extensionalists’ who assert that “\(\varepsilon(0).\varepsilon(1).\varepsilon(2)\) and so on” is an infinite logical product (PG 452) assume or assert that finite and infinite conjunctions are close cousins—that the fact that we cannot write down or enumerate all of the conjuncts ‘contained’ in an infinite conjunction is only a “human weakness”, for God could surely do so and God could surely survey such a conjunction in a single glance and determine its truth-value. According to Wittgenstein, however, this is not a matter of human limitation. Because we mistakenly think that “an infinite conjunction” is similar to “an enormous conjunction”, we erroneously reason that just as we cannot determine the truth-value of an enormous conjunction because we don’t have enough time, we similarly cannot, due to human limitations, determine the truth-value of an infinite conjunction (or disjunction). But the difference here is not one of degree but of kind: “in the sense in which it is impossible to check an infinite number of propositions it is also impossible to try to do so” (PG 452). This applies, according to Wittgenstein, to human beings, but more importantly, it applies also to God (i.e., an omniscient being), for even God cannot write down or survey infinitely many propositions because for him too the series is never-ending or limitless and hence the ‘task’ is not a genuine task because it cannot, in principle, be done (i.e., “infinitely many” is not a number word). As Wittgenstein says at (PR 128; cf. PG 479): “‘Can God know all the places of the expansion of \(\pi\)?’ would have been a good question for the schoolmen to ask”, for the question is strictly ‘senseless’. As we shall shortly see, on Wittgenstein’s account, “[a] statement about all numbers is not represented by means of a proposition, but by means of induction” (WVC 82).

Similarly, there is no such thing as a mathematical proposition about some number—no such thing as a mathematical proposition that existentially quantifies over an infinite domain (PR §173).

What is the meaning of such a mathematical proposition as ‘\((\exists n) 4 + n = 7\)’? It might be a disjunction—\((4 + 0 = 7) \vee{}\) \((4 + 1 = 7) \vee {}\) etc. ad inf. But what does that mean? I can understand a proposition with a beginning and an end. But can one also understand a proposition with no end? (PR §127)

We are particularly seduced by the feeling or belief that an infinite mathematical disjunction makes good sense in the case where we can provide a recursive rule for generating each next member of an infinite sequence. For example, when we say “There exists an odd perfect number” we are asserting that, in the infinite sequence of odd numbers, there is (at least) one odd number that is perfect—we are asserting ‘\(\phi(1) \vee \phi(3) \vee \phi(5) \vee{}\) and so on’ and we know what would make it true and what would make it false (PG 451). The mistake here made, according to Wittgenstein (PG 451), is that we are implicitly “comparing the proposition ‘\((\exists n)\)…’ with the proposition… ‘There are two foreign words on this page’”, which doesn’t provide the grammar of the former ‘proposition’, but only indicates an analogy in their respective rules.

On Wittgenstein’s intermediate finitism, an expression quantifying over an infinite domain is never a meaningful proposition, not even when we have proved, for instance, that a particular number \(n\) has a particular property.

The important point is that, even in the case where I am given that \(3^2 + 4^2 = 5^2\), I ought not to say ‘\((\exists x, y, z, n) (x^n + y^n = z^n)\)’, since taken extensionally that’s meaningless, and taken intensionally this doesn’t provide a proof of it. No, in this case I ought to express only the first equation. (PR §150)

Thus, Wittgenstein adopts the radical position that all expressions that quantify over an infinite domain, whether ‘conjectures’ (e.g., Goldbach’s Conjecture, the Twin Prime Conjecture) or “proved general theorems” (e.g., “Euclid’s Prime Number Theorem”, the Fundamental Theorem of Algebra), are meaningless (i.e., ‘senseless’; ‘sinnlos’) expressions as opposed to “genuine mathematical proposition[s]” (PR §168). These expressions are not (meaningful) mathematical propositions, according to Wittgenstein, because the Law of the Excluded Middle does not apply, which means that “we aren’t dealing with propositions of mathematics” (PR §151). The crucial question why and in exactly what sense the Law of the Excluded Middle does not apply to such expressions will be answered in the next section.

2.3 Wittgenstein’s Intermediate Finitism and Algorithmic Decidability

The middle Wittgenstein has other grounds for rejecting unrestricted quantification in mathematics, for on his idiosyncratic account, we must distinguish between four categories of concatenations of mathematical symbols.

  1. Proved mathematical propositions in a particular mathematical calculus (no need for “mathematical truth”).
  2. Refuted mathematical propositions in (or of) a particular mathematical calculus (no need for “mathematical falsity”).
  3. Mathematical propositions for which we know we have in hand an applicable and effective decision procedure (i.e., we know how to decide them).
  4. Concatenations of symbols that are not part of any mathematical calculus and which, for that reason, are not mathematical propositions (i.e., are non-propositions).

In his 2004 (p. 18), Mark van Atten says that

… [i]ntuitionistically, there are four [“possibilities for a proposition with respect to truth”]:

  1. \(p\) has been experienced as true
  2. \(p\) has been experienced as false
  3. Neither 1 nor 2 has occurred yet, but we know a procedure to decide \(p\) (i.e., a procedure that will prove \(p\) or prove \(\neg p)\)
  4. Neither 1 nor 2 has occurred yet, and we do not know a procedure to decide \(p\).

What is immediately striking about Wittgenstein’s ##1–3 and Brouwer’s ##1–3 (Brouwer 1955: 114; 1981: 92) is the enormous similarity. And yet, for all of the agreement, the disagreement in #4 is absolutely crucial.

As radical as the respective #3s are, Brouwer and Wittgenstein agree that an undecided \(\phi\) is a mathematical proposition (for Wittgenstein, of a particular mathematical calculus) if we know of an applicable decision procedure. They also agree that until \(\phi\) is decided, it is neither true nor false (though, for Wittgenstein, ‘true’ means no more than “proved in calculus \(\Gamma\)”). What they disagree about is the status of an ordinary mathematical conjecture, such as Goldbach’s Conjecture. Brouwer admits it as a mathematical proposition, while Wittgenstein rejects it because we do not know how to algorithmically decide it. Like Brouwer (1948 [1983: 90]), Wittgenstein holds that there are no “unknown truth[s]” in mathematics, but unlike Brouwer he denies the existence of “undecidable propositions” on the grounds that such a ‘proposition’ would have no ‘sense’, “and the consequence of this is precisely that the propositions of logic lose their validity for it” (PR §173). In particular, if there are undecidable mathematical propositions (as Brouwer maintains), then at least some mathematical propositions are not propositions of any existent mathematical calculus. For Wittgenstein, however, it is a defining feature of a mathematical proposition that it is either decided or decidable by a known decision procedure in a mathematical calculus. As Wittgenstein says at (PR §151),

where the law of the excluded middle doesn’t apply, no other law of logic applies either, because in that case we aren’t dealing with propositions of mathematics. (Against Weyl and Brouwer).

The point here is not that we need truth and falsity in mathematics—we don’t—but rather that every mathematical proposition (including ones for which an applicable decision procedure is known) is known to be part of a mathematical calculus.

To maintain this position, Wittgenstein distinguishes between (meaningful, genuine) mathematical propositions, which have mathematical sense, and meaningless, senseless (‘sinnlos’) expressions by stipulating that an expression is a meaningful (genuine) proposition of a mathematical calculus iff we know of a proof, a refutation, or an applicable decision procedure (PR §151; PG 452; PG 366; AWL 199–200). “Only where there’s a method of solution [a ‘logical method for finding a solution’] is there a [mathematical] problem”, he tells us (PR §§149, 152; PG 393). “We may only put a question in mathematics (or make a conjecture)”, he adds (PR §151), “where the answer runs: ‘I must work it out’”.

At (PG 468), Wittgenstein emphasizes the importance of algorithmic decidability clearly and emphatically:

In mathematics everything is algorithm and nothing is meaning [Bedeutung]; even when it doesn’t look like that because we seem to be using words to talk about mathematical things. Even these words are used to construct an algorithm.

When, therefore, Wittgenstein says (PG 368) that if “[the Law of the Excluded Middle] is supposed not to hold, we have altered the concept of proposition”, he means that an expression is only a meaningful mathematical proposition if we know of an applicable decision procedure for deciding it (PG 400). If a genuine mathematical proposition is undecided, the Law of the Excluded Middle holds in the sense that we know that we will prove or refute the proposition by applying an applicable decision procedure (PG 379, 387).

For Wittgenstein, there simply is no distinction between syntax and semantics in mathematics: everything is syntax. If we wish to demarcate between “mathematical propositions” versus “mathematical pseudo-propositions”, as we do, then the only way to ensure that there is no such thing as a meaningful, but undecidable (e.g., independent), proposition of a given calculus is to stipulate that an expression is only a meaningful proposition in a given calculus (PR §153) if either it has been decided or we know of an applicable decision procedure. In this manner, Wittgenstein defines both a mathematical calculus and a mathematical proposition in epistemic terms. A calculus is defined in terms of stipulations (PR §202; PG 369), known rules of operation, and known decision procedures, and an expression is only a mathematical proposition in a given calculus (PR §155), and only if that calculus contains (PG 379) a known (and applicable) decision procedure, for “you cannot have a logical plan of search for a sense you don’t know” (PR §148).

Thus, the middle Wittgenstein rejects undecidable mathematical propositions on two grounds. First, number-theoretic expressions that quantify over an infinite domain are not algorithmically decidable, and hence are not meaningful mathematical propositions.

If someone says (as Brouwer does) that for \((x) f_1 x = f_2 x\), there is, as well as yes and no, also the case of undecidability, this implies that ‘\((x)\)…’ is meant extensionally and we may talk of the case in which all \(x\) happen to have a property. In truth, however, it’s impossible to talk of such a case at all and the ‘\((x)\)…’ in arithmetic cannot be taken extensionally. (PR §174)

“Undecidability”, says Wittgenstein (PR §174) “presupposes… that the bridge cannot be made with symbols”, when, in fact, “[a] connection between symbols which exists but cannot be represented by symbolic transformations is a thought that cannot be thought”, for “[i]f the connection is there,… it must be possible to see it”. Alluding to algorithmic decidability, Wittgenstein stresses (PR §174) that “[w]e can assert anything which can be checked in practice”, because “it’s a question of the possibility of checking” (italics added).

Wittgenstein’s second reason for rejecting an undecidable mathematical proposition is that it is a contradiction-in-terms. There cannot be “undecidable propositions”, Wittgenstein argues (PR §173), because an expression that is not decidable in some actual calculus is simply not a mathematical proposition, since “every proposition in mathematics must belong to a calculus of mathematics” (PG 376).

This radical position on decidability results in various radical and counter-intuitive statements about unrestricted mathematical quantification, mathematical induction, and, especially, the sense of a newly proved mathematical proposition. In particular, Wittgenstein asserts that uncontroversial mathematical conjectures, such as Goldbach’s Conjecture (hereafter ‘GC’) and the erstwhile conjecture “Fermat’s Last Theorem” (hereafter ‘FLT’), have no sense (or, perhaps, no determinate sense) and that the unsystematic proof of such a conjecture gives it a sense that it didn’t previously have (PG 374) because

it’s unintelligible that I should admit, when I’ve got the proof, that it’s a proof of precisely this proposition, or of the induction meant by this proposition. (PR §155)

Thus Fermat’s [Last Theorem] makes no sense until I can search for a solution to the equation in cardinal numbers. And ‘search’ must always mean: search systematically. Meandering about in infinite space on the look-out for a gold ring is no kind of search. (PR §150)

I say: the so-called ‘Fermat’s Last Theorem’ isn’t a proposition. (Not even in the sense of a proposition of arithmetic.) Rather, it corresponds to an induction. (PR §189)

To see how Fermat’s Last Theorem isn’t a proposition and how it might correspond to an induction, we need to examine Wittgenstein’s account of mathematical induction.

2.4 Wittgenstein’s Intermediate Account of Mathematical Induction and Algorithmic Decidability

Given that one cannot quantify over an infinite mathematical domain, the question arises: What, if anything, does any number-theoretic proof by mathematical induction actually prove?

On the standard view, a proof by mathematical induction has the following paradigmatic form.

Inductive Base: \(\phi(1)\)
Inductive Step: \(\forall n(\phi(n) \rightarrow \phi(n + 1))\)
Conclusion: \(\forall n\phi(n)\)

If, however, “\(\forall n\phi(n)\)” is not a meaningful (genuine) mathematical proposition, what are we to make of this proof?

Wittgenstein’s initial answer to this question is decidedly enigmatic. “An induction is the expression for arithmetical generality”, but “induction isn’t itself a proposition” (PR §129).

We are not saying that when \(f(1)\) holds and when \(f(c + 1)\) follows from \(f(c)\), the proposition \(f(x)\) is therefore true of all cardinal numbers: but: “the proposition \(f(x)\) holds for all cardinal numbers” means “it holds for \(x = 1\), and \(f(c + 1)\) follows from \(f(c)\)”. (PG 406)

In a proof by mathematical induction, we do no actually prove the ‘proposition’ [e.g., \(\forall n\phi(n)\)] that is customarily construed as the conclusion of the proof (PG 406, 374; PR §164), rather this pseudo-proposition or ‘statement’ stands ‘proxy’ for the “infinite possibility” (i.e., “the induction”) that we come to ‘see’ by means of the proof (WVC 135). “I want to say”, Wittgenstein concludes, that “once you’ve got the induction, it’s all over” (PG 407). Thus, on Wittgenstein’s account, a particular proof by mathematical induction should be understood in the following way.

Inductive Base: \(\phi(1)\)
Inductive Step: \(\phi(n) \rightarrow \phi(n + 1)\)
Proxy Statement: \(\phi(m)\)

Here the ‘conclusion’ of an inductive proof [i.e., “what is to be proved” (PR §164)] uses ‘\(m\)’ rather than ‘\(n\)’ to indicate that ‘\(m\)’ stands for any particular number, while ‘\(n\)’ stands for any arbitrary number. For Wittgenstein, the proxy statement “\(\phi(m)\)” is not a mathematical proposition that “assert[s] its generality” (PR §168), it is an eliminable pseudo-proposition standing proxy for the proved inductive base and inductive step. Though an inductive proof cannot prove “the infinite possibility of application” (PR §163), it enables us “to perceive” that a direct proof of any particular proposition can be constructed (PR §165). For example, once we have proved “\(\phi(1)\)” and “\(\phi(n) \rightarrow \phi(n + 1)\)”, we need not reiterate modus ponens \(m - 1\) times to prove the particular proposition “\(\phi(m)\)” (PR §164). The direct proof of, say, “\(\phi\)(714)” (i.e., without 713 iterations of modus ponens) “cannot have a still better proof, say, by my carrying out the derivation as far as this proposition itself” (PR §165).

A second, very important impetus for Wittgenstein’s radically constructivist position on mathematical induction is his rejection of an undecidable mathematical proposition.

In discussions of the provability of mathematical propositions it is sometimes said that there are substantial propositions of mathematics whose truth or falsehood must remain undecided. What the people who say that don’t realize is that such propositions, if we can use them and want to call them “propositions”, are not at all the same as what are called “propositions” in other cases; because a proof alters the grammar of a proposition. (PG 367)

In this passage, Wittgenstein is alluding to Brouwer, who, as early as 1907 and 1908, states, first, that “the question of the validity of the principium tertii exclusi is equivalent to the question whether unsolvable mathematical problems exist”, second, that “[t]here is not a shred of a proof for the conviction… that there exist no unsolvable mathematical problems”, and, third, that there are meaningful propositions/‘questions’, such as “Do there occur in the decimal expansion of \(\pi\) infinitely many pairs of consecutive equal digits?”, to which the Law of the Excluded Middle does not apply because “it must be considered as uncertain whether problems like [this] are solvable” (Brouwer, 1908 [1975: 109–110]). “A fortiori it is not certain that any mathematical problem can either be solved or proved to be unsolvable”, Brouwer says (1907 [1975: 79]), “though HILBERT, in ‘Mathematische Probleme’, believes that every mathematician is deeply convinced of it”.

Wittgenstein takes the same data and, in a way, draws the opposite conclusion. If, as Brouwer says, we are uncertain whether all or some “mathematical problems” are solvable, then we know that we do not have in hand an applicable decision procedure, which means that the alleged mathematical propositions are not decidable, here and now. “What ‘mathematical questions’ share with genuine questions”, Wittgenstein says (PR §151), “is simply that they can be answered”. This means that if we do not know how to decide an expression, then we do not know how to make it either proved (true) or refuted (false), which means that the Law of the Excluded Middle “doesn’t apply” and, therefore, that our expression is not a mathematical proposition.

Together, Wittgenstein’s finitism and his criterion of algorithmic decidability shed considerable light on his highly controversial remarks about putatively meaningful conjectures such as FLT and GC. GC is not a mathematical proposition because we do not know how to decide it, and if someone like G. H. Hardy says that he ‘believes’ GC is true (PG 381; LFM 123; PI §578), we must answer that s/he only “has a hunch about the possibilities of extension of the present system” (LFM 139)—that one can only believe such an expression is ‘correct’ if one knows how to prove it. The only sense in which GC (or FLT) can be proved is that it can “correspond to a proof by induction”, which means that the unproved inductive step (e.g., “\(G(n) \rightarrow G(n + 1)\)”) and the expression “\(\forall nG(n)\)” are not mathematical propositions because we have no algorithmic means of looking for an induction (PG 367). A “general proposition” is senseless prior to an inductive proof “because the question would only have made sense if a general method of decision had been known before the particular proof was discovered” (PG 402). Unproved ‘inductions’ or inductive steps are not meaningful propositions because the Law of the Excluded Middle does not hold in the sense that we do not know of a decision procedure by means of which we can prove or refute the expression (PG 400; WVC 82).

This position, however, seems to rob us of any reason to search for a ‘decision’ of a meaningless ‘expression’ such as GC. The intermediate Wittgenstein says only that “[a] mathematician is… guided by… certain analogies with the previous system” and that there is nothing “wrong or illegitimate if anyone concerns himself with Fermat’s Last Theorem” (WVC 144).

If e.g. I have a method for looking at integers that satisfy the equation \(x^2 + y^2 = z^2\), then the formula \(x^{n} + y^n = z^{n}\) may stimulate me. I may let a formula stimulate me. Thus I shall say, Here there is a stimulus—but not a question. Mathematical problems are always such stimuli. (WVC 144, Jan. 1, 1931)

More specifically, a mathematician may let a senseless conjecture such as FLT stimulate her/him if s/he wishes to know whether a calculus can be extended without altering its axioms or rules (LFM 139).

What is here going [o]n [in an attempt to decide GC] is an unsystematic attempt at constructing a calculus. If the attempt is successful, I shall again have a calculus in front of me, only a different one from the calculus I have been using so far. (WVC 174–75; Sept. 21, 1931; italics added)

If, e.g., we succeed in proving GC by mathematical induction (i.e., we prove “\(G(1)\)” and “\(G(n) \rightarrow G(n + 1)\)”), we will then have a proof of the inductive step, but since the inductive step was not algorithmically decidable beforehand (PR §§148, 155, 157; PG 380), in constructing the proof we have constructed a new calculus, a new calculating machine (WVC 106) in which we now know how to use this new “machine-part” (RFM VI, §13) (i.e., the unsystematically proved inductive step). Before the proof, the inductive step is not a mathematical proposition with sense (in a particular calculus), whereas after the proof the inductive step is a mathematical proposition, with a new, determinate sense, in a newly created calculus. This demarcation of expressions without mathematical sense and proved or refuted propositions, each with a determinate sense in a particular calculus, is a view that Wittgenstein articulates in myriad different ways from 1929 through 1944.

Whether or not it is ultimately defensible—and this is an absolutely crucial question for Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics—this strongly counter-intuitive aspect of Wittgenstein’s account of algorithmic decidability, proof, and the sense of a mathematical proposition is a piece with his rejection of predeterminacy in mathematics. Even in the case where we algorithmically decide a mathematical proposition, the connections thereby made do not pre-exist the algorithmic decision, which means that even when we have a “mathematical question” that we decide by decision procedure, the expression only has a determinate sense qua proposition when it is decided. On Wittgenstein’s account, both middle and later, “[a] new proof gives the proposition a place in a new system” (RFM VI, §13), it “locates it in the whole system of calculations”, though it “does not mention, certainly does not describe, the whole system of calculation that stands behind the proposition and gives it sense” (RFM VI, §11).

Wittgenstein’s unorthodox position here is a type of structuralism that partially results from his rejection of mathematical semantics. We erroneously think, e.g., that GC has a fully determinate sense because, given “the misleading way in which the mode of expression of word-language represents the sense of mathematical propositions” (PG 375), we call to mind false pictures and mistaken, referential conceptions of mathematical propositions whereby GC is about a mathematical reality and so has just a determinate sense as “There exist intelligent beings elsewhere in the universe” (i.e., a proposition that is determinately true or false, whether or not we ever know its truth-value). Wittgenstein breaks with this tradition, in all of its forms, stressing that, in mathematics, unlike the realm of contingent (or empirical) propositions, “if I am to know what a proposition like Fermat’s last theorem says”, I must know its criterion of truth. Unlike the criterion of truth for an empirical proposition, which can be known before the proposition is decided, we cannot know the criterion of truth for an undecided mathematical proposition, though we are “acquainted with criteria for the truth of similar propositions” (RFM VI, §13).

2.5 Wittgenstein’s Intermediate Account of Irrational Numbers

The intermediate Wittgenstein spends a great deal of time wrestling with real and irrational numbers. There are two distinct reasons for this.

First, the real reason many of us are unwilling to abandon the notion of the actual infinite in mathematics is the prevalent conception of an irrational number as a necessarily infinite extension. “The confusion in the concept of the ‘actual infinite’ arises” (italics added), says Wittgenstein (PG 471),

from the unclear concept of irrational number, that is, from the fact that logically very different things are called ‘irrational numbers’ without any clear limit being given to the concept.

Second, and more fundamentally, the intermediate Wittgenstein wrestles with irrationals in such detail because he opposes foundationalism and especially its concept of a “gapless mathematical continuum”, its concept of a comprehensive theory of the real numbers (Han 2010), and set theoretical conceptions and ‘proofs’ as a foundation for arithmetic, real number theory, and mathematics as a whole. Indeed, Wittgenstein’s discussion of irrationals is one with his critique of set theory, for, as he says, “[m]athematics is ridden through and through with the pernicious idioms of set theory”, such as “the way people speak of a line as composed of points”, when, in fact, “[a] line is a law and isn’t composed of anything at all” (PR §173; PR §§181, 183, & 191; PG 373, 460, 461, & 473).

2.5.1 Wittgenstein’s Anti-Foundationalism and Genuine Irrational Numbers

Since, on Wittgenstein’s terms, mathematics consists exclusively of extensions and intensions (i.e., ‘rules’ or ‘laws’), an irrational is only an extension insofar as it is a sign (i.e., a ‘numeral’, such as ‘\(\sqrt{2}\)’ or ‘\(\pi\)’). Given that there is no such thing as an infinite mathematical extension, it follows that an irrational number is not a unique infinite expansion, but rather a unique recursive rule or law (PR §181) that yields rational numbers (PR §186; PR §180).

The rule for working out places of \(\sqrt{2}\) is itself the numeral for the irrational number; and the reason I here speak of a ‘number’ is that I can calculate with these signs (certain rules for the construction of rational numbers) just as I can with rational numbers themselves. (PG 484)

Due, however, to his anti-foundationalism, Wittgenstein takes the radical position that not all recursive real numbers (i.e., computable numbers) are genuine real numbers—a position that distinguishes his view from even Brouwer’s.

The problem, as Wittgenstein sees it, is that mathematicians, especially foundationalists (e.g., set theorists), have sought to accommodate physical continuity by a theory that ‘describes’ the mathematical continuum (PR §171). When, for example, we think of continuous motion and the (mere) density of the rationals, we reason that if an object moves continuously from A to B, and it travels only the distances marked by “rational points”, then it must skip some distances (intervals, or points) not marked by rational numbers. But if an object in continuous motion travels distances that cannot be commensurately measured by rationals alone, there must be ‘gaps’ between the rationals (PG 460), and so we must fill them, first, with recursive irrationals, and then, because “the set of all recursive irrationals” still leaves gaps, with “lawless irrationals”.

[T]he enigma of the continuum arises because language misleads us into applying to it a picture that doesn’t fit. Set theory preserves the inappropriate picture of something discontinuous, but makes statements about it that contradict the picture, under the impression that it is breaking with prejudices; whereas what should really have been done is to point out that the picture just doesn’t fit… (PG 471)

We add nothing that is needed to the differential and integral calculi by ‘completing’ a theory of real numbers with pseudo-irrationals and lawless irrationals, first because there are no gaps on the number line (PR §§181, 183, & 191; PG 373, 460, 461, & 473; WVC 35) and, second, because these alleged irrational numbers are not needed for a theory of the ‘continuum’ simply because there is no mathematical continuum. As the later Wittgenstein says (RFM V, §32), “[t]he picture of the number line is an absolutely natural one up to a certain point; that is to say so long as it is not used for a general theory of real numbers”. We have gone awry by misconstruing the nature of the geometrical line as a continuous collection of points, each with an associated real number, which has taken us well beyond the ‘natural’ picture of the number line in search of a “general theory of real numbers” (Han 2010).

Thus, the principal reason Wittgenstein rejects certain constructive (computable) numbers is that they are unnecessary creations which engender conceptual confusions in mathematics (especially set theory). One of Wittgenstein’s main aims in his lengthy discussions of rational numbers and pseudo-irrationals is to show that pseudo-irrationals, which are allegedly needed for the mathematical continuum, are not needed at all.

To this end, Wittgenstein demands (a) that a real number must be “compar[able] with any rational number taken at random” (i.e., “it can be established whether it is greater than, less than, or equal to a rational number” (PR §191)) and (b) that “[a] number must measure in and of itself” and if a ‘number’ “leaves it to the rationals, we have no need of it” (PR §191) (Frascolla 1980: 242–243; Shanker 1987: 186–192; Da Silva 1993: 93–94; Marion 1995a: 162, 164; Rodych 1999b, 281–291; Lampert 2009).

To demonstrate that some recursive (computable) reals are not genuine real numbers because they fail to satisfy (a) and (b), Wittgenstein defines the putative recursive real number

\[ \substack{5 \rightarrow 3 \\ \sqrt{2}} \]

as the rule “Construct the decimal expansion for \(\sqrt{2}\), replacing every occurrence of a ‘5’ with a ‘3’” (PR §182); he similarly defines \(\pi '\) as

\[ \substack{7 \rightarrow 3\\ \pi} \]

(PR §186) and, in a later work, redefines \(\pi '\) as

\[ \substack{777 \rightarrow 000 \\ \pi} \]

(PG 475).

Although a pseudo-irrational such as \(\pi '\) (on either definition) is “as unambiguous as … \(\pi\) or \(\sqrt{2}\)” (PG 476), it is ‘homeless’ according to Wittgenstein because, instead of using “the idioms of arithmetic” (PR §186), it is dependent upon the particular ‘incidental’ notation of a particular system (i.e., in some particular base) (PR §188; PR §182; and PG 475). If we speak of various base-notational systems, we might say that \(\pi\) belongs to all systems, while \(\pi '\) belongs only to one, which shows that \(\pi '\) is not a genuine irrational because “there can’t be irrational numbers of different types” (PR §180). Furthermore, pseudo-irrationals do not measure because they are homeless, artificial constructions parasitic upon numbers which have a natural place in a calculus that can be used to measure. We simply do not need these aberrations, because they are not sufficiently comparable to rationals and genuine irrationals. They are not irrational numbers according to Wittgenstein’s criteria, which define, Wittgenstein interestingly asserts, “precisely what has been meant or looked for under the name ‘irrational number’” (PR §191).

For exactly the same reason, if we define a “lawless irrational” as either (a) a non-rule-governed, non-periodic, infinite expansion in some base, or (b) a “free-choice sequence”, Wittgenstein rejects “lawless irrationals” because, insofar as they are not rule-governed, they are not comparable to rationals (or irrationals) and they are not needed.

[W]e cannot say that the decimal fractions developed in accordance with a law still need supplementing by an infinite set of irregular infinite decimal fractions that would be ‘brushed under the carpet’ if we were to restrict ourselves to those generated by a law,

Wittgenstein argues, for “[w]here is there such an infinite decimal that is generated by no law” “[a]nd how would we notice that it was missing?” (PR §181; cf. PG 473, 483–84). Similarly, a free-choice sequence, like a recipe for “endless bisection” or “endless dicing”, is not an infinitely complicated mathematical law (or rule), but rather no law at all, for after each individual throw of a coin, the point remains “infinitely indeterminate” (PR §186). For closely related reasons, Wittgenstein ridicules the Multiplicative Axiom (Axiom of Choice) both in the middle period (PR §146) and in the latter period (RFM V, §25; VII, §33).

2.5.2 Wittgenstein’s Real Number Essentialism and the Dangers of Set Theory

Superficially, at least, it seems as if Wittgenstein is offering an essentialist argument for the conclusion that real number arithmetic should not be extended in such-and-such a way. Such an essentialist account of real and irrational numbers seems to conflict with the actual freedom mathematicians have to extend and invent, with Wittgenstein’s intermediate claim (PG 334) that “[f]or [him] one calculus is as good as another”, and with Wittgenstein’s acceptance of complex and imaginary numbers. Wittgenstein’s foundationalist critic (e.g., set theorist) will undoubtedly say that we have extended the term “irrational number” to lawless and pseudo-irrationals because they are needed for the mathematical continuum and because such “conceivable numbers” are much more like rule-governed irrationals than rationals.

Though Wittgenstein stresses differences where others see similarities (LFM 15), in his intermediate attacks on pseudo-irrationals and foundationalism, he is not just emphasizing differences, he is attacking set theory’s “pernicious idioms” (PR §173) and its “crudest imaginable misinterpretation of its own calculus” (PG 469–70) in an attempt to dissolve “misunderstandings without which [set theory] would never have been invented”, since it is “of no other use” (LFM 16–17). Complex and imaginary numbers have grown organically within mathematics, and they have proved their mettle in scientific applications, but pseudo-irrationals are inorganic creations invented solely for the sake of mistaken foundationalist aims. Wittgenstein’s main point is not that we cannot create further recursive real numbers—indeed, we can create as many as we want—his point is that we can only really speak of different systems (sets) of real numbers (RFM II, §33) that are enumerable by a rule, and any attempt to speak of “the set of all real numbers” or any piecemeal attempt to add or consider new recursive reals (e.g., diagonal numbers) is a useless and/or futile endeavour based on foundational misconceptions. Indeed, in 1930 manuscript and typescript (hereafter MS and TS, respectively) passages on irrationals and Cantor’s diagonal, which were not included in PR or PG, Wittgenstein says: “The concept ‘irrational number’ is a dangerous pseudo-concept” (MS 108, 176; 1930; TS 210, 29; 1930). As we shall see in the next section, on Wittgenstein’s account, if we do not understand irrationals rightly, we cannot but engender the mistakes that constitute set theory.

2.6 Wittgenstein’s Intermediate Critique of Set Theory

Wittgenstein’s critique of set theory begins somewhat benignly in the Tractatus, where he denounces Logicism and says (6.031) that “[t]he theory of classes is completely superfluous in mathematics” because, at least in part, “the generality required in mathematics is not accidental generality”. In his middle period, Wittgenstein begins a full-out assault on set theory that never abates. Set theory, he says, is “utter nonsense” (PR §§145, 174; WVC 102; PG 464, 470), ‘wrong’ (PR §174), and ‘laughable’ (PG 464); its “pernicious idioms” (PR §173) mislead us and the crudest possible misinterpretation is the very impetus of its invention (Hintikka 1993: 24, 27).

Wittgenstein’s intermediate critique of transfinite set theory (hereafter “set theory”) has two main components: (1) his discussion of the intension-extension distinction, and (2) his criticism of non-denumerability as cardinality. Late in the middle period, Wittgenstein seems to become more aware of the unbearable conflict between his strong formalism (PG 334) and his denigration of set theory as a purely formal, non-mathematical calculus (Rodych 1997: 217–219), which, as we shall see in Section 3.5, leads to the use of an extra-mathematical application criterion to demarcate transfinite set theory (and other purely formal sign-games) from mathematical calculi.

2.6.1 Intensions, Extensions, and the Fictitious Symbolism of Set Theory

The search for a comprehensive theory of the real numbers and mathematical continuity has led to a “fictitious symbolism” (PR §174).

Set theory attempts to grasp the infinite at a more general level than the investigation of the laws of the real numbers. It says that you can’t grasp the actual infinite by means of mathematical symbolism at all and therefore it can only be described and not represented. … One might say of this theory that it buys a pig in a poke. Let the infinite accommodate itself in this box as best it can. (PG 468; cf. PR §170)

As Wittgenstein puts it at (PG 461),

the mistake in the set-theoretical approach consists time and again in treating laws and enumerations (lists) as essentially the same kind of thing and arranging them in parallel series so that one fills in gaps left by the other.

This is a mistake because it is ‘nonsense’ to say “we cannot enumerate all the numbers of a set, but we can give a description”, for “[t]he one is not a substitute for the other” (WVC 102; June 19, 1930); “there isn’t a dualism [of] the law and the infinite series obeying it” (PR §180).

“Set theory is wrong” and nonsensical (PR §174), says Wittgenstein, because it presupposes a fictitious symbolism of infinite signs (PG 469) instead of an actual symbolism with finite signs. The grand intimation of set theory, which begins with “Dirichlet’s concept of a function” (WVC 102–03), is that we can in principle represent an infinite set by an enumeration, but because of human or physical limitations, we will instead describe it intensionally. But, says Wittgenstein, “[t]here can’t be possibility and actuality in mathematics”, for mathematics is an actual calculus, which “is concerned only with the signs with which it actually operates” (PG 469). As Wittgenstein puts it at (PR §159), the fact that “we can’t describe mathematics, we can only do it” in and “of itself abolishes every ‘set theory’”.

Perhaps the best example of this phenomenon is Dedekind, who in giving his ‘definition’ of an “infinite class” as “a class which is similar to a proper subclass of itself” (PG 464), “tried to describe an infinite class” (PG 463). If, however, we try to apply this ‘definition’ to a particular class in order to ascertain whether it is finite or infinite, the attempt is ‘laughable’ if we apply it to a finite class, such as “a certain row of trees”, and it is ‘nonsense’ if we apply it to “an infinite class”, for we cannot even attempt “to co-ordinate it” (PG 464), because “the relation \(m = 2n\) [does not] correlate the class of all numbers with one of its subclasses” (PR §141), it is an “infinite process” which “correlates any arbitrary number with another”. So, although we can use \(m = 2n\) on the rule for generating the naturals (i.e., our domain) and thereby construct the pairs (2,1), (4,2), (6,3), (8,4), etc., in doing so we do not correlate two infinite sets or extensions (WVC 103). If we try to apply Dedekind’s definition as a criterion for determining whether a given set is infinite by establishing a 1–1 correspondence between two inductive rules for generating “infinite extensions”, one of which is an “extensional subset” of the other, we can’t possibly learn anything we didn’t already know when we applied the ‘criterion’ to two inductive rules. If Dedekind or anyone else insists on calling an inductive rule an “infinite set”, he and we must still mark the categorical difference between such a set and a finite set with a determinate, finite cardinality.

Indeed, on Wittgenstein’s account, the failure to properly distinguish mathematical extensions and intensions is the root cause of the mistaken interpretation of Cantor’s diagonal proof as a proof of the existence of infinite sets of lesser and greater cardinality.

2.6.2 Against Non-Denumerability

Wittgenstein’s criticism of non-denumerability is primarily implicit during the middle period. Only after 1937 does he provide concrete arguments purporting to show, e.g., that Cantor’s diagonal cannot prove that some infinite sets have greater ‘multiplicity’ than others.

Nonetheless, the intermediate Wittgenstein clearly rejects the notion that a non-denumerably infinite set is greater in cardinality than a denumerably infinite set.

When people say ‘The set of all transcendental numbers is greater than that of algebraic numbers’, that’s nonsense. The set is of a different kind. It isn’t ‘no longer’ denumerable, it’s simply not denumerable! (PR §174)

As with his intermediate views on genuine irrationals and the Multiplicative Axiom, Wittgenstein here looks at the diagonal proof of the non-denumerability of “the set of transcendental numbers” as one that shows only that transcendental numbers cannot be recursively enumerated. It is nonsense, he says, to go from the warranted conclusion that these numbers are not, in principle, enumerable to the conclusion that the set of transcendental numbers is greater in cardinality than the set of algebraic numbers, which is recursively enumerable. What we have here are two very different conceptions of a number-type. In the case of algebraic numbers, we have a decision procedure for determining of any given number whether or not it is algebraic, and we have a method of enumerating the algebraic numbers such that we can see that ‘each’ algebraic number “will be” enumerated. In the case of transcendental numbers, on the other hand, we have proofs that some numbers are transcendental (i.e., non-algebraic), and we have a proof that we cannot recursively enumerate each and every thing we would call a “transcendental number”.

At (PG 461), Wittgenstein similarly speaks of set theory’s “mathematical pseudo-concepts” leading to a fundamental difficulty, which begins when we unconsciously presuppose that there is sense to the idea of ordering the rationals by size—“that the attempt is thinkable”—and culminates in similarly thinking that it is possible to enumerate the real numbers, which we then discover is impossible.

Though the intermediate Wittgenstein certainly seems highly critical of the alleged proof that some infinite sets (e.g., the reals) are greater in cardinality than other infinite sets, and though he discusses the “diagonal procedure” in February 1929 and in June 1930 (MS 106, 266; MS 108, 180), along with a diagonal diagram, these and other early-middle ruminations did not make it into the typescripts for either PR or PG. As we shall see in Section 3.4, the later Wittgenstein analyzes Cantor’s diagonal and claims of non-denumerability in some detail.

3. The Later Wittgenstein on Mathematics: Some Preliminaries

The first and most important thing to note about Wittgenstein’s later Philosophy of Mathematics is that RFM, first published in 1956, consists of selections taken from a number of manuscripts (1937–1944), most of one large typescript (1938), and three short typescripts (1938), each of which constitutes an Appendix to (RFM I). For this reason and because some manuscripts containing much material on mathematics (e.g., MS 123) were not used at all for RFM, philosophers have not been able to read Wittgenstein’s later remarks on mathematics as they were written in the manscripts used for RFM and they have not had access (until the 2000–2001 release of the Nachlass on CD-ROM) to much of Wittgenstein’s later work on mathematics. It must be emphasized, therefore, that this Encyclopedia article is being written during a transitional period. Until philosophers have used the Nachlass to build a comprehensive picture of Wittgenstein’s complete and evolving Philosophy of Mathematics, we will not be able to say definitively which views the later Wittgenstein retained, which he changed, and which he dropped. In the interim, this article will outline Wittgenstein’s later Philosophy of Mathematics, drawing primarily on RFM, to a much lesser extent LFM (1939 Cambridge lectures), and, where possible, previously unpublished material in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass.

It should also be noted at the outset that commentators disagree about the continuity of Wittgenstein’s middle and later Philosophies of Mathematics. Some argue that the later views are significantly different from the intermediate views (Frascolla 1994; Gerrard 1991: 127, 131–32; Floyd 2005: 105–106), while others argue that, for the most part, Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics evolves from the middle to the later period without significant changes or renunciations (Wrigley 1993; Marion 1998). The remainder of this article adopts the second interpretation, explicating Wittgenstein’s later Philosophy of Mathematics as largely continuous with his intermediate views, except for the important introduction of an extra-mathematical application criterion.

3.1 Mathematics as a Human Invention

Perhaps the most important constant in Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics, middle and late, is that he consistently maintains that mathematics is our, human invention, and that, indeed, everything in mathematics is invented. Just as the middle Wittgenstein says that “[w]e make mathematics”, the later Wittgenstein says that we ‘invent’ mathematics (RFM I, §168; II, §38; V, §§5, 9 and 11; PG 469–70) and that “the mathematician is not a discoverer: he is an inventor” (RFM, Appendix II, §2; (LFM 22, 82). Nothing exists mathematically unless and until we have invented it.

In arguing against mathematical discovery, Wittgenstein is not just rejecting Platonism, he is also rejecting a rather standard philosophical view according to which human beings invent mathematical calculi, but once a calculus has been invented, we thereafter discover finitely many of its infinitely many provable and true theorems. As Wittgenstein himself asks (RFM IV, §48), “might it not be said that the rules lead this way, even if no one went it?” If “someone produced a proof [of ‘Goldbach’s theorem’]”, “[c]ouldn’t one say”, Wittgenstein asks (LFM 144), “that the possibility of this proof was a fact in the realms of mathematical reality”—that “[i]n order [to] find it, it must in some sense be there”—“[i]t must be a possible structure”?

Unlike many or most philosophers of mathematics, Wittgenstein resists the ‘Yes’ answer that we discover truths about a mathematical calculus that come into existence the moment we invent the calculus (PR §141; PG 283, 466; LFM 139). Wittgenstein rejects the modal reification of possibility as actuality—that provability and constructibility are (actual) facts—by arguing that it is at the very least wrong-headed to say with the Platonist that because “a straight line can be drawn between any two points,… the line already exists even if no one has drawn it”—to say “[w]hat in the ordinary world we call a possibility is in the geometrical world a reality” (LFM 144; RFM I, §21). One might as well say, Wittgenstein suggests (PG 374), that “chess only had to be discovered, it was always there!”

At MS 122 (3v; Oct. 18, 1939), Wittgenstein once again emphasizes the difference between illusory mathematical discovery and genuine mathematical invention.

I want to get away from the formulation: “I now know more about the calculus”, and replace it with “I now have a different calculus”. The sense of this is always to keep before one’s eyes the full scale of the gulf between a mathematical knowing and non-mathematical knowing.[3]

And as with the middle period, the later Wittgenstein similarly says (MS 121, 27r; May 27, 1938) that “[i]t helps if one says: the proof of the Fermat proposition is not to be discovered, but to be invented”.

The difference between the ‘anthropological’ and the mathematical account is that in the first we are not tempted to speak of ‘mathematical facts’, but rather that in this account the facts are never mathematical ones, never make mathematical propositions true or false. (MS 117, 263; March 15, 1940)

There are no mathematical facts just as there are no (genuine) mathematical propositions. Repeating his intermediate view, the later Wittgenstein says (MS 121, 71v; 27 Dec., 1938): “Mathematics consists of [calculi | calculations], not of propositions”. This radical constructivist conception of mathematics prompts Wittgenstein to make notorious remarks—remarks that virtually no one else would make—such as the infamous (RFM V, §9): “However queer it sounds, the further expansion of an irrational number is a further expansion of mathematics”.

3.1.1 Wittgenstein’s Later Anti-Platonism: The Natural History of Numbers and the Vacuity of Platonism

As in the middle period, the later Wittgenstein maintains that mathematics is essentially syntactical and non-referential, which, in and of itself, makes Wittgenstein’s philosophy of mathematics anti-Platonist insofar as Platonism is the view that mathematical terms and propositions refer to objects and/or facts and that mathematical propositions are true by virtue of agreeing with mathematical facts.

The later Wittgenstein, however, wishes to ‘warn’ us that our thinking is saturated with the idea of “[a]rithmetic as the natural history (mineralogy) of numbers” (RFM IV, §11). When, for instance, Wittgenstein discusses the claim that fractions cannot be ordered by magnitude, he says that this sounds ‘remarkable’ in a way that a mundane proposition of the differential calculus does not, for the latter proposition is associated with an application in physics,

whereas this proposition … seems to [solely] concern… the natural history of mathematical objects themselves. (RFM II, §40)

Wittgenstein stresses that he is trying to ‘warn’ us against this ‘aspect’—the idea that the foregoing proposition about fractions “introduces us to the mysteries of the mathematical world”, which exists somewhere as a completed totality, awaiting our prodding and our discoveries. The fact that we regard mathematical propositions as being about mathematical objects and mathematical investigation “as the exploration of these objects” is “already mathematical alchemy”, claims Wittgenstein (RFM V, §16), since

it is not possible to appeal to the meaning [Bedeutung] of the signs in mathematics,… because it is only mathematics that gives them their meaning [Bedeutung].

Platonism is dangerously misleading, according to Wittgenstein, because it suggests a picture of pre-existence, predetermination and discovery that is completely at odds with what we find if we actually examine and describe mathematics and mathematical activity. “I should like to be able to describe”, says Wittgenstein (RFM IV, §13), “how it comes about that mathematics appears to us now as the natural history of the domain of numbers, now again as a collection of rules”.

Wittgenstein, however, does not endeavour to refute Platonism. His aim, instead, is to clarify what Platonism is and what it says, implicitly and explicitly (including variants of Platonism that claim, e.g., that if a proposition is provable in an axiom system, then there already exists a path [i.e., a proof] from the axioms to that proposition (RFM I, §21; Marion 1998: 13–14, 226; Steiner 2000: 334). Platonism is either “a mere truism” (LFM 239), Wittgenstein says, or it is a ‘picture’ consisting of “an infinity of shadowy worlds” (LFM 145), which, as such, lacks ‘utility’ (cf. PI §254) because it explains nothing and it misleads at every turn.

3.2 Wittgenstein’s Later Finitistic Constructivism

Though commentators and critics do not agree as to whether the later Wittgenstein is still a finitist and whether, if he is, his finitism is as radical as his intermediate rejection of unbounded mathematical quantification (Maddy 1986: 300–301, 310), the overwhelming evidence indicates that the later Wittgenstein still rejects the actual infinite (RFM V, §21; Zettel §274, 1947) and infinite mathematical extensions.

The first, and perhaps most definitive, indication that the later Wittgenstein maintains his finitism is his continued and consistent insistence that irrational numbers are rules for constructing finite expansions, not infinite mathematical extensions. “The concepts of infinite decimals in mathematical propositions are not concepts of series”, says Wittgenstein (RFM V, §19), “but of the unlimited technique of expansion of series”. We are misled by “[t]he extensional definitions of functions, of real numbers etc”. (RFM V, §35), but once we recognize the Dedekind cut as “an extensional image”, we see that we are not “led to \(\sqrt{2}\) by way of the concept of a cut” (RFM V, §34). On the later Wittgenstein’s account, there simply is no property, no rule, no systematic means of defining each and every irrational number intensionally, which means there is no criterion “for the irrational numbers being complete” (PR §181).

As in his intermediate position, the later Wittgenstein claims that ‘\(\aleph_0\)’ and “infinite series” get their mathematical uses from the use of ‘infinity’ in ordinary language (RFM II, §60). Although, in ordinary language, we often use ‘infinite’ and “infinitely many” as answers to the question “how many?”, and though we associate infinity with the enormously large, the principal use we make of ‘infinite’ and ‘infinity’ is to speak of the unlimited (RFM V, §14) and unlimited techniques (RFM II, §45; PI §218). This fact is brought out by the fact “that the technique of learning \(\aleph_0\) numerals is different from the technique of learning 100,000 numerals” (LFM 31). When we say, e.g., that “there are an infinite number of even numbers” we mean that we have a mathematical technique or rule for generating even numbers which is limitless, which is markedly different from a limited technique or rule for generating a finite number of numbers, such as 1–100,000,000. “We learn an endless technique”, says Wittgenstein (RFM V, §19), “but what is in question here is not some gigantic extension”.

An infinite sequence, for example, is not a gigantic extension because it is not an extension, and ‘\(\aleph_0\)’ is not a cardinal number, for “how is this picture connected with the calculus”, given that “its connexion is not that of the picture | | | | with 4” (i.e., given that ‘\(\aleph_0\)’ is not connected to a (finite) extension)? This shows, says Wittgenstein (RFM II, §58), that we ought to avoid the word ‘infinite’ in mathematics wherever it seems to give a meaning to the calculus, rather than acquiring its meaning from the calculus and its use in the calculus. Once we see that the calculus contains nothing infinite, we should not be ‘disappointed’ (RFM II, §60), but simply note (RFM II, §59) that it is not “really necessary… to conjure up the picture of the infinite (of the enormously big)”.

A second strong indication that the later Wittgenstein maintains his finitism is his continued and consistent treatment of ‘propositions’ of the type “There are three consecutive 7s in the decimal expansion of \(\pi\)” (hereafter ‘PIC’).[4] In the middle period, PIC (and its putative negation, \(\neg\)PIC, namely, “It is not the case that there are three consecutive 7s in the decimal expansion of \(\pi\)”) is not a meaningful mathematical “statement at all” (WVC 81–82: note 1). On Wittgenstein’s intermediate view, PIC—like FLT, GC, and the Fundamental Theorem of Algebra—is not a mathematical proposition because we do not have in hand an applicable decision procedure by which we can decide it in a particular calculus. For this reason, we can only meaningfully state finitistic propositions regarding the expansion of \(\pi\), such as “There exist three consecutive 7s in the first 10,000 places of the expansion of \(\pi\)” (WVC 71; 81–82, note 1).

The later Wittgenstein maintains this position in various passages in RFM (Bernays 1959: 11–12). For example, to someone who says that since “the rule of expansion determine[\(s\)] the series completely”, “it must implicitly determine all questions about the structure of the series”, Wittgenstein replies: “Here you are thinking of finite series” (RFM V, §11). If PIC were a mathematical question (or problem)—if it were finitistically restricted—it would be algorithmically decidable, which it is not (RFM V, §21; LFM 31–32, 111, 170; WVC 102–03). As Wittgenstein says at (RFM V, §9): “The question… changes its status, when it becomes decidable”, “[f]or a connexion is made then, which formerly was not there”. And if, moreover, one invokes the Law of the Excluded Middle to establish that PIC is a mathematical proposition—i.e., by saying that one of these “two pictures… must correspond to the fact” (RFM V, §10)—one simply begs the question (RFM V, §12), for if we have doubts about the mathematical status of PIC, we will not be swayed by a person who asserts “PIC \(\vee \neg\)PIC” (RFM VII, §41; V, §13).

Wittgenstein’s finitism, constructivism, and conception of mathematical decidability are interestingly connected at (RFM VII, §41, par. 2–5).

What harm is done e.g. by saying that God knows all irrational numbers? Or: that they are already there, even though we only know certain of them? Why are these pictures not harmless?

For one thing, they hide certain problems.— (MS 124: 139; March 16, 1944)

Suppose that people go on and on calculating the expansion of \(\pi\). So God, who knows everything, knows whether they will have reached ‘777’ by the end of the world. But can his omniscience decide whether they would have reached it after the end of the world? It cannot. I want to say: Even God can determine something mathematical only by mathematics. Even for him the mere rule of expansion cannot decide anything that it does not decide for us.

We might put it like this: if the rule for the expansion has been given us, a calculation can tell us that there is a ‘2’ at the fifth place. Could God have known this, without the calculation, purely from the rule of expansion? I want to say: No. (MS 124, pp. 175–176; March 23–24, 1944)

What Wittgenstein means here is that God’s omniscience might, by calculation, find that ‘777’ occurs at the interval [\(n,n+2\)], but, on the other hand, God might go on calculating forever without ‘777’ ever turning up. Since \(\pi\) is not a completed infinite extension that can be completely surveyed by an omniscient being (i.e., it is not a fact that can be known by an omniscient mind), even God has only the rule, and so God’s omniscience is no advantage in this case (LFM 103–04; cf. Weyl 1921 [1998: 97]). Like us, with our modest minds, an omniscient mind (i.e., God) can only calculate the expansion of \(\pi\) to some \(n\)th decimal place—where our \(n\) is minute and God’s \(n\) is (relatively) enormous—and at no \(n\)th decimal place could any mind rightly conclude that because ‘777’ has not turned up, it, therefore, will never turn up.

3.3 The Later Wittgenstein on Decidability and Algorithmic Decidability

On one fairly standard interpretation, the later Wittgenstein says that “true in calculus \(\Gamma\)” is identical to “provable in calculus \(\Gamma\)” and, therefore, that a mathematical proposition of calculus \(\Gamma\) is a concatenation of signs that is either provable (in principle) or refutable (in principle) in calculus \(\Gamma\) (Goodstein 1972: 279, 282; Anderson 1958: 487; Klenk 1976: 13; Frascolla 1994: 59). On this interpretation, the later Wittgenstein precludes undecidable mathematical propositions, but he allows that some undecided expressions are propositions of a calculus because they are decidable in principle (i.e., in the absence of a known, applicable decision procedure).

There is considerable evidence, however, that the later Wittgenstein maintains his intermediate position that an expression is a meaningful mathematical proposition only within a given calculus and iff we knowingly have in hand an applicable and effective decision procedure by means of which we can decide it. For example, though Wittgenstein vacillates between “provable in PM” and “proved in PM” at (RFM App. III, §6, §8), he does so in order to use the former to consider the alleged conclusion of Gödel’s proof (i.e., that there exist true but unprovable mathematical propositions), which he then rebuts with his own identification of “true in calculus \(\Gamma\)” with “proved in calculus \(\Gamma\)” (i.e., not with “provable in calculus \(\Gamma\)”) (Wang 1991: 253; Rodych 1999a: 177). This construal is corroborated by numerous passages in which Wittgenstein rejects the received view that a provable but unproved proposition is true, as he does when he asserts that (RFM III, §31, 1939) a proof “makes new connexions”, “[i]t does not establish that they are there” because “they do not exist until it makes them”, and when he says (RFM VII, §10, 1941) that “[a] new proof gives the proposition a place in a new system”. Furthermore, as we have just seen, Wittgenstein rejects PIC as a non-proposition on the grounds that it is not algorithmically decidable, while admitting finitistic versions of PIC because they are algorithmically decidable.

Perhaps the most compelling evidence that the later Wittgenstein maintains algorithmic decidability as his criterion for a mathematical proposition lies in the fact that, at (RFM V, §9, 1942), he says in two distinct ways that a mathematical ‘question’ can become decidable and that when this happens, a new connexion is ‘made’ which previously did not exist. Indeed, Wittgenstein cautions us against appearances by saying that “it looks as if a ground for the decision were already there”, when, in fact, “it has yet to be invented”. These passages strongly militate against the claim that the later Wittgenstein grants that proposition \(\phi\) is decidable in calculus \(\Gamma\) iff it is provable or refutable in principle. Moreover, if Wittgenstein held this position, he would claim, contra (RFM V, §9), that a question or proposition does not become decidable since it simply (always) is decidable. If it is provable, and we simply don’t yet know this to be the case, there already is a connection between, say, our axioms and rules and the proposition in question. What Wittgenstein says, however, is that the modalities provable and refutable are shadowy forms of reality—that possibility is not actuality in mathematics (PR §§141, 144, 172; PG 281, 283, 299, 371, 466, 469; LFM 139). Thus, the later Wittgenstein agrees with the intermediate Wittgenstein that the only sense in which an undecided mathematical proposition (RFM VII, §40, 1944) can be decidable is in the sense that we know how to decide it by means of an applicable decision procedure.

3.4 Wittgenstein’s Later Critique of Set Theory: Non-Enumerability vs. Non-Denumerability

Largely a product of his anti-foundationalism and his criticism of the extension-intension conflation, Wittgenstein’s later critique of set theory is highly consonant with his intermediate critique (PR §§109, 168; PG 334, 369, 469; LFM 172, 224, 229; and RFM III, §43, 46, 85, 90; VII, §16). Given that mathematics is a “MOTLEY of techniques of proof” (RFM III, §46), it does not require a foundation (RFM VII, §16) and it cannot be given a self-evident foundation (PR §160; WVC 34 & 62; RFM IV, §3). Since set theory was invented to provide mathematics with a foundation, it is, minimally, unnecessary.

Even if set theory is unnecessary, it still might constitute a solid foundation for mathematics. In his core criticism of set theory, however, the later Wittgenstein denies this, saying that the diagonal proof does not prove non-denumerability, for “[i]t means nothing to say: ‘Therefore the X numbers are not denumerable’” (RFM II, §10). When the diagonal is construed as a proof of greater and lesser infinite sets it is a “puffed-up proof”, which, as Poincaré argued (1913: 61–62), purports to prove or show more than “its means allow it” (RFM II, §21).

If it were said: Consideration of the diagonal procedure shews you that the concept ‘real number’ has much less analogy with the concept ‘cardinal number’ than we, being misled by certain analogies, are inclined to believe, that would have a good and honest sense. But just the opposite happens: one pretends to compare the ‘set’ of real numbers in magnitude with that of cardinal numbers. The difference in kind between the two conceptions is represented, by a skew form of expression, as difference of extension. I believe, and hope, that a future generation will laugh at this hocus pocus. (RFM II, §22)

The sickness of a time is cured by an alteration in the mode of life of human beings… (RFM II, §23)

The “hocus pocus” of the diagonal proof rests, as always for Wittgenstein, on a conflation of extension and intension, on the failure to properly distinguish sets as rules for generating extensions and (finite) extensions. By way of this confusion “a difference in kind” (i.e., unlimited rule vs. finite extension) “is represented by a skew form of expression”, namely as a difference in the cardinality of two infinite extensions. Not only can the diagonal not prove that one infinite set is greater in cardinality than another infinite set, according to Wittgenstein, nothing could prove this, simply because “infinite sets” are not extensions, and hence not infinite extensions. But instead of interpreting Cantor’s diagonal proof honestly, we take the proof to “show there are numbers bigger than the infinite”, which “sets the whole mind in a whirl, and gives the pleasant feeling of paradox” (LFM 16–17)—a “giddiness attacks us when we think of certain theorems in set theory”—“when we are performing a piece of logical sleight-of-hand” (PI §412; §426; 1945). This giddiness and pleasant feeling of paradox, says Wittgenstein (LFM 16), “may be the chief reason [set theory] was invented”.

Though Cantor’s diagonal is not a proof of non-denumerability, when it is expressed in a constructive manner, as Wittgenstein himself expresses it at (RFM II, §1), “it gives sense to the mathematical proposition that the number so-and-so is different from all those of the system” (RFM II, §29). That is, the proof proves non-enumerability: it proves that for any given definite real number concept (e.g., recursive real), one cannot enumerate ‘all’ such numbers because one can always construct a diagonal number, which falls under the same concept and is not in the enumeration. “One might say”, Wittgenstein says,

I call number-concept X non-denumerable if it has been stipulated that, whatever numbers falling under this concept you arrange in a series, the diagonal number of this series is also to fall under that concept. (RFM II, §10; cf. II, §§30, 31, 13)

One lesson to be learned from this, according to Wittgenstein (RFM II, §33), is that “there are diverse systems of irrational points to be found in the number line”, each of which can be given by a recursive rule, but “no system of irrational numbers”, and “also no super-system, no ‘set of irrational numbers’ of higher-order infinity”. Cantor has shown that we can construct “infinitely many” diverse systems of irrational numbers, but we cannot construct an exhaustive system of all the irrational numbers (RFM II, §29). As Wittgenstein says at (MS 121, 71r; Dec. 27, 1938), three pages after the passage used for (RFM II, §57):

If you now call the Cantorian procedure one for producing a new real number, you will now no longer be inclined to speak of a system of all real numbers. (italics added)

From Cantor’s proof, however, set theorists erroneously conclude that “the set of irrational numbers” is greater in multiplicity than any enumeration of irrationals (or the set of rationals), when the only conclusion to draw is that there is no such thing as the set of all the irrational numbers. The truly dangerous aspect to ‘propositions’ such as “The real numbers cannot be arranged in a series” and “The set… is not denumerable” is that they make concept formation [i.e., our invention] “look like a fact of nature” (i.e., something we discover) (RFM II §§16, 37). At best, we have a vague idea of the concept of “real number”, but only if we restrict this idea to “recursive real number” and only if we recognize that having the concept does not mean having a set of all recursive real numbers.

3.5 Extra-Mathematical Application as a Necessary Condition of Mathematical Meaningfulness

The principal and most significant change from the middle to later writings on mathematics is Wittgenstein’s (re-)introduction of an extra-mathematical application criterion, which is used to distinguish mere “sign-games” from mathematical language-games. “[I]t is essential to mathematics that its signs are also employed in mufti”, Wittgenstein states, for

[i]t is the use outside mathematics, and so the meaning [Bedeutung] of the signs, that makes the sign-game into mathematics. (i.e., a mathematical “language-game”; RFM V, §2, 1942; LFM 140–141, 169–70)

As Wittgenstein says at (RFM V, §41, 1943),

[c]oncepts which occur in ‘necessary’ propositions must also occur and have a meaning [Bedeutung] in non-necessary ones. (italics added)

If two proofs prove the same proposition, says Wittgenstein, this means that “both demonstrate it as a suitable instrument for the same purpose”, which “is an allusion to something outside mathematics” (RFM VII, §10, 1941; italics added).

As we have seen, this criterion was present in the Tractatus (6.211), but noticeably absent in the middle period. The reason for this absence is probably that the intermediate Wittgenstein wanted to stress that in mathematics everything is syntax and nothing is meaning. Hence, in his criticisms of Hilbert’s ‘contentual’ mathematics (Hilbert 1925) and Brouwer’s reliance upon intuition to determine the meaningful content of (especially undecidable) mathematical propositions, Wittgenstein couched his finitistic constructivism in strong formalism, emphasizing that a mathematical calculus does not need an extra-mathematical application (PR §109; WVC 105).

There seem to be two reasons why the later Wittgenstein reintroduces extra-mathematical application as a necessary condition of a mathematical language-game. First, the later Wittgenstein has an even greater interest in the use of natural and formal languages in diverse “forms of life” (PI §23), which prompts him to emphasize that, in many cases, a mathematical ‘proposition’ functions as if it were an empirical proposition “hardened into a rule” (RFM VI, §23) and that mathematics plays diverse applied roles in many forms of human activity (e.g., science, technology, predictions). Second, the extra-mathematical application criterion relieves the tension between Wittgenstein’s intermediate critique of set theory and his strong formalism according to which “one calculus is as good as another” (PG 334). By demarcating mathematical language-games from non-mathematical sign-games, Wittgenstein can now claim that, “for the time being”, set theory is merely a formal sign-game.

These considerations may lead us to say that \(2^{\aleph_0} \gt \aleph_0\).

That is to say: we can make the considerations lead us to that.

Or: we can say this and give this as our reason.

But if we do say it—what are we to do next? In what practice is this proposition anchored? It is for the time being a piece of mathematical architecture which hangs in the air, and looks as if it were, let us say, an architrave, but not supported by anything and supporting nothing. (RFM II, §35)

It is not that Wittgenstein’s later criticisms of set theory change, it is, rather, that once we see that set theory has no extra-mathematical application, we will focus on its calculations, proofs, and prose and “subject the interest of the calculations to a test” (RFM II, §62). By means of Wittgenstein’s “immensely important” ‘investigation’ (LFM 103), we will find, Wittgenstein expects, that set theory is uninteresting (e.g., that the non-enumerability of “the reals” is uninteresting and useless) and that our entire interest in it lies in the ‘charm’ of the mistaken prose interpretation of its proofs (LFM 16). More importantly, though there is “a solid core to all [its] glistening concept-formations” (RFM V, §16), once we see it as “as a mistake of ideas”, we will see that propositions such as “\(2^{\aleph_0} \gt \aleph_0\)” are not anchored in an extra-mathematical practice, that “Cantor’s paradise” “is not a paradise”, and we will then leave “of [our] own accord” (LFM 103).

It must be emphasized, however, that the later Wittgenstein still maintains that the operations within a mathematical calculus are purely formal, syntactical operations governed by rules of syntax (i.e., the solid core of formalism).

It is of course clear that the mathematician, in so far as he really is ‘playing a game’…[is] acting in accordance with certain rules. (RFM V, §1)

To say mathematics is a game is supposed to mean: in proving, we need never appeal to the meaning [Bedeutung] of the signs, that is to their extra-mathematical application. (RFM V, §4)

Where, during the middle period, Wittgenstein speaks of “arithmetic [as] a kind of geometry” at (PR §109 & §111), the later Wittgenstein similarly speaks of “the geometry of proofs” (RFM I, App. III, §14), the “geometrical cogency” of proofs (RFM III, §43), and a “geometrical application” according to which the “transformation of signs” in accordance with “transformation-rules” (RFM VI, §2, 1941) shows that “when mathematics is divested of all content, it would remain that certain signs can be constructed from others according to certain rules” (RFM III, §38). Hence, the question whether a concatenation of signs is a proposition of a given mathematical calculus (i.e., a calculus with an extra-mathematical application) is still an internal, syntactical question, which we can answer with knowledge of the proofs and decision procedures of the calculus.

3.6 Wittgenstein on Gödel and Undecidable Mathematical Propositions

RFM is perhaps most (in)famous for Wittgenstein’s (RFM App. III) treatment of “true but unprovable” mathematical propositions. Early reviewers said that “[t]he arguments are wild” (Kreisel 1958: 153), that the passages “on Gödel’s theorem… are of poor quality or contain definite errors” (Dummett 1959: 324), and that (RFM App. III) “throws no light on Gödel’s work” (Goodstein 1957: 551). “Wittgenstein seems to want to legislate [[q]uestions about completeness] out of existence”, Anderson said, (1958: 486–87) when, in fact, he certainly cannot dispose of Gödel’s demonstrations “by confusing truth with provability”. Additionally, Bernays, Anderson (1958: 486), and Kreisel (1958: 153–54) claimed that Wittgenstein failed to appreciate “Gödel’s quite explicit premiss of the consistency of the considered formal system” (Bernays 1959: 15), thereby failing to appreciate the conditional nature of Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem. On the reading of these four early expert reviewers, Wittgenstein failed to understand Gödel’s Theorem because he failed to understand the mechanics of Gödel’s proof and he erroneously thought he could refute or undermine Gödel’s proof simply by identifying “true in PM” (i.e., Principia Mathematica) with “proved/provable in PM”.

Interestingly, we now have two pieces of evidence (Kreisel 1998: 119; Rodych 2003: 282, 307) that Wittgenstein wrote (RFM App. III) in 1937–38 after reading only the informal, ‘casual’ (MS 126, 126–127; Dec. 13, 1942) introduction of (Gödel 1931) and that, therefore, his use of a self-referential proposition as the “true but unprovable proposition” may be based on Gödel’s introductory, informal statements, namely that “the undecidable proposition [\(R(q);q\)] states… that [\(R(q);q\)] is not provable” (1931: 598) and that “[\(R(q);q\)] says about itself that it is not provable” (1931: 599). Perplexingly, only two of the four famous reviewers even mentioned Wittgenstein’s (RFM VII, §§19, 21–22, 1941)) explicit remarks on ‘Gödel’s’ First Incompleteness Theorem (Bernays 1959: 2; Anderson 1958: 487), which, though flawed, capture the number-theoretic nature of the Gödelian proposition and the functioning of Gödel-numbering, probably because Wittgenstein had by then read or skimmed the body of Gödel’s 1931 paper.

The first thing to note, therefore, about (RFM App. III) is that Wittgenstein mistakenly thinks—again, perhaps because Wittgenstein had read only Gödel’s Introduction—(a) that Gödel proves that there are true but unprovable propositions of PM (when, in fact, Gödel syntactically proves that if PM is \(\omega\)-consistent, the Gödelian proposition is undecidable in PM) and (b) that Gödel’s proof uses a self-referential proposition to semantically show that there are true but unprovable propositions of PM.

For this reason, Wittgenstein has two main aims in (RFM App. III): (1) to refute or undermine, on its own terms, the alleged Gödel proof of true but unprovable propositions of PM, and (2) to show that, on his own terms, where “true in calculus \(\Gamma\)” is identified with “proved in calculus \(\Gamma\)”, the very idea of a true but unprovable proposition of calculus \(\Gamma\) is meaningless.

Thus, at (RFM App. III, §8) (hereafter simply ‘§8’), Wittgenstein begins his presentation of what he takes to be Gödel’s proof by having someone say:

I have constructed a proposition (I will use ‘P’ to designate it) in Russell’s symbolism, and by means of certain definitions and transformations it can be so interpreted that it says: ‘P is not provable in Russell’s system’.

That is, Wittgenstein’s Gödelian constructs a proposition that is semantically self-referential and which specifically says of itself that it is not provable in PM. With this erroneous, self-referential proposition P [used also at (§10), (§11), (§17), (§18)], Wittgenstein presents a proof-sketch very similar to Gödel’s own informal semantic proof ‘sketch’ in the Introduction of his famous paper (1931: 598).

Must I not say that this proposition on the one hand is true, and on the other hand is unprovable? For suppose it were false; then it is true that it is provable. And that surely cannot be! And if it is proved, then it is proved that it is not provable. Thus it can only be true, but unprovable. (§8)

The reasoning here is a double reductio. Assume (a) that P must either be true or false in Russell’s system, and (b) that P must either be provable or unprovable in Russell’s system. If (a), P must be true, for if we suppose that P is false, since P says of itself that it is unprovable, “it is true that it is provable”, and if it is provable, it must be true (which is a contradiction), and hence, given what P means or says, it is true that P is unprovable (which is a contradiction). Second, if (b), P must be unprovable, for if P “is proved, then it is proved that it is not provable”, which is a contradiction (i.e., P is provable and not provable in PM). It follows that P “can only be true, but unprovable”.

To refute or undermine this ‘proof’, Wittgenstein says that if you have proved \(\neg P\), you have proved that P is provable (i.e., since you have proved that it is not the case that P is not provable in Russell’s system), and “you will now presumably give up the interpretation that it is unprovable” (i.e., ‘P is not provable in Russell’s system’), since the contradiction is only proved if we use or retain this self-referential interpretation (§8). On the other hand, Wittgenstein argues (§8), ‘[i]f you assume that the proposition is provable in Russell’s system, that means it is true in the Russell sense, and the interpretation “P is not provable” again has to be given up’, because, once again, it is only the self-referential interpretation that engenders a contradiction. Thus, Wittgenstein’s ‘refutation’ of “Gödel’s proof” consists in showing that no contradiction arises if we do not interpret ‘P’ as ‘P is not provable in Russell’s system’—indeed, without this interpretation, a proof of P does not yield a proof of \(\neg P\) and a proof of \(\neg P\) does not yield a proof of P. In other words, the mistake in the proof is the mistaken assumption that a mathematical proposition ‘P’ “can be so interpreted that it says: ‘P is not provable in Russell’s system’”. As Wittgenstein says at (§11), “[t]hat is what comes of making up such sentences”.

This ‘refutation’ of “Gödel’s proof” is perfectly consistent with Wittgenstein’s syntactical conception of mathematics (i.e., wherein mathematical propositions have no meaning and hence cannot have the ‘requisite’ self-referential meaning) and with what he says before and after (§8), where his main aim is to show (2) that, on his own terms, since “true in calculus \(\Gamma\)” is identical with “proved in calculus \(\Gamma\)”, the very idea of a true but unprovable proposition of calculus \(\Gamma\) is a contradiction-in-terms.

To show (2), Wittgenstein begins by asking (§5), what he takes to be, the central question, namely, “Are there true propositions in Russell’s system, which cannot be proved in his system?”. To address this question, he asks “What is called a true proposition in Russell’s system…?”, which he succinctly answers (§6): “‘pis true = p”. Wittgenstein then clarifies this answer by reformulating the second question of (§5) as “Under what circumstances is a proposition asserted in Russell’s game [i.e., system]?”, which he then answers by saying: “the answer is: at the end of one of his proofs, or as a ‘fundamental law’ (Pp.)” (§6). This, in a nutshell, is Wittgenstein’s conception of “mathematical truth”: a true proposition of PM is an axiom or a proved proposition, which means that “true in PM” is identical with, and therefore can be supplanted by, “proved in PM”.

Having explicated, to his satisfaction at least, the only real, non-illusory notion of “true in PM”, Wittgenstein answers the (§8) question “Must I not say that this proposition… is true, and… unprovable?” negatively by (re)stating his own (§§5–6) conception of “true in PM” as “proved/provable in PM”:

‘True in Russell’s system’ means, as was said: proved in Russell’s system; and ‘false in Russell’s system’ means: the opposite has been proved in Russell’s system.

This answer is given in a slightly different way at (§7) where Wittgenstein asks “may there not be true propositions which are written in this [Russell’s] symbolism, but are not provable in Russell’s system?”, and then answers “‘True propositions’, hence propositions which are true in another system, i.e. can rightly be asserted in another game”. In light of what he says in (§§5, 6, and 8), Wittgenstein’s (§7) point is that if a proposition is ‘written’ in “Russell’s symbolism” and it is true, it must be proved/provable in another system, since that is what “mathematical truth” is. Analogously (§8), “if the proposition is supposed to be false in some other than the Russell sense, then it does not contradict this for it to be proved in Russell’s sense”, for “[w]hat is called ‘losing’ in chess may constitute winning in another game”. This textual evidence certainly suggests, as Anderson almost said, that Wittgenstein rejects a true but unprovable mathematical proposition as a contradiction-in-terms on the grounds that “true in calculus \(\Gamma\)” means nothing more (and nothing less) than “proved in calculus \(\Gamma\)”.

On this (natural) interpretation of (RFM App. III), the early reviewers’ conclusion that Wittgenstein fails to understand the mechanics of Gödel’s argument seems reasonable. First, Wittgenstein erroneously thinks that Gödel’s proof is essentially semantical and that it uses and requires a self-referential proposition. Second, Wittgenstein says (§14) that “[a] contradiction is unusable” for “a prediction” that “that such-and-such construction is impossible” (i.e., that P is unprovable in PM), which, superficially at least, seems to indicate that Wittgenstein fails to appreciate the “consistency assumption” of Gödel’s proof (Kreisel, Bernays, Anderson).

If, in fact, Wittgenstein did not read and/or failed to understand Gödel’s proof through at least 1941, how would he have responded if and when he understood it as (at least) a proof of the undecidability of P in PM on the assumption of PM’s consistency? Given his syntactical conception of mathematics, even with the extra-mathematical application criterion, he would simply say that P, qua expression syntactically independent of PM, is not a proposition of PM, and if it is syntactically independent of all existent mathematical language-games, it is not a mathematical proposition. Moreover, there seem to be no compelling non-semantical reasons—either intra-systemic or extra-mathematical—for Wittgenstein to accommodate P by including it in PM or by adopting a non-syntactical conception of mathematical truth (such as Tarski-truth (Steiner 2000)). Indeed, Wittgenstein questions the intra-systemic and extra-mathematical usability of P in various discussions of Gödel in the Nachlass and, at (§19), he emphatically says that one cannot “make the truth of the assertion [‘P’ or ‘Therefore P’] plausible to me, since you can make no use of it except to do these bits of legerdemain”.

After the initial, scathing reviews of RFM, very little attention was paid to Wittgenstein’s (RFM App. III and RFM VII, §§21–22) discussions of Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem (Klenk 1976: 13) until Shanker’s sympathetic (1988b). In the last 22 years, however, commentators and critics have offered various interpretations of Wittgenstein’s remarks on Gödel, some being largely sympathetic (Floyd 1995, 2001) and others offering a more mixed appraisal (Rodych 1999a, 2002, 2003; Steiner 2001; Priest 2004; Berto 2009a). Recently, and perhaps most interestingly, Floyd & Putnam (2000) and Steiner (2001) have evoked new and interesting discussions of Wittgenstein’s ruminations on undecidability, mathematical truth, and Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem (Rodych 2003, 2006; Bays 2004; Sayward 2005; and Floyd & Putnam 2006).

4. The Impact of Philosophy of Mathematics on Mathematics

Though it is doubtful that all commentators will agree (Wrigley 1977: 51; Baker & Hacker 1985: 345; Floyd 1991: 145, 143; 1995: 376; 2005: 80; Maddy 1993: 55; Steiner 1996: 202–204), the following passage seems to capture Wittgenstein’s attitude to the Philosophy of Mathematics and, in large part, the way in which he viewed his own work on mathematics.

What will distinguish the mathematicians of the future from those of today will really be a greater sensitivity, and that will—as it were—prune mathematics; since people will then be more intent on absolute clarity than on the discovery of new games.

Philosophical clarity will have the same effect on the growth of mathematics as sunlight has on the growth of potato shoots. (In a dark cellar they grow yards long.)

A mathematician is bound to be horrified by my mathematical comments, since he has always been trained to avoid indulging in thoughts and doubts of the kind I develop. He has learned to regard them as something contemptible and… he has acquired a revulsion from them as infantile. That is to say, I trot out all the problems that a child learning arithmetic, etc., finds difficult, the problems that education represses without solving. I say to those repressed doubts: you are quite correct, go on asking, demand clarification! (PG 381, 1932)

In his middle and later periods, Wittgenstein believes he is providing philosophical clarity on aspects and parts of mathematics, on mathematical conceptions, and on philosophical conceptions of mathematics. Lacking such clarity and not aiming for absolute clarity, mathematicians construct new games, sometimes because of a misconception of the meaning of their mathematical propositions and mathematical terms. Education and especially advanced education in mathematics does not encourage clarity but rather represses it—questions that deserve answers are either not asked or are dismissed. Mathematicians of the future, however, will be more sensitive and this will (repeatedly) prune mathematical extensions and inventions, since mathematicians will come to recognize that new extensions and creations (e.g., propositions of transfinite cardinal arithmetic) are not well-connected with the solid core of mathematics or with real-world applications. Philosophical clarity will, eventually, enable mathematicians and philosophers to “get down to brass tacks” (PG 467).


Wittgenstein’s Writings

1913, “On Logic and How Not to Do It”, The Cambridge Review 34 (1912–13), 351; reprinted in Brian McGuinness, Wittgenstein: A Life, Berkeley & Los Angeles, University of California Press: 169–170.
Tractatus 1922, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1974; translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness.
1929, “Some Remarks on Logical Form”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Vol. 9: 162–171.
1929, MS 106, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1930, MS 108, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1930, TS 210, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1937, MS 117 (1937, 1938, 1940), in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1938-1939, MS 121, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1939-1940, MS 122, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1940-41, MS 123, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1944, MS 124 (1941, 1944), in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
1942-1943, MS 126, in Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition.
PI 1953 [2001], Philosophical Investigations, 3rd Edition, Oxford: Blackwell Publishing; translated by G. E. M. Anscombe.
RFM 1956 [1978], Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Revised Edition, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, G.H. von Wright, R. Rhees and G.E.M. Anscombe (eds.); translated by G.E.M Anscombe.
1966 [1999], Lectures & Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief, Cyril Barrett, (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell Publishers Ltd.
Zettel 1967, Zettel, Berkeley: University of California Press; G.E.M Anscombe and G.H. von Wright (Eds.); translated by G.E.M. Anscombe.
PG 1974, Philosophical Grammar, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; Rush Rhees, (ed.); translated by Anthony Kenny.
PR 1975, Philosophical Remarks, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; Rush Rhees, (ed.); translated by Raymond Hargreaves and Roger White.
1979a, Notebooks 1914–1916, Second Edition, G.H. von Wright and G. E. M. Anscombe (eds.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
1979b, “Notes on Logic” (1913), in Notebooks 1914–1916, G.H. von Wright and G.E.M. Anscombe (eds.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
1980, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. I, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, (eds.), translated by G.E.M. Anscombe.
2000, Wittgenstein’s Nachlass: The Bergen Electronic Edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Notes on Wittgenstein’s Lectures and Recorded Conversations

AWL Ambrose, Alice, (ed.), 1979, Wittgenstein’s Lectures, Cambridge 1932–35: From the Notes of Alice Ambrose and Margaret Macdonald, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
LFM Diamond, Cora, (ed.), 1976, Wittgenstein’s Lectures on the Foundations of Mathematics, Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press.
LWL Lee, Desmond, (ed.), 1980, Wittgenstein’s Lectures, Cambridge 1930–32: From the Notes of John King and Desmond Lee, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
WVC Waismann, Friedrich, 1979, Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle, Oxford: Basil Blackwell; edited by B.F. McGuinness; translated by Joachim Schulte and B.F. McGuinness.

Secondary Sources and Relevant Primary Literature

  • Ambrose, Alice, 1935a, “Finitism in Mathematics (I)”, Mind, 44(174): 186–203. doi:10.1093/mind/XLIV.174.186
  • –––, 1935b, “Finitism in Mathematics (II)”, Mind, 44(175): 317–340. doi:10.1093/mind/XLIV.175.317
  • –––, 1972, “Mathematical Generality”, in Ambrose and Lazerowitz 1972: 287–318.
  • –––, 1982, “Wittgenstein on Mathematical Proof”, Mind, 91(362): 264–372. doi:10.1093/mind/XCI.362.264
  • Ambrose, Alice and Morris Lazerowitz (eds.), 1972, Ludwig Wittgenstein: Philosophy and Language, London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Anderson, Alan Ross, 1958, “Mathematics and the ‘Language Game’”, The Review of Metaphysics, 11(3): 446–458; reprinted in Benacerraf & Putnam 1964b: 481–490.
  • Baker, Gordon and P.M.S. Hacker, 1985, Wittgenstein: Rules, Grammar and Necessity, Volume 2 of an Analytical Commentary on the Philosophical Investigations, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Bays, Timothy, 2004, “On Floyd and Putnam on Wittgenstein on Gödel”, Journal of Philosophy, 101(4): 197–210. doi:10.5840/jphil2004101422
  • Benacerraf, Paul and Hilary Putnam, 1964a, “Introduction”, in Benacerraf & Putnam 1964b: 1–27.
  • Benacerraf, Paul and Hilary Putnam (eds.), 1964b, Philosophy of Mathematics, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • ––– (eds.), 1983, Philosophy of Mathematics, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Note there are considerable differences between the first and second editions.
  • Bernays, Paul, 1959, “Comments on Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics”, Ratio, 2(1): 1–22.
  • Berto, Fransesco, 2009a, “The Gödel Paradox and Wittgenstein’s Reasons”, Philosophia Mathematica, 17(2): 208–219. doi:10.1093/philmat/nkp001
  • –––, 2009b, “Gödel versus Wittgenstein and the Paraconsistent Interpretation”, in his There’s Something About Gödel: The Complete Guide to the Incompleteness Theorem, West Sussex, UK: Wiley-Blackwell, Chapter 12, 189–213. doi:10.1002/9781444315028.ch12
  • Black, Max, 1964, A Companion to Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Black, Max, 1969, “Verificationism and Wittgenstein’s Reflections on Mathematics”, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 23(88/89): 284–95; reprinted in Shanker 1986: 68–76.
  • Brouwer, L.E.J., 1907 [1975], Over de Grondslagen der Wiskunde (On the Foundations of Mathematics), Ph.D. thesis, Universiteit van Amsterdam. English translation in Brouwer 1975: 11–101.
  • –––, 1908 [1975], “De onbetrouwbaarheid der logische principes” (The Unreliability of the Logical Principles), Tijdschrift voor Wijsbegeerte, 2: 152–158. English translation in Brouwer 1975: 107–111. doi:10.1016/B978-0-7204-2076-0.50009-X
  • –––, 1929 [1998], “Mathematik, Wissenschaft und Sprache” (Mathematics, Science, and Language), Monatshefte für Mathematik und Physik, 36: 153–164. English translation in Mancosu 1998: 45–53. doi:10.1007/BF02307611
  • –––, 1948 [1983], “Consciousness, Philosophy and Mathematics”, Proceedings of the 10th International Congress of Philosophy, Amsterdam 1948, Amsterdam: North-Holland, 3: 1235–1249. Reprinted in Benacerraf & Putnam 1983: 90–96. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139171519.005
  • –––, 1955, “The Effect of Intuitionism on Classical Algebra of Logic”, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, 57: 113–116.
  • –––, 1981, Brouwer’s Cambridge Lectures on Intuitionism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1975, Collected Works. I: Philosophy and Foundations of Mathematics, Arend Heyting (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Coliva, Annalisa and Eva Picardi (eds.), 2004, Wittgenstein Today, Padova: Il Poligrafo.
  • Conant, James, 1997, “On Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 97(1): 195–222. doi:10.1111/1467-9264.00013
  • Crary, Alice and Rupert Read (eds.), 2000, The New Wittgenstein, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Da Silva, Jairo Jose, 1993, “Wittgenstein on Irrational Numbers”, in Puhl 1993: 93–99.
  • Dawson, Ryan, 2016a, “Wittgenstein on Set Theory and the Enormously Big”, Philosophical Investigations, 39(4): 313–334. doi:10.1111/phin.12107
  • –––, 2016b, “Was Wittgenstein Really a Constructivist About Mathematics?”, Wittgenstein Studien, 7(1): 81–104. doi: 10.1515/witt-2016-0107
  • Dreben, Burton and Juliet Floyd, 1991, “Tautology: How Not To Use A Word”, Synthese, 87(1): 23–49. doi:10.1007/BF00485329
  • Dummett, Michael, 1959, “Wittgenstein’s Philosophy of Mathematics”, The Philosophical Review, 68: 324–348.
  • –––, 1978, “Reckonings: Wittgenstein on Mathematics”, Encounter, 50(3): 63–68; reprinted in Shanker 1986: 111–120.
  • –––, 1994, “Wittgenstein on Necessity: Some Reflections”, in Peter Clark and Bob Hale (eds.), Reading Putnam, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell Publishers: 49–65.
  • Finch, Henry Le Roy, 1977, Wittgenstein: The Later Philosophy, Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • Floyd, Juliet, 1991, “Wittgenstein on 2, 2, 2…: The Opening of Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics”, Synthese, 87(1): 143–180. doi:10.1007/BF00485332
  • –––, 1995, “On Saying What You Really Want to Say: Wittgenstein, Gödel, and the Trisection of the Angle”, in Hintikka 1995: 373–425.
  • –––, 2000, “Wittgenstein, Mathematics and Philosophy”, in Crary and Read 2000: 232–261.
  • –––, 2001, “Prose versus Proof: Wittgenstein on Gödel, Tarski, and Truth”, Philosophia Mathematica, 9(3): 280–307. doi:10.1093/philmat/9.3.280
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