18th Century French Aesthetics

First published Sun Feb 29, 2004; substantive revision Wed Apr 24, 2013

A new kind of discourse on art, beauty, and human sensibilities emerged in the 18th Century, for which Baumgarten, in Germany, coined the term ‘aesthetics’. The discourse was influenced by the general philosophical problems discussed during the Enlightenment, with its ideals of liberty, democracy, and scientific inquiry. The present entry examines the French contribution to this new field.

Britain, and especially Scotland, led the way, not only in the work of its empiricists such as Hutcheson and Hume but also in the work of Reid, who resisted the empiricist tradition. These philosophers raised issues and put forward ideas that influenced thinkers in Europe with an interest in art and our relationship to nature. A discussion of the British contribution to aesthetics in the 18th century can be found in the entry 18th Century British Aesthetics. By contrast, Germany's achievement is to be found in an enduring program to systematize a new domain of knowledge, and this can be found in work starting with Baumgarten and culminating in Kant. A discussion of the German contribution to aesthetics in the 18th century can be found in the entry 18th Century German Aesthetics.

The French contribution to aesthetics in the 18th century was primarily the result of two factors: (1) the extensive use of French as a lingua franca among learned people after the decline of Latin and prior to the growing dominance of English, and (2) the existence of an intellectual culture of writing and theorizing. The term ‘philosopher’ in 18th-century France was not applied only to people such as Descartes and Locke, but also to a new group of writers able to combine intellectual analysis, literature and social commentary. Voltaire and Diderot were two distinguished such figures; both had a passion for writing theatrical plays and stories and both wished to understand and advance society. Neither wrote a treatise on aesthetics, but they contributed to its development more than the other French writers of this period by systematically working through the different areas and levels of human thought. In their writings, and those of others, Reason was no longer seen as a faculty whose sole purpose was to identify the truth, but increasingly as a faculty of testing and evaluating judgments, including the judgments of sentiment, taste and individuality. For the first time, perhaps, art became as significant for humanity as scientific thought, or rather, the complete dissociation between the pursuits of art and science started to break down.

1. Prologue: A Turbulent Beginning

When the art of France in the eighteenth century is examined, one sometimes gets the impression that there is a uniformity and coherence to it, often associated with the artistic sensibilities of King Louis XIV and the cultural authority of Cardinal Richelieu's Académie Française. Upon closer examination, however, the art of the period reveals evidence of tension and even conflicts. These are the seeds of major changes to come.

Some of these tensions and conflicts arose over controversial plays. For example, Corneille's first hit, The Cid (1636), set up one of the strongest schemas of classical theater, i.e., the contest of love and duty. The play was attacked from various quarters, and accused not only of failing to offer moral instruction, but of failing to adhere to accepted dramatic practices concerning setting and plot. Later on, in his Three Discourses on Dramatic Poetry (1660), Corneille suggested that authors should be allowed to depart from Aristotle's aesthetic principles, though of course he does not suggest that those principles be totally abandoned. Another conflict, involving censorship and sensitive subjects, arose in connection with Moliere's Tartuffe (1664 and 1669), which was in some quarters received as a satire of religion, though it is in reality an attack on religious hypocrisy. It is worth noticing that though the Company of the Blessed Sacrament (a secret Catholic society) succeeded in imposing a ban on public performances, the personal support of the King allowed Moliere to prevail in the end.

In some of the conflicts that seem outwardly to have been mere skirmishes among rivals there is often substantially more at stake. A typical case is Lully's Alceste (January 1674). The first production of this opera served as the pretext not only for conspiracy theories by musicians faithful to Charpentier and hostile to Lully's ascendancy in French music (Lully was of Italian origin and had been running the Royal Academy of Music since 1672), but also for sarcastic writings from Boileau, who despised Quinault, the author of the libretto. However, the situation got more complicated in August 1674, when Racine's Iphigénie was first performed. Racine's play appeared to have nothing in common with Euripides's original, except that Euripides inspired both. The polemical issue was not so much about the value of the two works as about whether, and to what extent, the classical models for drama developed by the Ancients must be imitated. All of these professional rivalries came within a single larger controversy that structured an important part of the intellectual life of that period, known as the Quarrel of Ancients and Moderns (“the Quarrel”). The Quarrel reflected polarized attitudes toward art and society, which lasted well into the next century.

The Quarrel is usually divided into three distinct phases. The first had its roots in Italy when writers like Boccalini, Tassoni, and Lancelotti undertook to minimize the achievements of contemporary writers as compared to those of Antiquity. This phase includes the methods that Galileo developed, resulting in a physics that challenged Aristotle's. But this phase of the Quarrel reached its climax in France, where it was contested throughout a wider range of intellectuals. In the 17th century, Descartes challenged scholastic throught, which was rigidly Aristotelian. And Pascal criticized those of his contemporaries who remained slavish to the authority of the Ancients; he thought that the work of the Ancients was a fixed body of knowledge that was difficult to extend, and suggested that knowledge is instead a cumulative process making it easier to move forward as time goes on and foundations are made more secure. Another important cause of tension was the persistent use of mythological themes in art and literature in a society still devoted to Christianity. Desmarets de St-Sorlin did his best, in his work, to show that Christian themes and imagery were of a worth equal to their pagan counterparts. While the subjects of his plays were generally taken from history (e.g., Scipion, Erigone), his poems (e.g., Marie-Magdalene, Abraham) were inspired by the Bible and were, at the same time, concealed acts of allegiance to an absolutist concept of political power.

It is precisely that aspect which becomes prominent in the second phase of the Quarrel, when Perrault read his poem The Century of Louis the Great at the Academy, on January 27th, 1687. The poem combined an eloquent plea in favor of Moderns (later developed into the four-volume work, Parallel of the Ancients and Moderns, published from1688 to 1697) with a labored praise of the King. At this point, aesthetics and politics become entangled because some of the disagreements in the Quarrel became less concerned about the value of works of art than about the choice of an effective policy in the arts. Though he is the champion of the Ancient party, Boileau is unexpectedly also the most lucid on the disadvantages of the courtier attitude. Fumaroli (2001) suggests that Boileau's main criticism against the Modern contingent is that they care more about flattering the King rather than creating a genuinely new tradition. Therefore he defends the “great style” as a simple style, devoid of any sign of flattery. Fontenelle, the main spokesman of the Moderns, is not far from his rival's view, but he formulates this requirement differently: poetic license should be free from the constraints of conforming with traditions, and this should take precedence over the pursuit of masterpieces. If art is to improve the intellect and morality, one should not subject art works to a priori principles.

The third phase of the Quarrel, which took place simultaneously in France and England, is known as the “Homer Quarrel”, for it originates in several translations of Homer's Iliad, especially those by Anne Dacier (1699 and 1711) and Alexander Pope (1715-1724). The peak of the dispute was reached in France when Houdar de la Motte published a short version of Homer's poem, free of what he thought were anachronistic digressions (1714). Dacier counter-attacks straight off with her Of Causes of Corruption of Taste. Combativeness between defendants and opponents was fueled by replies that trade libels across the Channel. On the English side, Wotton, Dryden, and Swift (The Battle of the Books, 1704) are the most pugnacious; in France, Saint-Hyacinthe, Boivin, Fathers Buffier and Terrasson are no less convinced until Fénelon diplomatically proposes a reconciliation.

It might seem today that these are the last echoes of a rear-guard action, restricted to rhetoric and literature, without any significant counterpart in the realm of the pictorial arts. In fact, it happens that there was conflict there too, namely between the so-called Poussinists and Rubenists, though the repercussions were quite different. The historical background of this “Coloring quarrel” lies in the growing glory of Titian and Rubens, dampened at first by the fortunes of Raphael and Michelangelo. The debate hinged on the status of color. For a long time, color had been disregarded, for at least three reasons: it is, in Le Brun's words, “but an accident produced by the reflection of light and that varies according to circumstances” (AT, 183); it appeals to sensuality whereas “we must not judge by our senses alone but by reason” as Poussin puts it (AT, 69); and it proves unable to serve as a foundation for painting, unlike drawing, which is related to the mind (cf. the original sense of disegno = drawing or design). It is Leonardo's dictum in his Treatise on Painting (c. 1490) that “painting is dumb poetry, and poetry is blind painting” which opened the way to a better understanding.

The painter Blanchard cautiously started to endorse the use of color in the Academy in 1671. He did not want to “diminish the importance of design” but to “establish three things in defense of color: first, that color is just as necessary to the art of painting as design; secondly, that if we diminish the worth of color, we thereby also diminish the worth of painters; and thirdly, that color merited the praise of the Ancients, and that it merits it again in our own age” (AT, 178-179). Design is a necessary foundation, certainly, but if the aim of the painter is “both to deceive the eyes and to imitate nature”, it is reasonable to conclude that color serves that goal best, because “herein lies the difference that distinguishes painting from all the other arts and which gives painting its own specific end” (AT, 180). This was clearly an attempt to turn to his advantage Poussin's phrase that the aim of painting is delectation – but insufficient indeed to convince Le Brun and Champaigne, to say nothing of Testelin, the tyrannical and finicky Secretary and author of the rigid Tables of Precepts.

Two men were going to play a special role in the color crusade. It may seem odd to mention Félibien first because he is generally and rightly considered as a representative of the orthodox view. But he was also liberal-minded, respectful of differing opinions (it was to cost him his position!) and anxious to find a fair balance between the gifts of the mind and the talents of the hand. For him, “beauty is a result of the proportion and symmetry between corporeal and material parts” (AT, 220), so that color cannot be discarded since “everything should appear so artfully connected that the whole painting seems to have been painted at one and the same time, and, as it were, from the same palette” (AT, 568). When he translates Du Fresnoy's De Arte Graphica (1668) and publishes his Dialogue upon Coloring (1673), Roger de Piles may appear to hold stronger views; however, by transferring emphasis from color to coloring, he too stresses the importance of harmony and the way it presupposes mastery of local color and chiaroscuro. When de Piles entered the Academy three decades later, he would produce a synthesis under the title Principles of Painting (1708), in which he insists that “true painting is such as not only surprises, but as it were, calls to us; and has so powerful an effect, that we cannot help coming near it, as if it had something to tell us” (AT, 309). In a word, “the spectator is not obliged to seek for truth in a painting; but truth, by its effect, must call to the spectator, and force his attention” (AT, 310). That points to what he called “the whole together”, that is “a general subordination of objects one to another, as makes them all concur to constitute but one”, for the utmost satisfaction of the eye (AT, 312). The same lesson can be drawn from Antoine Coypel's writings, where “the excellence of painting” is no longer separate from “the aesthetic of the painter”. His nomination as Academy's Director in 1714 is the sign that a page has been turned.

2. Sentiment and Taste

It is difficult to find an abrupt line of demarcation between the artistic styles of the 17th and 18th centuries. There are, however, lots of local developments that are of some significance.

Dominique Bouhours is a major figure during this period of transition. He was a professor of humanities and very celebrated in the Paris salons. He published The Conversations of Aristo and Eugene in 1671, with a sequel in 1687. The two books were widely read, often reissued and with the second translated into English as The Art of Criticism (1705). One significant feature of his work (though, as Félibien and de Piles show, it wasn't considered ordinary at the time) is the adoption of the dialogue form. This affords two main benefits. First, it gives the author an opportunity to put in face-to-face debate a representative of classicism and a lover of delicacy and charm. These characters personify, respectively, Boileau and what we might call an 18th century aesthete. Second, it encourages the author to work out certain ideas in the guise of inquiry. Indeed, the dialogical presentation proves the best way to address objections, variations, or digressions that make up the real substance of investigation, so that philosophical profit goes hand in hand with the pleasure of conversing. Bouhours himself gives his reader total freedom of judgment.

One well-known concept stressed by Bouhours is the famous “je ne sais quoi” [I don't know what], “that indefinable something whose effects you feel ” (AT, 227). Bouhours is attempting to put his finger on some component that is essential to a work of art but which defies description. The expression seems to foil any analysis; all you can say, as Gracián puts it, is to admit that “this certain something, without wanting any thing itself, enters into every thing to give it worth and value” (AT, 207). Bouhours writes that “the je ne sais quoi is like those beauties covered with a veil, which are the more highly prized for being less exposed to view, and to which the imagination always adds something” (AT, 229). Half a century later, Marivaux concludes that it is the attribute par excellence of Grace: “in these paintings that you like so, in these objects of every kind which so delight you, in the entire expanse of the grounds, in all that you perceive, here simple, here untended, irregular even, sometimes ornate, sometimes not, I am there and I show myself. I bestow my charm on everything, I surround you” (AT, 415). Though these sentences fail to give the sense of the phrase, it is clear that many accept some indefinable component to artworks. This ineffable something seems to be an emotional component of human nature just as reason is a component of the mind, and thus deserves to be investigated.

The author who was to carry out this investigation in France is the Abbé Jean-Baptiste du Bos, in his Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting (1719). Du Bos had studied theology, was a diplomat and an historian, a theater and opera enthusiast, and above all, he was erudite in classical theater and archeology, with a special interest in numismatics. He was also a rationalist, though hostile to Descartes, and he had traveled in the Netherlands and England, where he met Locke. He could read English (which was uncommon in France at that time) as well as other languages. It is certain that he had read Addison, and maybe Shaftesbury, and these works may have engendered a sensualist trend in his own work though without any trace of sentimentalism. (Sensualism here is the view that sensations and perceptions are more important to knowledge than abstract ideas.) His eclectic interests led him to become acquainted with Bayle and Leibniz, though he was also open to experimental philosophy. In 1719, he became a member of the Académie Royale des Inscriptions et Belles-Lettres and, as early as 1722, was elevated to the capacity of Perpetual Secretary. But his main claim to fame for posterity remains by far his Critical Reflections, of which Voltaire wrote in 1738 that it was “the most useful book ever written on these topics in every country of Europe”. It was published by a happy coincidence in the same year as J. Richardson's The Science of a Connoisseur, which deals with related matters.

Du Bos begins by considering the subjective impression triggered by the contact with works of art. Anticipating Burke, he argues that aesthetic pleasure is a pure emotion, the physical result of the stirring of our organs, even if its nature is indeed paradoxical (i.e., a mixture of pleasure and anxiety). While Nicole and Bossuet were scorning art as perniciously diverting people from the real duties of life and salvation, du Bos insists that art is necessary to fight against worries and tedium. Such a struggle makes passions attractive in spite of their menaces. Art is a method of rescue for it makes use of the pathetic while neutralizing its unpleasant effects: “Since the most pleasing sensations that our real passions can afford us, are balanced by so many unhappy hours that succeed our enjoyments, would it not be a noble attempt of art to endeavor to separate the dismal consequences of our passions from the bewitching pleasure we receive in indulging them? Is it not in the power of art to create, as it were, beings of a new nature? Might not art contrive to produce objects that would excite artificial passions, sufficient to occupy us while we are actually affected by them, and incapable of giving us afterwards any real pain or affliction?” (AT, 395). So if it is certain that the massacre of the innocents would be an unbearable spectacle to see, nevertheless Le Brun's painting on this very same subject excites both our compassion and admiration.

Another feature of du Bos's work, and one that anticipates Diderot, is his awareness of the distinction between the various arts. Though open-minded and a sensualist (as defined above), he does not call the framework of imitation into question, but rather feels attached to the traditional hierarchies among and within the arts. In the sixth chapter, he agrees with Quintilian's precept that “imitation operates always with less force than the object imitated”, which implies that genre paintings and satire poetry for instance cannot engage our attention for a long time. Even the most magnificent landscapes are powerless without figures; if it were devoid of the shepherds and the sepulchral inscription, Poussin's Arcadia would be no exception. But what du Bos sees clearly is the failure of the famous “ut pictura poesis” (“as is painting, so is poetry”). Although he is himself a man of letters, as a sensualist, he prefers painting because of its sensible medium. He says, “the art of painting is so extremely delicate and attacks us by means of a sense, which has so great an empire over our soul, that a picture may be rendered agreeable by the very charms of the execution, independent of the object which it represents: but I have already observed, that our attention and esteem are fixt then upon the art of the imitator, who knows how to please, even without moving us. We admire the pencil that has been so capable of counterfeiting nature” (AT, 399). Similar arguments were taken up repeatedly, e.g. by Diderot, Adam Smith, and Goncourt. As for du Bos, it follows that poets and painters have to select subjects that are appropriate to the means of their arts; a sublime rejoinder in a tragedy could only be tritely rendered on a canvas and, similarly, a vast scene full of animation that displays the mastery of the painter would only be annoying in a poem that attempted something similar.

There is a second stage of du Bos's analysis, namely, an account of the conditions that sustain the value of art as a human phenomenon. This second stage is in fact a bit dated because it rests on an unscientific theory of how climate affects human endeavors. Du Bos mistakenly supposes that the emanations from the earth and the variations in quality of the air are responsible for the differences in productivity among countries and centuries. Du Bos compares genius, “that ability received from nature to do well and easily certain things that the others could only achieve badly, even when they get a lot of trouble to do so” with a plant which “so to speak, is growing by itself”. He does not subscribe, however, to determinism.

The Critical Reflections were read and quoted extensively throughout the rest of the 18th century (and still more often used without citation). An extreme case is the entry ‘Painting’ (written by Jaucourt) in the Encyclopédie, which consists of a collage of almost thirty fragments taken from du Bos, some of which are just a few lines while the longest is several pages! Likewise Montesquieu in his Essay on Taste (ca 1755) owes du Bos more than is avowed. It is probably in Switzerland that du Bos's influence was the most fertile: Bodmer borrows from him to fight against Gottsched's academism, and Sulzer takes him as a basis for his theory of sensibility. Beyond that, his legitimate heirs are undoubtedly Lessing and Mendelssohn, the last free-thinkers to precede the systematic program implemented by Baumgarten and Kant.

3. Persistence of a Rationalist Brand

It might seem as though the development of aesthetic theory in the 18th century French aesthetics is definitely settled by du Bos and that there is nothing more to be said on the importance of our subjective response to art and on the importance of sensations and perceptions (as opposed to abstract ideas) to our knowledge. But though this turn to subjectivism and sensualism was compelling, rationalism does not disappear. Cartesian, rationalist thought still strongly influenced the French-speaking world. Descartes himself wrote little on artistic topics, even in his Compendium Musicæ, and he is even doubtful about the possibility of a true analysis of aesthetic responses, since the beautiful and the pleasant “mean nothing more than a certain relation of our judgment to the object considered and cannot have any determinate measure” (Letter to Mersenne, March 18, 1630). Nevertheless, his systematic thought had consequences for the field. This is clearly noticeable through the impact of the mechanics of passions in facial physiognomy (Le Brun) or the expression of moods (Rameau). Art should have been the ideal place for studying the “union of soul and body”, though this union didn't come first in rationalist theories of art.

Another idea that played a role in the continuing development of aesthetics is the relevance of classification over valuation. As in any other domain, art was expected to be structured by stable categories that transcend the diversity of works and the variability of human attitudes. These categories have in fact a normative rather than a descriptive scope. An immediate outcome is the return of the objective question of the beautiful, apart from the subjective function of taste.

A significant landmark on this road is Crousaz's Treatise on Beauty (1714), which included a translation of Plato's Hippias major as an appendix. At first sight, it seems paradoxical that the first book worthy to qualify as a treatise on philosophical aesthetics in France was written by a logician who was not concerned by works of art as much as with (criticism of) scholastic logic and pedagogy. Crousaz is convinced that men are happy in so far as they are reasonable; his favorite subjects are the sciences, eloquence, and virtue. When Bernoulli attacked his single artistic chapter devoted to music, he replaced it in the 1724 edition with a long development upon religion, a subject for sure closer to his personal abilities. For him, there is a natural continuity from mathematics to the whole conduct of human life.

Crousaz does not offer original ideas on the nature of the beautiful; he takes up the old dictum coined by Leibniz, that it is a mix of unity and diversity, so as to preserve order and proportion from both caprice and monotony. But he approaches it with a new awareness of the constraints and prejudices that obstruct the way: “Everyone possesses [an idea of the beautiful], but since it hardly ever appears alone we do not reflect upon it and fail to distinguish it from the tangle of other ideas which appear alongside it” (AT, 390). The root of this difficulty lies in the duality of human faculties: “Sometimes ideas and feelings are in agreement with each other and an object merits the qualification ‘beautiful’ on both counts. Sometimes, however, ideas and feelings are at war with each other and then an object pleases and at the same time does not: from one perspective it is beautiful, while from another it lacks beauty” (AT, 392). Crousaz does not put up with this divorce; on the contrary, he believes we have a responsibility to discover “which principles regulate our approbation when we judge something from ideas only [or, as he likes to say, “coolly”] and find it beautiful independently of feeling” (AT, 393). Taste is not discarded but rather viewed as a forerunner of what reason would have approved, had it time enough to weigh everything relevant to a judgment. Crousaz finally reconciles knowledge with sensations, a fact that appears to testify in favor of God's wisdom. Similar ideas are also to be found in minor authors such as Frain du Tremblay, Brumoy, or Trublet.

Father André's Essay on Beauty (1741) covers the same territory, but with a strong influence from Malebranche. In accordance with the Cartesian distinction between ideas (innate, adventitious, and fictitious), André suggests several notions of beauty. Essential beauty is “independent of any institution, even divine” and so is identified with what is universal, immutable, and recognizable by divine Reason. Natural beauty concerns the whole range of created things; it is “independent of any human opinion” but follows from God's will; it is present in the harmony and finality of nature. The lowest degree of beauty is the product of human activity and is partly arbitrary, because it combines intellectual as well as sensual ingredients. This sensible beauty that speaks to the eye and ear is itself organized into three levels: genius, taste, and caprice (in descending order). Only genius is recognizable by our reason, when the latter is adequately supported by other faculties. André summarizes (in a sentence that could have been written by Shaftesbury): “I call beautiful not what pleases to imagination's first sight – but what has a right to please reason and reflection by its own excellence” (Essay on Beauty quoted in Becq 1994, 419). For him (and his disciple, Séran de la Tour) there is no distinction between beauty and truth, and this is the very definition of the aesthetics of perfection. But aesthetic feeling is a normal affective accompaniment of any act of creation or reception, and the distinguishing feature of humankind as a species.

Charles Batteux had somewhat different goals. When he published The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle in 1746, he took up a challenge: to establish Aristotelian ideas firmly as the general basis for a unified system of the arts. The main concept on which he focuses is mimesis, but generalized to any kind of art (thus going beyond Aristotle or Horace). To achieve this generalization, he distinguishes the liberal arts, of which the object is pleasure (i.e., music, poetry, painting, sculpture, and dance), from the mechanical ones, and he proposes an interpretation of what amounts to the “imitation of the beautiful nature” (Batteux 1746). He insists that imitation is not a matter of slavishly copying the given, but a sensible and enlightened process that struggles its way forward to the best result. Recalling the famous anecdote of Zeuxis (who composed his Helen out of parts taken from Crotone's most perfect women), he concludes that the artist has the responsibility to imitate what reason concludes is nature's essence. That is why Batteux praises artifice so much: “art is made for fooling” (Batteux 1746), not because it is inherently duplicitous but because truth is a complex construction that hides its structure and development. Batteux notes that opera is “the act of representing a marvelous action. What is performed on the stage is the divine in the epic” (III, 5, p. 211-212). C. Kintzler offers the following commentary: “the man of science knows how to explain the fabric of nature and mind, the man of art knows how to represent these mechanisms on stage, and the man of taste knows how to be delighted by the illusion involved” in her book on Jean-Philippe Rameau. So taste has no function without science and art, but in return, science and art are not able to fulfill their function without taste.

Though sometimes Batteux is criticized for his stubborn defense of excessively rigid standards (as in his Principles of Literature, 1753) and for being an uncompromising advocate of the principle ut pictura poesis mentioned above, at other times, he is recognized for grasping that the ideal is not to be found anywhere outside fiction.

It is also important to mention Jean-Philippe Rameau, who passionately adhered to Cartesian thought. In his Treatise on Harmony (1722), he attempted to lay the scientific foundations of music, and codifies many of the ideas that are the basis of our analysis of music to this day (i.e., tonality, major vs. minor keys, principles of composition and accompaniment, etc.). For Rameau, harmony is more fundamental to music than melody. Nonetheless, from the Demonstration of the principle of harmony (1750) on, and after the so-called “Quarrel of Buffoons”, where Rousseau took him to task (in his Letter about French Music 1753, a libel in favor of the Italian opera), Rameau retreated to the certainty that music is the universal “key” to any subject whatsoever, including geometry.

4. From Connoisseurs to Art Critics

At the exact opposite of so toughened a theoretician as Rameau lies the figure of the connoisseur which anticipates that of the art critic. Even if the art connoisseur is not a totally new personage on the scene of art practices, his role is going to become increasingly important for understanding how art is valued. Recognition of his importance is correlated with a subjective encounter with, and therefore more democratized access to, artworks. This is facilitated by an overall evolution in the historical context for, when patrons ordered great decorative paintings and frescoes to advance their rank in society or serve the cause of the State, their decisions were not always reflected in personal aesthetic judgments. It could no more be acceptable from the perspective of the art critic. Moreover, after art collections of royal and noble origin became the core of the first museums, there appeared other, less ambitious collections accumulated by wealthy amateurs who shared a mutual taste for quality. Most often, these collections were composed of drawings, prints, coins, antiques, and plaster or terracotta casts; all typically items less expensive and easier to handle than sculptures or paintings.

Among the most famous of these connoisseurs were the financier Crozat and the Comte de Caylus. It was not enough for them to collect thousands of works; they were also concerned to index them and reproduce them through printmaking. The Recueil Crozat (1729 and 1742) is the true ancestor of art books and dictionaries devoted to fine arts, which began to multiply (see, e.g., Pernéty's Dictionnaire portatif, 1757, Watelet and Lévesque's Dictionnaire des arts, 1792, and especially Mariette's Abecedario, posthumously published from 1851–1860). Catalogs began to proliferate and the first monographs appeared (among the most important being Recueil Julienne, Jean de Julienne's collection of 271 engravings after Watteau's paintings). Caylus and Dezallier d’Argenville also wrote on artists, sketched biographies and established rules of discernment for the delicacy of style or lightness of execution. All this took place in the larger context in which the cosmopolitan amateurs of different countries were able to easily travel abroad. (Such travels evolved into the nascent ritual of the Grand Tour.)

Another factor that fostered the transformation of a person fond of art into an authentic connoisseur able to make refined judgments and correct attributions was the institution of the Salon, i.e., official exhibitions. The Royal Academy of Painting and Sculpture had been founded in 1648 but it organized very few exhibitions. Nevertheless, a series of lectures – first public, then private – was proposed from 1667 onwards. But it is only from 1737 onwards that regular shows of new works took place every two years, covering the various fields of visual arts. The existence of these official exhibitions, or Salons, was a powerful stimulant for artistic activities, notwithstanding the constraints on how much creativity could be displayed.

Though the Salon was first a political and social event that was inaugurated for about one month in the Louvre's Salon Carré on August 25th – St. Louis’ day-- to pay homage to the king, it was also a valuable guide for tracing the major trends in style and aesthetic ideas, for lists of works as well as evolutionary trends in pictorial genres were taken into account. But most significant consequence of the rise of the Salon was the birth of a new literary genre, namely, the salon review, which flourished until the 20th century and has been an incomparable mirror of aesthetic thought. Originally, such reviews were just a blend of descriptive reports and theoretical asides, often controversial. The “salon” is for the benefit of a larger public (i.e., those not necessarily affiliated with some artistic institution). As La Font de Saint-Yenne puts in 1747: “an exhibited picture is the same as a book on the day of publication, and as a play performed in the theater: everyone has the right to make his own judgment. We have gathered together the judgments of the public which showed the greatest amount of agreement and fairness, and we now present them, and not at all our own judgment, to the artists, in the belief that this same public which judgments are so often bizarre and unjustly damning or hasty rarely errs when all its voices unite on the merit or weakness of any particular work” (AT, 555). With Caylus, Baillet de Saint-Julien, and then above all Diderot, the aesthetic importance of painting is increasingly emphasized, opening the way to a long tradition of writers keen on painting.

The growth of salon reviews was the result of new demands for journalism combined with the rise of public opinions on artistic matters. Diderot's German friend, the philologist Friedrich Melchior Grimm, invited him to contribute to the Correspondance littéraire, a bi-monthly handwritten letter containing news and criticism of Parisian life that Grimm prepared and disseminated to subscribers. Diderot's first attempt in 1759 was a rather disappointing paper of less than twelve pages, composed of notes taken during his visit. It is all the more remarkable that he succeeded to raise this exercise to perfection in his reviews of 1763 and 1767. Since Diderot's work is a decisive landmark in the emergence of criticism, it is worth paying some attention to its development. His first encounters with art were intellectual, through the surveys of Crousaz, Shaftesbury, and Hutcheson. He attached utmost importance to the theme of blindness as a conceptual paradigm and also as a weapon against idealism. But Diderot was not only a passionate philosopher who thought about the relations between knowledge and vision, he was also an enlightened amateur who enjoyed painting, possessed strong likes and dislikes, and aimed at understanding.

Diderot's efforts as an art writer were based on two complementary beliefs, namely, that the techniques used by a painter to produce various effects are difficult for the ordinary viewer to understand and articulate, and that it is a difficult but vital challenge to capture, through literary language, the significant aspects of a painting. That the painter's alchemy eludes the viewer's understanding is something often repeated by Diderot, notably with respect to Chardin: “It's magic, one can't understand how it's done: thick layers of colour, applied one on top of the other, each one filtering through from underneath to create the effect. At times, it looks as though the canvas has misted over from someone breathing on it; at others, as though a thin film of water has landed on it. … Close up, everything blurs, goes flat and disappears. From a distance, everything comes back to life and reappears” (1763, AT, 604). Diderot accepted the view that color was primary in painting but his view applies to the effects produced in drawing and to what separates manner from mannerism. Though he confesses that he praises and blames after his personal feeling that does not make law (1767) as early as 1765 he considers that his acquaintance with works gives him a right to write a little “Treatise on Painting” to air his reasons for confidence in his judgments.

At the same time, Diderot is aware that the painter's power makes it extremely hard for the writer to give his reader a deep grasp of a painting. Despite the difficulty, the writer must somehow express the essence of a masterpiece, thereby achieving a kind of ekphrasis, in which the art of writing attempts to capture in words the essence and form of the visual art of painting. The critic must not only provide the reader with a short description of the work in question, but must attempt to make his words somehow equivalent to the sentiment expressed by the painting in question.

In fact, Diderot generalizes this idea of capturing one mode of expression by means of another under the phrase ‘hieroglyph’, which was first mentioned in his Letter on the Deaf and Dumb (1751) through a meditation on the relation of knowledge to senses. Doolittle characterizes it as “a suggestion which the poet makes to the hearer's understanding, and particularly to its imagination, by means of sound and rhythm in conjunction with the vocabulary and subject matter of the poem” (Diderot Studies, 2). Given this approach to art criticism, it is thus understandable why Diderot was fascinated by the ‘ocular harpsichord’ imagined (if not realized) by Father Castel, by which a musician, when striking the keys on a keyboard when playing a piece of music, would not only produce sounds but also produce colors by opening curtains to colored glass panes. It is also understandable why Diderot had an interest in the training methods of education devised for people deprived of a major sense.

Amongst the most significant literary devices used by Diderot is the dialogue form, in which art criticism was woven into real and imagined dialogues, with the interlocutor sometimes in the person of Diderot's close friend Grimm, mentioned earlier (see Diderot on Art II, and Sherman 1976). Some of these dialogues appeared in Grimm's Correspondence Littéraire (also mentioned earlier). The brief work, Salon de 1775, is nothing but a conversation between the author and someone named ‘Saint-Quentin’. Saint-Quentin was highly critical of the art works in the Salon, while the author remained the reasonable skeptic. Another favorite literary device that Diderot employed was a narrative that unfolds the spatial organization of pictures. A combination of the two literary devices we’ve been discussing appears in a passage devoted to the artist Joseph Vernet, in which the dialogue imagines that each landscape painting is a real site discovered through walking and conversing (see Salon of 1767: Diderot on Art, Vol II, 86-129). In effect, the dialogue partners have entered the work. It is only at the seventh and last site that the deceit is revealed, thereby paying homage to the painter's and the writer's virtuosity.

5. Art as Philosophy

With this rise of art criticism and aesthetics in 18th century France, art is no longer merely one field among many open to philosophical questioning; instead it becomes a model of development for other domains of French philosophy. During antiquity and the classical age, mathematics played this role, as a paradigm of intellectual certainty and immutable foundations. But the objects of study and investigational techniques of mathematics are somewhat limited in scope. The 18th century saw art, art criticism and aesthetics raised to the cultural importance of science and, together science and art became partners for society's benefit.

This development was reinforced by progress in philosophy itself, such as through the impact of British empiricism and the growth of materialism. Cartesian rationalist principles gave way to the suggestion that our ideas ultimately originate from the senses, and Condillac and d’Alembert followed Locke in this regard. So the standards of beauty and taste were no longer imposed by reason but somehow originated and evolved from our judgments as human beings interacting with art works. This more materialist, and sense-based view of humankind demanded a thorough investigation of the basis of society and the ultimate ends of life itself. As a result, the frequent analogy between works of art and living organisms proved to be compelling.

Between the Encyclopedists and Rousseau, the meaning of art is a constant subject of dispute in part because disagreements about the nature of progress. There had been a rise in the standard of living and Voltaire, among others, celebrated wealth, luxury, and the gentleness of life they permit. “What a good time this iron century is!” he exclaims in the Mondain (line 21). Voltaire interprets the developments in the fine arts as a positive consequence of progress and pleads that “where several of the fine arts are wanting, the rest must necessarily languish and decay, since they are inseparably connected together, and mutually support each other” (A Philosophical Dictionary). Rousseau however, is not nearly as sanguine about progress, given the persistent inequalities found in the larger society. As a result, he views developments in the arts with greater suspicion though, at the same time, he is appealing to a new kind of relationship of art to nature (Discourse on the Arts and Sciences). These two interpretations of art have, of course, their corresponding features in aesthetics, which sometimes comes across as the attempt to critically articulate our artistic capacities for expression and sometimes as the discussion of trifles for persons of leisure.

Voltaire's and Rousseau's supporters nevertheless agreed on the kinds of advantages art offers for humanity as a whole; all of them thought that it was a task of aesthetics to make these advantages explicit. The debate often mentioned three points: the ways in which art increases our sensitivity, the way in which art makes us more sociable, and the way in which art develops our potential for invention.

In so far as the arts mobilize the whole range of our faculties, they improve our ability to discern minute distinctions that otherwise would go unnoticed. Thus, delicacy of taste may be cultivated not only for one's own pleasure but also for the other consequences it affords. Interactions with art help to educate a culture to have a more refined sensibility. This is important for the whole of human life.

Nevertheless, concept of sensibility undergoes a strong shift during the 1770s. In quick succession two pieces of writing destined to gain a prominent influence were published: the French translation of Burke's A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origins of our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful (by the Abbé des François) and the entry ‘Sublime’ in the Encyclopédie written by Chevalier de Jaucourt. The most conspicuous feature of the sublime is the unexpected feeling of a violent suspension of our whole experience when confronted with contradictory forces. In order to define it, the philosopher Claude Helvetius had used words that concur with Burke's: “the sensation of a terror begun” of which delight is a decisive constituent (A Treatise on Man, Section VIII Ch. XIV, p. 232). Whereas the beautiful gives rise to a sentiment of harmony with the world and oneself, the sublime manifests itself through a sudden transformation of the self into something deprived of its usual landmarks.

Since works of art are often a reflection of society's ideals and prejudices, art becomes an effective means fostering socialization. Chabanon is convinced that music could contribute more than any other art to human concord. Diderot makes a similar point by reference to theater, which is less a place for amusement than a microcosm of society and therefore a laboratory for civil passions. So it is no surprise if Voltaire can write in return that “nothing renders the mind so narrow, and so little, if I may use that expression, as the want of social intercourse; this confines its faculties, blunts the edge of genius, damps every noble passion, and leaves in a state of languor and inactivity every principle, that could contribute to the formation of true taste” (AT, 532). In brief, art helps us to communicate with one another and facilitates a more socially-connected culture.

Another decisive feature of art is the way in which it increases our potential for invention. This could be interpreted negatively as the idea that social life and human nature includes an unending quest for novelty. But in a more positive light, art provides a model of invention that fulfills mankind's highest aspirations and abilities, and creates a route from our most primitive drives to our most substantial accomplishments. Art therefore realizes Leibniz's contention that ars inveniendi is more closely related to games than to more serious matters (Letter to Bernoulli, January 29, 1697). In any case, productive imagination and genius often help the artist carry through her projects. Thus, the genius often found in art works has less to do with some ‘sparkling touch’ found in them than in the fact that their qualities help us to reconsider things anew and from a fresh point of view.

If art, therefore, increases our sensitivity, makes us more sociable, and develops our potential for invention, then aesthetic education is essential for accelerating mankind's development. This idea is a common thread, sometimes implicit, sometimes explicit, which runs all through the 18th century, from Shaftesbury to Kant and, above all, Schiller. An important consequence of an aesthetic education is the enhancement of one's ability to combine analysis and imagination. No doubt such a frame of mind was a component of pre-revolutionary thinking, though it is doubtful that the French Revolution as an historic episode had the kind of effect that its first defenders hoped for.

6. An Age of Transition

Aesthetics in the last third of 18th century France saw developments in divergent directions, most of them being based either on dissatisfaction with the present or on a premonition of a new order. In art, we find a revival of the “Grand Manner”, which historians call “Neo-Classicism” and which replaced the excesses of rococo. But the most significant trends in aesthetics lie in a renewed contact with the legacy of Antiquity and in a pre-romantic aspiration for a more sincere kind of sensibility, often towards nature itself.

The renewed contact with the legacy of Antiquity was rather visceral, for it followed a sequence of archaeological excavations, first at Herculanum and Pompeii (reported in Cochin & Bellichard 1753, Winckelmann 1762, and Caylus 1752), and then in Athens and in Egypt. The spectacle of towns unearthed from cinders and of magnificent monuments strewn on the ground had a great deal to do with this new awareness of Antiquity. Lots of books, often enriched with engravings, combined a sentimental look at the archeological remains with a revisionist history that assessed Greece as the true origin of ancient artistic output. A new kind of history, art history, is born at this time; Winckelmann, for example, in his History of Ancient Art (1764), developed such a history. His work compiled an epic of forms that gives us insight into past civilizations, not just a collection of anecdotes such as one would find in Vasari's Lives. Artists such as Anton Raphael Mengs and Jacques-Louis David were particularly inspired by Greek art and consequently shunned all excesses of the day in favor of simple, austere grandeur in both subjects and attitudes.

But, from an aesthetic point of view, the most significant trend in this period is the growing debates about museology. In the middle of the century, the first great museums opened to the public (the British Museum in 1759, the Uffizi in 1765). But France was behind its neighbors, even if royal collections were more accessible than before. The first suggestion for creating a gallery in the unoccupied Louvre goes back to 1747 and was reiterated in 1765 in the eponymous entry in the Encyclopédie. The museum finally opened in 1793, but there was still uncertainty as to whether it should be an academy of local masterpieces or a wide overview of art's historical development. During the Napoleonic campaigns, famous statues were transferred from Italy to Paris (the Belvedere Apollo, the Medicis Venus, the Laocoön, to mention only the most renowned). This policy was criticized as early as 1796 by Quatremère de Quincy in his Letters to Miranda. For better or for worse, the practice prevailed under the leadership of Vivant Denon, at least from 1803 to the French defeat at Waterloo.

No entry on 18th century French aesthetics is complete without some discussion of Rousseau. In his fiction as well as in his autobiographical writings Rousseau advocated that his heart “transparent as crystal” (Dialogues, II) and eager for sympathetic communication with others, freed from verbal ambiguities and anticipating modern theories of empathy. This may have naturally evolved from the strong passion for music he developed as a young man. His Letter on French Music (1753) was a contribution to “The Quarrel of the Bouffons” over the merits of French and Italian music. He wrote in the Letter: “Harmony, having its principle in nature, is the same for all nations, or if it has some variations they are introduced by those in the melody; thus, it is from melody alone that the particular character of a national music must be derived.” However, Rousseau thought that music must not be judged solely on the basis of symphonic and operatic works, but also on the basis of the songs and dances found in popular festivals, such as the songs and dances at harvest time, when the participants merge into a single community. For Rousseau, an exemplary musical form was the melodrama, a play in which human voice and gestures are combined with instrumental accompaniment as the action advances. His own contribution to this form was Pygmalion, written in 1762 and first performed in 1770. For a discussion of how Rousseau's musical theory is connected with views he developed in social and political philosophy, see Scott 1998.

Finally, it is worth mentioning how the concern for nature that developed in the 18th century led in part to the Romanticism of the 19th century. From a genuine fondness for botany there arose a new way to look at gardens. Again, the British paved the way by inventing landscape gardening as a form of “painting” with nature. The Marquis de Girardin, the Baron de Monville, the Prince de Ligne (all readers of Rousseau) competed with the famous models in Britain and landscaped their properties accordingly, using symbols of the picturesque, such as the building of artificial ruins. Further, explorers set out to navigate or tame the remaining unknown natural terrains. H. -B. de Saussure, for example, was the first mountaineer to reach the top of the Mont Blanc. That was in 1760. By publishing a description of his journeys in the Alps, he was an important forerunner of the genre of travel writing. Despite the many precursors to Romanticism, France was not a fertile terrain for this new development. Instead, while Romanticism took hold in Germany and England, there was a period of decline in French art and aesthetics, made even worse by its isolation due to internal upheavals. It isn't until the late 19th century that we see a true renewal, when Baudelaire established the stature of Delacroix and laid the foundations of a theory of modernity.


A. Major Original Works available in English (in chronological order)

  • Bellicard, Jérôme-Charles and Cochin, Charles-Nicolas, 1753, Observations upon the Antiquities of the Town of Herculanum, London: D. Wilson and T. Durham.
  • Bouhours, Dominique, 1705, The Art of Criticism, Philip Smallwood (ed.), Delmar, NY: Scholar's Facsimiles & Reprints, 1981.
  • Cochin, Charles-Nicolas and Jérôme-Charles Bellicard, 1753, Observations upon the Antiquities of the Town of Herculaneum, London: D. Wilson and T. Durham.
  • De Piles, Roger, 1708, The Principles of Painting, London: J. Osborn, 1943.
  • Diderot's Early Philosophical Works, M. Jourdain (trans.), Chicago-London: Open Court, 1916.
  • Diderot on Art I and II, 1995, P. Goodman (trans.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Du Bos, Jean-Baptiste, 1719, Critical Reflections on Poetry, Painting and Music, T. Nugent (trans.), London: John Nourse, 1748.
  • Félibien, André, 1667, Seven Conferences Held in the King of France's Cabinet of Paintings, Henri Testelin (trans.). London: T. Coope, 1740. [Discussions between “Le Brun, Bourdon, de Champagne, Perrault, etc., on some of the most celebrated pictures of Raphael, Titian, Paulo Veronese, Poussin, etc., in which the method of forming a judgment on paintings, is laid down with the greatest elegance and perspicuity”.]
  • Gerard, Alexander, 1759, Essay on Taste, with Three Dissertations on the Same Subject by Mr Voltaire, Mr d’Alembert, Mr de Montesquieu, London: A. Millar.
  • Grimm, Friedrich Melchior, 1753, Correspondance littéraire, Paris: Garnier Frères, 1877.
  • Helvetius, Claude, 1759, Essays on the Mind, W. Mudford (trans.) London:M. Jones, 1807.
  • –––, 1777, Treatise on Man, W. Hooper (trans.) London: Vernor, Hood, and Sharpe, 1810.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, Essay on the Origin of Languages and Writings Related to Music (Collected Writings of Rousseau), John T. Scott (trans.), Dartmouth: Dartmouth College Press, 2009.
  • Winckelmann, Johann Joachim, 1762, “Sendschreiben von den Herculanischen Entdeckungen” ("Letter About the Discoveries at Herculaneum").
  • –––, 1764, “Nachrichten von den neuesten Herculanischen Entdeckungen” (“Report About the Latest Herculanean Discoveries”).

B. Sourcebooks and Other Primary Literature

  • Elledge, S. and Schier, D. (eds), 1970, The Continental Model: Selected French Essays of the 17th Century, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Batteux, Charles, 1746, Les Beaux Arts réduits À Un Même Principe, Paris: Durand.
  • Fumaroli, Marc, 2001, preface and essay in La Querelle des Anciens et des Modernes, Paris: Gallimard Folio.
  • Harrison, Charles, Wood, Paul and Gaiger, Jason (eds.), 2000, Art in Theory, 1648 – 1815, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers [This is cited as AT in the text.]
  • Holt, Elizabeth G., 1958, A Documentary History of Art, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Saint-Girons, Baldine, 1990, Esthétiques du XVIIIe siècle: le modèle français, Paris: Sers.

C. Secondary Literature

  • Becq, Annie, 1994, Genèse de l’esthétique française moderne, 1680–1814, Paris: Albin Michel.
  • Belaval, Yvon, 1950, L’esthétique sans paradoxe de Diderot, Paris: Gallimard.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1932, The Philosophy of the Enlightenment, F.C.A. Koelln and J. P. Pettegrove (trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Chambers, F. P., 1932, The History of Taste: An Account of the Revolution of Art Criticism and Theory in Europe, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Chouillet, Jacques, 1974, L’esthétique des Lumières, Paris: PUF.
  • Caylus, Anne Claude de, 1752-, Recueil d’antiquités égyptiennes, étrusques, grecques, romaines, et gauloises (“Collection of Egyptian, Etruscan, Greek, Roman, and Gallic Antiquities”), 7 vols., Paris: Desaint & Saillant, 1752-67.
  • Dieckmann, Herbert, 1965, “Esthetic Theory and Criticism in the Enlightenment” in Robert Mollenauer (ed.), Introduction to Modernity (Symposium on 18th Century Thought), pp. 63–105, Austin, University of Texas Press.
  • Doolittle, James, 1952, “Hieroglyph and Emblem in Diderot's Lettre sur les sourds et muets”, Diderot Studies II, Syracuse: Syracuse University Press.
  • Ehrard, Jean, 1970, L’idée de nature en France à l’aube des Lumières, Paris: Flammarion.
  • Folkierski, W., 1925, Entre le Classicisme et le Romantisme, étude sur l’esthétique et les esthéticiens du XVIIIe siècle, Paris: Honoré Champion, 1969.
  • Fontaine, André, 1909, Les doctrines d’art en France: Peintres, amateurs, critiques, de Poussin à Diderot, Paris: Laurens.
  • Fried, Michael, 1980, Absorption and Theatricality: Painting and Beholder in the Age of Diderot, Berkeley and London: University of California P.
  • Harpe, Jacqueline de la, 1955, Jean-Pierre de Crousaz et le conflit des idées au siècle des Lumières, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Hazard, Paul, 1935, La crise de la conscience européenne, 1680 – 1715, republished Paris: Livre de Poche Référence, 1994.
  • –––, 1946, La Pensée européenne du XVIIe siècle, republished Paris: Hachette Pluriel, 1954.
  • Hobson, Marian, 1982, The Object of Art, The Theory of Illusion in eighteenth Century France, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kintzler, Catherine, 1991, Poétique de l’opéra français de Corneille à Rousseau, Paris: Minerve.
  • Lombart, Alain, 1913, L’Abbé du Bos, un initiateur de la pensée moderne, 1670 – 1742, Paris: Hachette.
  • O'Dea, Michael, 1995, Jean-Jacques Rousseau: Music, Illusion and Desire, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Pomeau, René, 1966, L’Europe des Lumières, cosmopolitisme et unité européenne au XVIIIe siècle, republished Paris: Hachette Pluriel.
  • Puttfarken, Thomas, 1986, Roger de Piles’ Theory of Art, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Saisselin, R. G., 1965, Taste in XVIIIth Century France, Syracuse: Syracuse University Press.
  • Scholar, Richard, 2005, The Je-ne-sais-quoi in early Modern Europe, Encounters with a Certain Something, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Scott, John, 1998, “The Harmony between Rousseau's Musical Theory and His Philosophy,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 59(2): 287-308.
  • Sherman, Carol, 1976, Diderot and the Art of Dialogue, Genéve: Libraire Droz.
  • Teyssèdre, Bernard, 1957, Roger de Piles et les débats sur le coloris au siècle de Louis XIV, Paris: Bibliothèque des Arts.

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aesthetics: British, in the 18th century | aesthetics: German, in the 18th century | Diderot, Denis | Enlightenment | Hume, David: aesthetics | Voltaire

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