Open Letter to Professional Scholars

Dear Colleagues,

The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP) is entering a crucial phase and we need your help to secure its future. We recognize that your time is valuable, so if you do not have the time to read/think about this entire letter, then please at least read the "Executive Summary" and the final section entitled "What You Can Do".

Executive Summary

The SEP Future

The SEP <> has developed a fund-raising plan so that it can continue to operate on its current open-access (free) model for the long term. The key to the success of this plan is to administer the SEP on a minimal staff and on a small budget. Using federal grant money from 1998 – 2003, we developed automation by which we can manage workflow and communications with our still-growing volunteer workforce. As of January 2014, the SEP had 1680 authors, 132 members on the Editorial Board, 1401 online entries, a total word count of 18,261,208, and a paid staff of only 2.75 (FTE) persons.

[The SEP's Publishing Model]

Why Open Access is Important

We would like to remain an open access project, i.e., free to all users. The open access we now enjoy has been a necessary component of the authoritativeness that the SEP has achieved on the web, as measured by its high ranking in various search engines, such as Google. Google and other search engines rank pages which match a search string by determining which of those matching pages receive the most links on the web — the more links there are to a web page, the higher it will be placed in the list of pages which match a search query. Moreover, this is done recursively — webpage A will rank higher on the list of matches than webpage B if the pages linking to A are themselves more widely cited (because more widely linked to) than the pages linking to B. And so on. Thus, the fact that SEP entries rank so highly in search engines indicates that many people with highly-regarded websites create links to our entries. We discovered that if you type the titles/topics of the first 100 entries we published into Google, 75% come up at the top of the list Google returns, and 94% come up in the top 10 returns. If the SEP were to disappear behind a subscription wall, we would lose this penetration of the search engines and our high visibility on the web. (Routledge entries, for example, rarely show up in search engines, given that they are behind a subscription wall; few people can access or link to them.) 75% of our users found the SEP through a search engine.

Recent Access Statistics (SEP Editorial Information page)

Of course, the most important reason for remaining open access is that it would be an outstanding legacy for the SEP and profession as a whole if it could provide both academics and non-academics around the world with a free resource by which they could satisfy their intellectual curiosity from an authoritative source on philosophical questions of all kinds and, in particular, those concerning the human condition. This sentiment can be made tangible in the following ways, for those with the time to think about this at greater length:

The Problems With a Traditional Funding Model

See our separate document:

The Problems with a Traditional Funding Model

Our Funding Partners and Plan

We therefore held discussions with the two largest library organizations: the International Coalition of Library Consortia (ICOLC) and the Scholarly Publishing and Academic Resources Coalition (SPARC), the latter having been formed under the auspices of the Association of Research Libraries. None of these organizations wanted to see us align with a publisher and present libraries with new yearly, increasing subscription costs. With the enthusiastic support of their leadership, we developed a fund-raising plan. Under this plan, during the 4 academic years (beginning September 2004), the libraries conducted a world-wide drive to raise a total of $3 million, while the SEP staff, in conjunction with Stanford University's Development Office, endeavored to raise $1.125 million from private donors. Stanford invested the money raised and the SEP lives off a portion of the interest, while the remaining interest would be returned to the principal. But the money would be placed in funds that are restricted for the sole use of the SEP project.

Our library partners have won a $500,000 Challenge Grant from the NEH, and library support of the SEP has enabled us to receive all the matching funds from the NEH. Indiana University Libraries has sponsored a library membership organization, the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy International Association ("SEPIA") so that libraries can support the SEP by paying membership dues to join SEPIA and receive member benefits. The Philosophy Documentation Center library consortium is the fiscal agent for SEPIA; it registers library commitments, invoices the libraries for membership dues, collects those dues, and transfers the money to Stanford for deposit in the SEP's endowment.

The most innovative part of our plan concerns the protections and perks we've put in place to benefit the libraries.

  1. Libraries will be able to position their contribution as "membership dues" to a society/organization set up for the support of the SEP. This money would be placed in a restricted endowment, for the sole use of the SEP.
  2. Should the SEP ever terminate, the membership dues would be returned, and the libraries would divide up the endowment together with any extra interest not expended on the project in proportion to their contribution. Thus, library money would be held in a kind of escrow, with Stanford managing the money.
  3. Participating libraries will be able to download and store our quarterly archives, thereby building their collections. This is part of the traditional mission of a library.
  4. SEP web pages sent to the institutions of contributing libraries would be “branded” with a small banner acknowledging support from the local library.

To make this all happen, we need pledges from as many libraries as possible. Indeed, this is crucial, since we believe that such pledges will provide the evidence the National Endowment for the Humanities needs when we ask them (this summer) to support our plan by partially covering our operating costs while we fund-raise, through a two-year extension on our current grant. Subscription rates under the ICOLC plan have been set for U.S. and Canadian academic libraries according to the highest degree awarded in philosophy by that institution (see the table in the Executive Summary for estimated ranges). For institutions in other countries, the rates have been calibrated to an estimate of local economic conditions.

We're pleased to report that the SEP has been kept open access and will remain open access as a result of our funding drive.

What You Can Do

Here are steps you can take to help us to meet our fundraising goals:
  1. Write to us and ask us to send you a "usage" analysis for your institution. We can tell you the total number of accesses to the SEP from your institution there were last academic year and in recent academic years.
  2. Download the Call for ICOLC Initiated Global Community Action (PDF document) and convince yourself that the library consortia are behind the SEP. [This document was written by the organizational head of the ICOLC (Tom Sanville) and endorsed at their March 15, 2004 meetings, and it is being distributed to the libraries by way of the consortia from the “top-down”. It has also been endorsed by the Director of SPARC (Rick Johnson).]
  3. Forward the ICOLC document to your colleagues along with the fundraising URL <>.
  4. Organize a department vote to endorse the SEP plan with your library. By asking you to recommend the ICOLC document to your librarian, we will thereby reach the libraries from the “bottom-up”.
  5. Raise the question with your colleagues of what contribution your department can make to the subscription level for your institution identified by the ICOLC plan. Please note that the plan suggests that the libraries might have to work in conjunction with philosophy departments and other departments on campus, so you might discuss with your colleagues which departments at your institution can contribute some of the funds the library will need to participate.
  6. Follow up with your library to make sure that it has contacted its local library consortium and made a commitment to the fund-raising plan by December 2004. Refer them to the page <> to see how many libraries have already signed up, and ask them to send email to to confirm their intention to join SEPIA. Please help anyone in your department/library who is distracted by the fact that the SEP is “incomplete” by pointing out that as a dynamic reference work, the SEP will never be complete in the usual sense and that the dynamic nature of the SEP is its principal virtue. Moreover, you could focus their attention on the terrific content we now have. You could point out (1) that there are now over 1300 entries averaging nearly 12,000 words/entry in the SEP, (2) that both poll-based and regular anecdotal evidence indicate that SEP entries are not only insightful and useful to a wide range of students and scholars but also appear on many course syllabi, and (3) that the SEP staff is pursuing specific initiatives designed to get entries on the most important topics in philosophy online as soon as possible.
  7. Please consider making a generous donation to the SEP. [Note: Your gift will be processed by the Stanford University Office of Development but put into a special account that is reserved for the exclusive use of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.] Your contribution will help keep the SEP freely available to everyone on the world wide web and thereby keep our high-quality academic resource available to the public at large.

Your efforts in mobilizing your colleagues, department, and university library are an essential part of the plan and we hope you will be able to come through for us. Please help us to overcome the free rider problem! We are counting on the fact that (philosophy) departments and libraries will recognize that the benefits of group action are most fairly attained when all members of the group contribute according to their abilities.

If worst comes to worst and your library/department/institution has no money to contribute, you might consider whether it would be in your department/institution's interest to suspend (forego) a subscription to some other online/print journal/reference work for only 3 years, and use that money to help fund the SEP. At the end of those 3 years, your library can resume its subscriptions, having paid a small price but also having played an important role in ensuring that everyone receives the SEP for free thereafter.

Finally, in reading this message, our authors and editors will recognize that the success of the plan depends in part on our continuing to build content in the SEP. Inaction on the part of our volunteer workforce thus carries a danger to the community, and we hope they will be motivated thereby to discharge their SEP work in a timely way. Of course, we really do appreciate their volunteered time, and we hope they won't be offended by our attempt to counter the myth that delaying a web publication has no negative consequences.

Thanks very much for your efforts in support of the SEP. We anticipate a successful fund-raising drive.


John Perry, Faculty Sponsor
Edward N. Zalta, Principal Editor
Uri Nodelman, Senior Editor
Colin Allen, Associate Editor

Center for the Study of Language and Information
Stanford University
Stanford, CA 94305-4115