Akan Philosophy of the Person

First published Wed Dec 27, 2006

The culture of the Akan people of West Africa dates from before the 13th century. Like other long-established cultures the world over, the Akan have developed a rich conceptual system complete with metaphysical, moral, and epistemological aspects. Of particular interest is the Akan conception of persons, a conception that informs a variety of social institutions, practices, and judgments about personal identity, moral responsibility, and the proper relationship both among individuals and between individuals and community.

This overview presents the Akan conception of persons as seen by two major contemporary Akan philosophers, Kwasi Wiredu and Kwame Gyekye. These scholars present two very different accounts of the concept, particularly with respect to the relationship between social recognition and innate characteristics to personhood. Examining the Akan conception of personhood from these two different perspectives highlights both the richness of the conception as well as the myriad ways in which the resulting conception contrasts with Western conceptions. Among those contrasts are four on which we focus below: (1) the continuous nature of personhood, (2) the means by which individuals achieve full personhood, and the implications of this conception of personhood for (3) the relationship between individuals and the community and (4) the Akan understanding of responsibility and freedom.

The debate between Wiredu and Gyekye provides insights regarding not just the substance of the conception of personhood, but also the way empirical evidence can be used to inform philosophical analysis. In this particular case, the Akan view of personhood has, like many other metaphysical and moral conceptions, far-reaching effects on social practices and institutions. Using facts about these practices and institutions to reconstruct a conception of personhood underscores another important general theme in African philosophy: the practical implications of philosophical principles on everyday life. For the Akan, judgments about personhood are not matter of merely academic interest, but play an important role in shaping and supporting their highly communal social structure. To the extent that the Akan notion accommodates a common humanity as an innate source of value, it supports moral equality. At the same time, its emphasis on the social bases of personhood helps firmly to embed trust, cooperation, and responsibility to the community in cultural practices. The Akan philosophy of persons thus represents an attempt to resolve questions of identity, freedom, and morality in favor of a communalistic way of life that has evolved as a rational adaptation to the exigencies of survival under harsh conditions.


1. Degrees of Personhood

In an attempt to express the essence of the Akan concept of persons, Kwasi Wiredu refers to former Zambian President Kaunda's praise of former British Prime Minister Margaret Thatcher as “truly a person.” The concept of person to which Kaunda referred has a particular significance within the African cultural context. As Kaunda explains, “personhood is not an automatic quality of the human individual; it is something to be achieved, the higher the achievement, the higher the credit” (Wiredu 1992, 104). The view of personhood as a matter of degrees, as exemplified in Kaunda's remark, is also a defining characteristic of the Akan notion of personhood.

The Akan word onipa is an ambiguous term, sometimes referring to a member of a biological species and sometimes referring instead to a human who has attained a special kind of social status (Wiredu 1992). According to Wiredu, this dual meaning reflects an important conceptual distinction between a human—a biological entity—and a person—an entity with special moral and metaphysical qualities. Status as a human is not susceptible to degrees, nor is such status conferred on an individual as a ‘reward’ for her efforts. One is either a human or one is not—there is no such thing as becoming a human. In contrast, personhood is something for a human to become to different degrees through individual achievement. An individual's human status, then, is a necessary, but not sufficient, condition for personhood.[1]

Under this interpretation, the ‘payoff’ for attaining higher degrees of personhood is directly related to rights and privileges that can make a significant difference between success and failure.[2] The more rights and privileges an individual enjoys, the more social capital that individual acquires (in the form of access to lineal networks and the resources they control). A person—taken in its fullest sense—is therefore an individual who, through mature reflection and action, has both flourished economically and succeeded in meeting her (often weighty) responsibilities to her family and community.

The distinctive qualities of this concept of persons (as interpreted by Wiredu) are brought out when contrasted to the analysis of another leading African philosopher, Kwame Gyekye, who takes issue with this graduated conception of person. Gyekye specifically objects to the role that social status plays in Wiredu's view of personhood, arguing that that is inconsistent with the natural or innate moral equality of persons derived from their common humanity. That is, we are human persons before we are anything else and it is the human person that matters from the moral point of view. Not surprisingly, Gyekye quotes Kant's categorical imperative approvingly when arguing that human persons are, as members of the ‘kingdom of ends,’ equal independent of their empirical or accidental characteristics (be they social or even genetic qualities.

According to Gyekye, it is our essentially human capacity for reason—not other fortuitous or accidental predicates—that serves as the basis for moral worth. In this respect, one cannot point to such accidental characteristics as height, gender, age, marital status, or social class as basis for personhood:

[W]hat a person acquires are status, habits, and personality or character traits: he, qua person acquires and thus becomes the subject of acquisition, and being thus prior to acquisition process, he cannot be defined by what he acquires. One is a person because of what he is, not because of what he acquires (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 108).

Gyekye is quick to note that there are some Akan expressions and judgments about the life and conduct of people that appear to give the impression that personhood is something that is acquired or bestowed upon one in virtue of taken responsibility in the community. For example, Onnye ‘nipa is a moral judgmental expression used among the Akan to describe someone who appears in his conduct to be wicked, bad, and ungenerous to others. In fact, a person of high moral standards or conduct would be described approvingly as oye onipa paa—literally, she is a real (human) person. In contrast, an individual who fails in his striving in the Akan community may be judged as onipa hun, which literally means “useless person,” an opprobrious expression.

According to Gyekye, however, these locutions should not be taken literally, but instead merely to reflect “status, habits, and personality or character traits” that one acquires over the course of the one's life, not personhood (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 108). For Gyekye, personhood is prior to and independent of such acquisitions. To conceive of personhood as a continuous property capable of degrees is to confuse conventional notions of status—a highly variable quantity—with the notion of personhood, a constant for all human persons.

The relationship between Wiredu's and Gyekye's analyses of personhood is brought out more clearly by considering the status of infants, vis-a-vis personhood. Akan linguistic conventions distinguish infants from full persons on the basis of their lacking intellectual and moral maturity. This aspect reflects the continuous character of personhood stressed by Wiredu. Yet the infant (or onipa) is also accorded a baseline level of respect by virtue of her possessing the okra. In that respect, an infant is entitled to the respect due to any other human, regardless of age, or capability. (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992)

As interpreted by Wiredu, these conventions clearly indicate that certain kinds of achievements—be they moral, intellectual, or social—are, for the Akan, constitutive of personhood, not merely indicators of such status. But at the same time, Wiredu takes those conventions to indicate the importance of the infant's status as a human, since it entitles the infant—and, for that matter, all other humans—to a minimum level of respect. The significance of humanity, he argues, is that it is a necessary (albeit not a sufficient) condition for personhood. From Wiredu's perspective, possession of the okra confers one condition of self-respect, not self-respect itself. To acquire self-respect itself, one must build upon that basis to achieve greater degrees of moral agency, and in so doing, achieving greater degrees of personhood.

The difference in status between those possessing merely the okra and those who have achieved a higher degree of personhood can be thought of in terms of the difference between the quality of moral agency and degrees of moral responsibility. Among the Akan, phrases like onye’ nipa (“he is not a person”) or onipa hun (“useless person”) indicate that an individual is a moral agent, one that is equal to all others with respect to having the potential for full personhood—albeit a potential that the individual has not realized. In fact, to pass a judgment that someone is an onye’ nipa is a way of respecting the person as a moral agent; not holding an adult responsible in this way would be tantamount to failing to respect their moral agency.

The two levels of personhood (one discrete, the other continuous) posited by Wiredu allows him to account for much of the social and linguistic data while also satisfying many of the moral intuitions underlying Gyekye's own purely discrete interpretation. Think again, for example, about the concept of a human being. As explicated by Wiredu, what makes an entity a human being is simply his or her possession of the okra. This can be translated into Gyekye's Kantian parlance as the claim that one's status as not just a human being but as a moral agent rests solely on one's capacity for reason. The normative implication of possession of the okra or the capacity for rationality is that the entity is entitled to an irreducible respect matched by irreducible rights—like the negative right not to be killed unjustly, or the positive right to be given what is needed to sustain life. The social bases of personhood supplement this minimum level of inherent respect. In this wise one can say that all persons are human beings but not all human beings are persons. At bottom, all human beings are potential moral agents. This is a status (capacity for rationality and morality) that a colt cannot be accorded because even a horse cannot become a moral agent. An infant can.

The implications of the two-tiered view of personhood presented by Wiredu are nicely illustrated by Akan practices following the death of an infant. Despite the obviously tragic circumstances of such a death, no funeral ceremonies are permitted in Akan society for infants. According to Wiredu, the reason for this naturally follows from the minimal level of personhood achieved by infants: It isn't that infants are not valued or cherished by the Akan; rather, it is that they are just not the kind of individual for whom such a ceremony is appropriate. The Akan funeral is a form of send-off for the departing soul on the journey to the ancestral world—a journey for which a child does not qualify because she hasn't attained personhood. Thus, the death of a child is not a time for mourning. Instead, parents are expected to behave normally and cheerfully.

The different treatment accorded to deceased adults and children is a manifestation of what we can refer to as the Akan theory of selective reincarnation, a view that postulates that otherwise deserving humans who have failed to fulfill their potential for achieving a higher degree of personhood a second chance in the world.[3] For the Akan, those who die in infancy are obvious candidates for this form of reincarnation, since they have failed to make good on their potential but not through any lack of effort on their part. In that respect they are what Wiredu calls ‘limbo people,’ humans with an untapped potential for full personhood and the opportunity to return to life to make good on that potential.

On its face, the theory of selective reincarnation may appear to be nothing more than a curious feature of Akan cosmology. As presented by Wiredu, however, it is part of a general process of making moral agents. Appreciating the role of selective reincarnation among the Akan thus requires acknowledging the whole process by which morally responsible agents come to be, as well as how individuals become motivated to be moral. Critical to this appreciation is the understanding that the entity underlying this process exists beyond the life of a physical human being. The okra that forms the ‘core’ of the human being (and the returns through the process of selective reincarnation) precedes one's life as a human and constitutes one end of this process. At the other end is the Akan ancestor, the culmination of the process of becoming a person whose memory serves as a moral exemplar to the living that guides the moral journey of the Akan. Those who become ancestors are those who, through their imagination, intelligence, and empathetic identification with their fellow human beings, excel not in spite of but because of all the challenges that are put before them. After having lived a full life, they obtain their ‘ticket’ (to use Wiredu's imagery) to the ancestral world and are reincarnated into service-ancestors.

Gyekye rejects this explanation, along with Wiredu's analysis of Akan personhood. He argues instead that any such explanation of Akan social and linguistic conventions must presume the personhood of even the youngest human:

[A] human person is a person whatever his age or social status. Personhood may reach its full realization in community, but it is not acquired or yet to be achieved as one goes along in society. What a person acquires are status, habits, and personality or character traits: he, qua person, thus becomes the subject of acquisition, and being thus prior to the acquisition, he cannot be defined by what he acquires. One is a person because of what he is not because of what he has acquired (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 108 note 22).

For Gyekye, then, differences with respect to personhood cannot account for the difference in how the Akan deal with the death of infants and adults. He prefers instead to account for these differences in terms of the utilitarian value of cultural practices such as the different treatment of the deaths of infants and adults. The most obvious reason for the difference, according to Gyekye, is that the size and magnitude of death celebration depends on the social status of the deceased individual.[4] The death of a wealthy and well-connected person will naturally call for a more elaborate ceremony than the death of a newborn, quite independently of their status as persons.

This is not to say that Gyekye denies the role that the idea of reincarnation plays for the Akan in the formation of persons. For him, however, the idea of reincarnation (and of the graduated concept of personhood) is less a factual account of personhood than a moral narrative, such as the ones postulated by Aquinas, Kant, Bentham, and John Stuart Mill to explain and justify moral precepts. The central narratives of Western moral philosophy (such as the social contract) provide vivid images that motivate individuals to act in certain ways. In the same way, the Akan narratives of reincarnation and personhood serve to reinforce socially valuable traits and practices such as cooperation and industriousness.

From this perspective, the sage Akan elders who insure death celebrations for full persons grasp what a casual onlooker might often overlook—namely, that the most important effects of a death celebration are on the onlookers, rather than the deceased. What might be called the expressive content of public action—the message to the Akan community conveyed by the ritual and symbolic performance, the public utterances of the Akan leaders—is the most important effect of such ceremonies. These ceremonies are a powerful symbolic mechanism for both expressing and shaping the values and beliefs of the Akan people. Thus, the Akan may abstain from mourning a rapist or a murderer to express their collective abhorrence of the offending act.

2. Achieving Personhood

The criteria for achieving personhood in Akan society are based on two kinds of considerations. The first is the natural fact that we tend to care for our kin and feel responsible for those with whom we are in close reciprocal relationships. The second is that societies need some way to encourage and support members' feelings of empathy for those beyond their families.

According to Wiredu, in Akan society marriage and procreation are a necessary, but not a sufficient condition of personhood. It is important that an individual's household be administered by a joint equal partnership of spouses and that the children are healthy and well nourished. If an individual were to take responsibility for the upbringing of distant relatives or were to shoulder the burden of rearing non-relatives and allow his household to become a magnet for relatives and extended family, then such an individual will score very high in personhood, as indicated by references to him as oye ‘nipa, meaning, he is “a real person” indeed. According to Wiredu,

More than this one is required to make concrete material contributions to the well-being of one's lineage, which is quite a sizeable group of people. A series of events in the lineage, such as marriage, births, illnesses and deaths, gives rise to urgent obligations. The individual who is able to meet these in a timely and adequate manner is the true person (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 107 note 2).

Individuals failing to meet these standards attract opprobrium. Other members of Akan society will point to them and say onnye’ nipa (“he is not a real person”). As a literal rendition from the Akan language, this expression could simply mean that the person is not doing her part.

Criteria pertaining to one's relationship to those in the community beyond one's immediate family include being an active and unstinted participant in community projects (such as building bridges, constructing roads, and cleaning public spaces, as well as attending to the death, burial and mourning of a deceased member of the community). Along with activity in community projects is involvement in civic rituals (such as fellowship associations, rotating credit groups, extended family gatherings, secret societies, hunting groups, village watch groups, and civil militia groups) that have face-to-face meetings. Requiring participation in these practices, in effect, solves what economists refer to as “free rider” problems by allowing information about each person's efforts and contributions to spread quickly through the community. Everyone takes mental note of those missing from such events and repeated foot-dragging during community work is rebuked. Although the emphasis is on negative scoring, when individuals score very high they receive community titles that, on their death, bestows upon them special honors from other members. These departed individuals are treated as living on in a social sense, reincarnated in the ancestral world where they continue to guard the living. While there is no limit to how high one can rise on the scale that indicates degrees of personhood achieved, there is a limit to how far one can fall.

An adult ‘do little’ might descend to the level of simply a human with only the basic dignity and the unconditional rights inherent in that status. The fall ends there, because all individuals possess an okra which sets a lower bounds on how far they may descend on the scale of personhood. In this sense all humans have moral value that entitles them to basic dignity and unconditional rights whether they have attained personhood or not.

3. Individual and Community

Wiredu's critics have argued that he fails to recognize that individuals have their own wills and can, at least to some degree, choose their own goals. His position seems to endorse a form of ‘tyranny’ of the community over the individual. Gyekye insists that this is wrong—both descriptively and normatively (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 105 note 20). He agrees that “the whole gamut of values and practices in which the individual is necessarily embedded is a creation of cultural community and is part of his history” and that this indicates a close relationship between the communal structure and individual's goals (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 112 note 20). Yet this close relationship hardly implies that the communal structure is the only factor the individual is required to consider in analyzing these goals. According to Gyekye,

[I]ndividual persons as participants in the shared values and practices, and enmeshed in the web of communal relationships, may find that aspects of those cultural givens are inelegant, undignifying or unenlightening and can thoughtfully be questioned and evaluated. The evaluation may result in individual's affirming or amending or refining existing communal goals, values and practices; but it may or could also result in the individual's total rejection of them. The possibility of reevaluation means, surely that the person cannot be absorbed by the communal or cultural apparatuses (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 112 note 20).

By reserving for individuals at least the potential for responding to or rejecting the communal consensus, Gyekye locates a source of identity that is in some meaningful way independent of any particular society. This is a self that can “participate in the determination or definition of its own identity.”[5] (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 112).

Gyekye correctly recognizes that the possibility of self-criticism requires that one be able to distance oneself from one's own community or circumstances: However, it is not clear that this is a particularly serious problem for Wiredu's account, for even Wiredu allows that individuals can critically assess their communal values. It is, after all, this ability to look at one's culture with new (and critical) eyes that makes moral reformers (of which there have been many among the Akan) possible. These moral reformers may stand against the communal values but the ones that may make an impact and be selected for reincarnation as an ancestor is one that give reasons to reject or revise values that persuade the community. Understood in this way, moral reformers not only have a place in Akan society, but qualify as persons with secured ‘tickets’ to the ancestral world.

4. Responsibility and Free Will

An important condition for achieving personhood is that the agent has the ability to act on the basis of rational reflection. Wiredu indicates what is meant by “damaged personhood” by pointing out that an Akan adult of unpredictable behavior will bring the judgment that “so-and-so is not a person (onye ‘onipa),” (Wiredu 1992, 108) a comment that leaves open for further investigation whether the damage was done by psychological or environmental factors, or by brute bad luck. “The problem in Akan is ‘when is an individual responsible?’ And the answer in this brief account of the Akan approach to deviant conduct is that an individual is responsible to the extent that his conduct can be modified through rational persuasion or moral correction” (Wiredu 1992, 108–09). Wiredu concludes that once the cause of the unpredictable behavior is determined, irresponsibility may change into nonresponsibility, for in the Akan philosophy of person, where there is free will there is responsibility.

Since there is a merit component to personhood, it is relevant to talk of the distribution of the opportunity of achieving personhood so as to secure respect over and above the threshold respect that is due to human beings in virtue of their status as human beings. Goods like positions of prestige that are conferred to individuals who have achieved personhood are limited by their very nature, but given equality of opportunity, no person should be denied from the outset the chance to secure those goods. Here, then, is a tension, for what does the society do to those who are born handicapped or crippled in such a way that they are not in the position to achieve personhood in ways that able bodied people can? What happened to Shijuruh born in a family of thieves and in a neighborhood full of burglers? Surely, Shijuruh did not choose to be born in that family much less in the neighborhood and this may affect his performance in an attempt to achieve personhood. In other words how does one account for equality in unequal circumstances?

The answer provided by the Akan, according to Wiredu's interpretation, is to conceive of the status required for personhood as defined relative to an adult individual's starting position or initial capacity. Wiredu explains that, for example, an adult who behaves erratically or in an immature manner would be presumed to have failed to be a full person.[6] Such a presumption, however, is merely a presumption, an inference drawn from the superficial qualities of the individual's action relative to what could be expected of the average individual. If the individual changes his or her behavior, that inference may be revised. If, however, the behavior persists, the individual's family members may summon an expert—a geomancer—capable of determining if he or she is acting out of free will.

Provided that the behavior is found not to be deliberate or that she is not acting from her free will, the community will gather and it will be said of her a message of this tenure: “It is not her eyes, it is not her head, it is not her mind,” i.e., she is not responsible for her erratic actions. In making this judgment, the community will be changing irresponsibility to non-responsibility. This is the way the Akan has for equalizing background conditions of individuals in their attempt at dealing with the difficulties of equality in unequal circumstances. It is against this background that we can begin to make sense of Wiredu's claim that freewill and responsibility are two sides of the same coin among the Akan.

5. Personhood and Social Status

Many commentators agree with Gyekye that the essential ingredient of a human is what the Akan refers to as okra. There is, however, some disagreement over the nature of okra. According to Gyekye,

the okra is that which constitute the innermost self, the essence, of the individual person. Okra is individual's life, for which reason it is usually referred to as okrateasefo, that is, the living soul, a seeming tautology that yet is significant. The expression is intended to emphasize that okra is identical with life. The okra is the transmitter of the individual's destiny (fate: nkrabea). It is explained as a spark of the Supreme Being. The presence of this divine essence in a human being may have been the basis of the Akan proverb, “All men are the children of God; no one is the child of the earth (Gyekye 1987, 85).

While Gyekye maintains that okra can be accurately rendered into English as ‘soul,’ Wiredu insists upon drawing a somewhat more subtle distinction between these concepts. For Wiredu okra is “that whose presence in the body means life and whose absence means death and which also received the individual's destiny from God” (Wiredu 1983, 119). Of pivotal importance to their disagreement is the normative implication of the presence of okra. The normative implication is that okra bestows on its possessors basic irreducible respect matched by basic irreducible human rights.

Like Wiredu, Gyekye recognizes that there are standards for which individual persons aim that have an important role in how people think of themselves and their place in society. Unlike Wiredu, however, Gyekye denies that facts about a person's ambitions or goals add or subtract from that individual's status as a person,

The individual may fail in his strivings and, in the Akan community, for example, may consequently be judged as a “useless person” (onipa hun), an opprobrium term. But it must be noted that what the individual would be striving for in all these exertions is some social status not personhood. The striving are in fact part of the individual's self-expression, an exercise of a capacity he has a person. Even if at the end of the day he failed to attain the expected status, his personhood would not for that reason diminish, even though he may lose social respect in the eyes of the community. So that it is social status not personhood at which individuals could fail (Wiredu & Gyekye 1992, 111 note 20).

Instead, then, of treating persons as a kind of individual that admits of degrees, Gyekye employs criteria of personhood that are quite independent of individual aims and actions. He maintains that, while persons may differ with respect to how they are treated in a community, this difference is a matter of the social status accorded each, not facts about their status as persons.

6. Conclusion

Personhood defined in terms of social achievement and personal relationships aptly serve to establish those networks conducive to creating the flow of information and obligation necessary for the promotion of communal trust. So conceived, the Akan notion of personhood helps to support social cooperation and provides a framework superbly suited to resolving collective action problems. The Akan have fashioned a means of motivating individuals to contribute to the social good while still insuring that the moral value of even the most unproductive individual is retained. For the Akan, personhood is the reward for contributing to the community and the basis of the individual's moral worth is located in an independent source—a common humanity.

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