#### Supplement to Analysis

## Early Modern Conceptions of Analysis

- 1. Introduction to Supplement
- 2. Descartes and Analytic Geometry
- 3. British Empiricism
- 4. Leibniz
- 5. Kant

### 1. Introduction to Supplement

This supplement sketches how a reductive form of analysis emerged in Descartes’s development of analytic geometry, and elaborates on the way in which decompositional conceptions of analysis came to the fore in the early modern period, as outlined in §4 of the main document.

### 2. Descartes and Analytic Geometry

In a famous passage in his replies to Mersenne’s objections to
the *Meditations*, in discussing the distinction between
analysis and synthesis, Descartes remarks that “it is analysis
which is the best and truest method of instruction, and it was this
method alone which I employed in my *Meditations*”
(*PW*, II, 111
[Full Quotation]).
According to Descartes, it is analysis rather than synthesis that is
of the greater value, since it shows “how the thing in question
was discovered”, and he accuses the ancient geometers of
keeping the techniques of analysis to themselves “like a sacred
mystery” (*ibid*.; cf. *PW*, I, 17
[Quotation]).
Euclid’s *Elements* is indeed set out in
‘synthetic’ form, but it is unfair to suggest that
someone who worked through the text would not gain practice in
analysis, although admittedly there are no rules of analysis
explicitly articulated.

However, it was Descartes’s own development of
‘analytic’ geometry—as opposed to what,
correspondingly, then became known as the ‘synthetic’
geometry of Euclid—that made him aware of the importance of
analysis, and which opened up a whole new dimension to analytic
methodology. Significantly, Descartes’s *Geometry* was
first published together with the *Discourse* and advertised
as an essay in the method laid out in the *Discourse*. The
*Geometry* opens boldly: “Any problem in geometry can
easily be reduced to such terms that a knowledge of the lengths of
certain straight lines is sufficient for its construction.”
(*G*, 2.) Descartes goes on to show how the arithmetical
operations of addition, subtraction, multiplication, division and the
extraction of roots can be represented geometrically. For example,
multiplication of two lines *BD* and *BC* can be
carried out by joining them as in the diagram below by *AC*,
with *AB* taken as the unit length. If *DE* is then
drawn parallel to *AC*, *BE* is the required result.
(Since the ratio of * BD* to BE is the same as the
ratio of

*AB*to

*BC*, the two triangles

*BDE*and

*BAC*being similar,

*BD*×

*BC*=

*AB*×

*BE*=

*BE*, if

*AB*is the unit length.)

Problems can indeed then be broken down into simpler problems
involving the construction of individual straight lines, encouraging
the decompositional conception of analysis. But what is of greatest
importance in Descartes’s *Geometry* is the use made of
algebra. Although the invention of algebra too can be traced back to
the ancient Greeks, most notably, Diophantus, who had introduced
numerical variables (‘*x*’,
‘*x*²’, etc.), it was only in the 16th
century that algebra finally established itself. Vieta, in a work of
1591, added schematic letters to numerical variables, so that
quadratic equations, for example, could then be represented (in the
form ‘*ax*² + *bx* + *c* = 0’),
yielding results of greater generality. Algebra was specifically
called an ‘art of analysis’, and it was in the work of
Descartes (as well as Fermat) that its enormous potential was
realised. It did indeed prove a powerful tool of analysis, enabling
complex geometrical figures to be represented algebraically, allowing
the resources of algebra and arithmetic to be employed in solving the
transformed geometrical problems.

The philosophical significance was no less momentous. For in reducing
geometrical problems to arithmetical and algebraic problems, the need
to appeal to geometrical ‘intuition’ was removed. Indeed,
as Descartes himself makes clear in ‘Rule Sixteen’,
representing everything algebraically—abstracting from specific
numerical magnitudes as well as from geometrical figures—allows
us to appreciate just what is essential (*PW*, I, 66-9.) The
aim is not just to solve a problem, or to come out with the right
answer, but to gain an insight into *how* the problem is
solved, or *why* it is the right answer. What algebraic
representation reveals is the structure of the solution in its
appropriate generality. (Cf. Gaukroger 1989, ch. 3.) Of course,
‘intuition’ is still required, according to Descartes, to
attain the ‘clear and distinct’ ideas of the fundamental
truths and relations that lie at the base of what we are doing, but
this was not seen as something that we could just appeal to without
rigorous training in the whole Cartesian method.

The further application of algebraic techniques, in the context of the development of function theory, was to lead to the creation by Leibniz and Newton of the differential and integral calculus—which, in mathematics, came to be called ‘analysis’. In turn, it was the project of rigorizing the calculus in the nineteenth century that played a key role in the work of Frege and Russell, in which function theory was extended to logic itself and ‘analytic’ philosophy was founded (see §6 of the main document).

### 3. British Empiricism

The decompositional conception of analysis, as applied to ideas or
concepts, was particularly characteristic of British empiricism. As
Locke put it, “all our complex Ideas are ultimately resolvable
into simple Ideas, of which they are compounded, and originally made
up, though perhaps their immediate Ingredients, as I may so say, are
also complex Ideas” (*Essay*, II, xxii, 9
[Full Quotation]).
The aim was then to provide an account of these ideas, explaining how
they arise, showing what simpler ideas make up our complex ideas
(e.g., of substance) and distinguishing the various mental operations
performed on them in generating what knowledge and beliefs we have.
Locke only uses the term ‘Analysis’, however, once in the
entire *Essay* (shortly after the remark just quoted). Perhaps
he was conscious of its meaning in ancient Greek geometry, making him
hesitant to use it more widely, but it is still significant that when
he does, he does so in precisely the sense of
‘decomposition’
[Quotation].
Locke tends to talk, though, of ‘combining’ or
‘composing’ rather than ‘synthesizing’
complex ideas from simpler ideas, and of ‘separating’ or
‘resolving’ rather than ‘analyzing’ them into
simpler ideas. But in the period following Locke,
‘analysis’ came to be used more and more for the process
of ‘resolving’ complexes into their constituents.

### 4. Leibniz

Leibniz occupies a pivotal point in the history of conceptions of
analysis. Well versed in both classical and modern thought, at the
forefront of both mathematics and philosophy, he provided a grand
synthesis of existing conceptions of analysis and at the same time
paved the way for the dominance of the decompositional conception.
The key to all of this is what can be called his *containment
principle*. In a letter to Arnauld, he writes: “in every
affirmative true proposition, necessary or contingent, universal or
singular, the notion of the predicate is contained in some way in
that of the subject, *praedicatum inest subjecto*. Or else I
do not know what truth is.” (*PW*, 62; cf. *PT*,
87-8
[Quotation].)
If this containment of the predicate in the subject could then be
made explicit, according to Leibniz, a proof of the proposition could
thereby be achieved. Proof thus proceeds by *analyzing* the
subject, the aim being to reduce the proposition to what Leibniz
calls an ‘identity’—by successive applications of
the rule of ‘substitution of equivalents’, utilizing an
appropriate definition. A proposition expresses an identity, in
Leibniz’s terminology, if the predicate is explicitly either
identical with or included in the subject (cf. *PT*, 87-8
[Quotation]).
The following proof of ‘4 = 2 + 2’ illustrates the
procedure (cf. Leibniz *NE*, IV, vii, 10):

(a) 4 = 2 + 2 (b) 3 + 1 = 2 + 2 (by the definition ‘4 = 3 + 1’) (c) (2 + 1) + 1 = 2 + 2 (by the definition ‘3 = 2 + 1’) (d) 2 + (1 + 1) = 2 + 2 (by associativity) (e) 2 + 2 = 2 + 2 (by the definition ‘2 = 1 + 1’)

The final line of the proof is an ‘identity’ in
Leibniz’s sense, and the important point about an identity is
that it is ‘self-evident’ or ‘known through
itself’, i.e., can be simply ‘seen’ to be true (cf.
Leibniz *PW*, 15; *LP*, 62). It would be tempting to
talk here of identities being ‘intuited’ as true, but
Leibniz tends to use the word ‘intuition’ for the
immediate grasp of the *content* of a concept (cf.
*MKTI*, 23-7), whereas the point about knowing the truth of
identities is that we can do so without grasping the content of any
of the terms. To the extent that we can still judge that such a
proposition is true, our knowledge is what Leibniz calls
‘blind’ or ‘symbolic’ rather than
‘intuitive’ (*ibid*., 25).

Indeed, it was precisely because proofs could be carried out without
appeal to intuition that Leibniz was so attracted to the symbolic
method. As he remarked in the *New Essays*, the great value of
algebra, or the generalized algebra that he called the ‘art of
symbols’, lay in the way it ‘unburdens the
imagination’ (*NE*, 488). If proofs could be generated
purely mechanically, then they were freed from the vagaries of our
own mental processes (cf. *NE*, 75, 412). For Leibniz, the
status of a proposition—its truth or falsity, necessity or
contingency—was dependent not on its mode of apprehension (as
it was for Descartes and Locke), which could vary from person to
person, but on its method of proof, which was an objectively
determinable matter.

Leibniz’s conception of analysis can thus be seen as combining
aspects of Plato’s method of division, in the centrality
accorded to the definition of concepts, of ancient Greek geometry and
Aristotelian logic, in the emphasis placed on proof and working back
to first principles, and of Cartesian geometry and the new algebra,
in the value attributed to symbolic formulations. Furthermore, we can
see how, on Leibniz’s view, analysis and synthesis are strictly
complementary (cf. *USA*, 16-17
[Quotation]).
For since we are concerned only with identities, all steps are
reversible. As long as the right notation and appropriate definitions
and principles are provided, one can move with equal facility in
either an ‘analytic’ or a ‘synthetic’
direction, i.e., in the example above, either from (a) to (e) or from
(e) to (a). If a *characteristica universalis* or ideal
logical language could thus be created, we would have a system that
could function not only as an international language and scientific
notation but also as a *calculus ratiocinator* that provided
both a logic of proof and a logic of discovery. Leibniz’s
vision may have been absurdly ambitious, but the ideal was to
influence many subsequent philosophers, most notably, Frege and
Russell.

### 5. Kant

The decompositional conception of analysis, as applied to concepts,
reached its high-point in the work of Kant, although it has continued
to have an influence ever since, most notably, in Russell’s and
Moore’s early philosophies (see
§3
and
§4
of the supplementary document on Conceptions of Analysis in Analytic
Philosophy). As his pre-critical writings show, Kant simply takes
over the Leibnizian conception of analysis, and even though, in his
critical period, he comes to reject the Leibnizian view that all
truths are, in Leibniz’s sense, ‘analytic’, he
retains the underlying conception of analysis. He simply recognizes a
further class of ‘synthetic’ truths, and within this, a
subclass of ‘synthetic *a priori*’ truths, which
it is the main task of the *Critique of Pure Reason* to
elucidate.

As the ‘Introduction’ to the *Critique* shows
(A6-7/B10-11), the decompositional conception of analysis lies at the
base of Kant’s distinction between analytic and synthetic
judgements. We can formulate Kant’s ‘official’
criterion for analyticity as follows:

(ANO) A true judgement of the form ‘AisB’ isanalyticif and only if the predicateBis contained in the subjectA.

The problem with this criterion, though, or at least, with the way
that Kant glosses it, is obvious. For who is the judge of whether a
predicate is or is not ‘contained’—however
‘covertly’—in the subject? According to Leibniz,
for example, all truths, even contingent ones, are
‘analytic’: it is just that, in the case of a contingent
truth, only God can know what is ‘covertly contained’ in
the subject, i.e., know its analysis. Kant’s talk of the
connection between subject and predicate in analytic judgements being
‘thought through identity’, however, suggests a more
objective criterion—a logical rather than phenomenological one.
This is made more explicit later on in the *Critique*, when
Kant specifies the principle of contradiction as ‘the highest
principle of all analytic judgements’ (A150-1/B189-91). The
alternative criterion can be formulated thus:

(ANL) A true judgement of the form ‘AisB’ isanalyticif and only if its negation ‘Ais notB’ is self-contradictory.

However, in anything other than trivial cases (such as Leibnizian
‘identities’), it will still require
‘analysis’ to show that ‘*A* is not
*B*’ is self-contradictory, and for any given step of
‘analysis’, it seems that we would still have to rely on
what is ‘thought’ in the relevant concept. So it is not
clear that (ANL) is an improvement within
Kant’s system.

Whatever criterion we might offer to capture Kant’s notion of
analyticity, the fundamental point of contrast between
‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ judgements, rooted
in the decompositional conception of analysis, lies in the former
merely ‘clarifying’ and the latter
‘extending’ our knowledge. It was for this reason that
Kant regarded mathematical propositions as synthetic, since he was
convinced—rightly—that mathematics advances our
knowledge. This is made clear in chapter 1 of the
‘Transcendental Doctrine of Method’ (*CPR*,
A716-7/B744-5), where Kant argues that no amount of
‘analysis’ of the concept of a triangle will enable a
philosopher to show that the sum of the angles of a triangle equals
two right angles
[Quotation].
It takes a geometer to demonstrate this, by actually constructing the
triangle and drawing appropriate auxiliary lines (as Euclid does in
I, 32 of the *Elements*). Kant writes that “To
*construct* a concept means to exhibit *a priori* the
intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741); and such
‘intuition’ is also needed in constructing the auxiliary
lines. According to Kant, then, the whole process is one of
*synthesis*. But the two activities mentioned here are both
part of what the ancient geometers called *analysis* (see
§2
of the supplementary document on Ancient Conceptions of Analysis).
What is remarkable about Kant’s conception is the way that it
has inverted the original conception of analysis in ancient Greek
geometry—or at least collapsed together into
‘synthesis’ what had previously been distinguished.
‘Analysis’ is left with such a small role to play that it
is not surprising that it is condemned as useless.