Supplement to Analysis

Medieval and Renaissance Conceptions of Analysis

1. Medieval Philosophy

In the supplementary document on Ancient Conceptions of Analysis, three particular sources of conceptions of analysis were identified—ancient Greek geometry, Plato’s dialogues and Aristotle’s Analytics. The interconnections between these alone are complex; but there were other influential conceptions in antiquity as well—most notably, Galen’s amalgam of previous methodologies in the context of medicine, and the Neoplatonists’ theological transformation of Plato’s method of division. Given this complexity, and the fragmentary nature of the material upon which writers in the medieval period drew, it is not surprising that making sense of medieval methodologies is an interpretive nightmare.

The interpretive intricacies can be illustrated here by taking the case of Thomas Aquinas (c.1225-74). In a recent paper (1994), Eileen Sweeney has argued that there are three notions of resolutio—to use the Latin term that translated the original Greek word ‘analusis’—in Aquinas’s work. The first is resolution as a kind of division, understood as a process of decomposition, modelled on the movement down a classificatory tree in Plato’s method of division, whereby a genus is ‘broken down’ into its constituent species. The second is resolution as reversion (i.e., regression), in effect understood in opposition to the first, since it is modelled on the movement up a classificatory tree towards the higher Forms. (For more on the connection between these two conceptions, see §4 of the main document.) The third is resolution as problem-solving, understood as what is prior to the systematic act of demonstration (synthesis). The first derives from Plato, and more specifically, Sweeney suggests, Calcidius’s Commentary on the Timaeus, which also owes something to Aristotle. The second shows the influence of Neoplatonism, according to which all things are to be resolved into their principles and ultimately traced back to the One (God). The third (as shown in §2 of the main document) has its roots in ancient Greek geometry, again mediated through the works of Aristotle. If this account is right, then it suggests, at the very least, that there are certain tensions in Aquinas’s discussions of methodology, tensions that reflect the different traditions which he was attempting to bring together.

However, perhaps the richest and most interesting text for exploring conceptions of analysis in medieval philosophy is the Summulae de Dialectica (SD) of John Buridan (c.1300-c.1360). Ostensibly a commentary on Peter of Spain’s Tractatus or Summulae Logicales, it is in fact a systematic compendium of medieval logic, going considerably beyond Peter’s work, and amounting to some 1000 pages (in its first complete English translation of 2001). Comprising nine Treatises, the key Treatise for our purposes is the eighth, entitled ‘On Demonstrations’. Buridan here distinguishes between divisions, definitions and demonstrations, which can be seen as illustrating the distinction drawn in §1 of the main document between decompositional, interpretive and regressive analysis. The bulk of the Treatise (chs. 3-12) is concerned with demonstration, explaining and elaborating on Aristotle’s account in the Posterior Analytics (as outlined in the supplement on Ancient Conceptions of Analysis, §4). Central to this is Aristotle’s distinction between understanding ‘the fact’ and understanding ‘the reason why’—between demonstration quia and demonstration propter quid, in medieval terms (see esp. SD, Tr. 8, chs. 8-9). Here the regressive conception of analysis is dominant. Buridan talks, for example, of ‘simple’ demonstrations being ones that are not ‘analyzable’ or ‘resolvable’ into prior demonstrations (SD, 8.5.2), and of demonstration quia as a ‘reversion’ from effect to cause (SD, 8.9.3). But the discussion of demonstration is prefaced by two chapters on division and definition, and here Plato’s influence is more manifest. Buridan characterises ‘division’ as the separation of a whole into its parts (SD, 8.1.2), and distinguishes various kinds of division, one kind being the division of a genus into its species, which was Plato’s method of division. His account of definition too has its roots in Plato’s work, and in particular, the elenctic method of Socrates (cf. the supplement on Ancient Conceptions of Analysis, §3). But it also draws on Aristotle’s work, and most significantly of all, anticipates the interpretive conception of analysis of twentieth-century analytic philosophy.

Buridan’s treatment of definition would not look out of place in a modern textbook. He offers a succinct statement of criteria of adequacy, and draws a clear distinction between four types of definition—nominal, quidditative (i.e., real), causal and descriptive. The interpretive conception of analysis comes out in his account of nominal definition. Buridan writes that “A nominal definition [diffinitio explicans quid nominis] is an expression convertibly explaining what thing or things the definitum [i.e., the term defined] signifies or connotes, and properly speaking it is called ‘interpretation’”, adding that “here I take ‘interpretation’ for the explicit analysis [expositio] of the signification of a word or expression that is being interpreted”. The term ‘philosopher’, for example, is interpreted as ‘lover of wisdom’, and the sentence ‘Only man is risible’ as the conjunction ‘Man is risible, and nothing other than man is risible’. (SD, 8.2.3; cf. Tr. 6, ch. 3.) Further examples can be found in the ninth and final Treatise, entitled ‘Sophismata’, although here the term ‘interpretation’ is not itself used. In this Treatise, Buridan illustrates how interpretive analysis can be put to work in clarifying ‘sophismata’—sentences that are philosophically puzzling or instructive. He shows, for example, how ‘Some donkey every man sees’ is ambiguous, suggesting the two formulations ‘Some donkey every man sees’ and ‘Every man sees some donkey’ to bring out what we would now explain in terms of the different scope of the two quantifiers ‘some’ and ‘every’ (cf. SD, Tr. 9, ch. 3, seventh sophism and reply).

As used here, the quantifiers ‘only’, ‘some’ and ‘every’ are examples of what medieval logicians called ‘syncategorematic’ expressions (or uses of expressions)—expressions that signify nothing by themselves, but only when taken together with some other expression (in this case, ‘man’ or ‘donkey’). From the twelfth century onwards, there was much discussion of the logic of syncategoremata, and exposition (expositio), i.e., interpretive analysis, became one of the main tools of elucidation. From the middle of the fourteenth century, until the demise of medieval logic in the sixteenth century, exponibilia—exponible sentences, i.e., sentences requiring exposition—became a subject in itself for systematic treatment. Although its authorship is uncertain, the Tractatus exponibilium of 1489 is representative of such treatment. An exponible sentence is here defined in terms of syncategoremata: “An exponible proposition [propositio exponibilis] is a proposition that has an obscure sense requiring exposition in virtue of some syncategorema occurring either explicitly or included within some word.” (Tr. in Kretzmann 1982, 215.)

Kretzmann (1982) gives several examples of sophismata involving syncategoremata to illustrate the way in which their treatment developed in the later medieval period. One example involves the exceptive term ‘praeter’:

(S) Socrates twice sees every man except Plato. [Socrates bis videt omnem hominem praeter Platonem.]

This sentence too is ambiguous, depending on the scope of the syncategoremata ‘twice’ and ‘except’. The two interpretations might be represented as follows:

(S#) With the exception of Plato (Socrates twice sees every man).

(S*) Twice (Socrates sees every man except Plato).

The difference can be appreciated by considering the case in which, on one occasion, Socrates sees everyone including Plato, and on another occasion, sees everyone excluding Plato, i.e., where Socrates sees Plato once and everyone else twice. (S#) would then be true, but (S*) false. Various diagnoses of the ambiguity can be found in the literature on syncategoremata from the twelfth to the sixteenth centuries. The scope distinction is recognised, for example, by Bacon in his Sincategoreumata of the early thirteenth century (cf. Kretzmann 1982, 219). But the role of exposition is perhaps best illustrated in the Sophismata of Albert of Saxony, dating from the middle of the fourteenth century. In diagnosing the ambiguity, Albert recognises that (S) implies a simpler, equally ambiguous sentence, which we might formulate as follows:

(SP) Socrates did not twice see Plato.

Here is what he then says:

Now in “Socrates did not see Plato twice” the whole predicate [“did see Plato twice”] is denied of the whole subject; but in “Socrates twice did not see Plato” not the whole predicate but a part of it is denied of the subject, because the term “twice” remains affirmed. (Tr. in Kretzmann 1982, 223.)

Here we might represent the two interpretations as follows:

(SP#) Socrates did not (see Plato twice). [Socrates non videt bis Platonem.]

(SP*) Socrates twice (did not see Plato). [Socrates bis non videt Platonem.]

Here the ambiguity depends on the scope of ‘twice’ (‘bis’) and ‘not’ (‘non’), which Albert recognises in the way he formulates the two alternatives. Albert may not have been able to draw on the resources of modern quantificational logic to formalise the two interpretations, but he clearly has some understanding of the idea of scope.

The medieval literature on sophismata, syncategoremata and exponibilia, then, shows that interpretive analysis had an important role to play long before it became a central tool of modern analytic philosophy. In modern analytic philosophy, interpretive analysis is used, in particular, in eliminativist or reductive projects—in minimizing our ontological commitments, or revealing what our underlying ontological commitments are (see the supplement on Conceptions of Analysis in Analytic Philosophy). But this too is anticipated in the medieval period—most notably, in the nominalist philosophies of Ockham and Buridan. Ockham is the originator of the principle now known as Ockham’s Razor, and Buridan is often seen as having practised what Ockham preached. (On Ockham’s nominalism, see the sections on Ockham’s Razor and Exposition or Parsing Away Entities in the entry on William of Ockham, and on the similarities and differences between Ockham and Buridan, see the section on Language in the entry on John Buridan. Cf. also Klima 2001, xxvii f.) The combination of interpretive analysis and reductionism, in the context of the development of modern logic, may be what characterises one of the central strands in modern analytic philosophy, but the first two elements can also be found in medieval philosophy.

Annotated Bibliography, §3.1

2. Renaissance Philosophy

During the Renaissance, with the rediscovery and translation of ancient Greek texts that had simply not been known in Christian Europe in medieval times, awareness gradually grew of the variety of methodologies in antiquity. This prompted widespread discussion of methodology, inspired by the very problem of how to deal with the ancient texts. Indeed, methodology itself became one of the hottest issues of all, as Renaissance thinkers fought to make sense of their great predecessors. Key figures in this debate are Petrus Ramus (1515-72) and Jacopo Zabarella (1533-89), who can be taken as representative of the two poles between which debate took place.

Ramus was a savage critic of Aristotle, and proposed to replace the subtleties and complexities of Aristotelian logic with the single method of humanist dialectic, conceived as the means of systematizing knowledge to facilitate learning and its practical use. Ramus saw Aristotle’s Organon (or logical works) as a confused body of doctrine, which it was his task to reorganise for pedagogical purposes, based on the simple principle that the general comes before the specific, the whole before the part. Utilizing Plato’s method of dichotomous division, Ramist works became famous (or infamous) for their elaborate tables and tree diagrams. Although Ramus drew the familiar distinction between discovery and demonstration, or as he called it, invention and disposition, the latter was clearly of greater importance to him than the former. According to Ramus, the discoveries had already been made by the ancients; the task was only to present them properly. (Cf. Gilbert 1960, ch. 5.)

This suggests that Ramus rejected the need for analysis, as understood in the Aristotelian tradition. But this is obscured somewhat by the fact that he takes ‘analysis’ in a different sense. In logic, Ramus writes, “analysis is the marshaling (examen) of the argument, enunciation, syllogism, method, in short of the whole art of logic, as is prescribed in the First Book of the Analytics” (quoted by Ong 1958, 263). Something analogous holds in other fields. As Ong notes, “Analysis, for Ramus, is thus at root a way of operating didactically upon a text. It belongs not to an art, but to usus or exercise” (1958, 264). It was complemented by genesis, rather than ‘synthesis’ in the sense of ‘demonstration’. Having learnt one’s lessons through analysis, one could then apply those lessons: “Genesis is not the study of given examples as analysis is, but is rather the making of a new work” (quoted in Ong 1958, 264). For Ramus, then, ‘analysis’ was not a method of solving problems, and if it can be understood as a method of discovery, then it only involved learning what was already known. It is in this way that ‘analysis’ and ‘synthesis’ in the Aristotelian sense could be collapsed together into Ramus’s one simple method—the method of presenting knowledge already attained. It is the disregarding of the problem-solving or genuinely heuristic aspect of analysis, as conceived by Aristotle and the geometers, that Descartes was to condemn in the following century (see the supplementary section on Descartes and Analytic Geometry).

If Ramus represents the Platonist, anti-Aristotelian pole in the debate over method, then Zabarella represents the Aristotelian pole. Central to Zabarella’s account of method was precisely Aristotle’s distinction between understanding ‘the fact’ and understanding ‘the reason why’, as articulated in the Posterior Analytics, a work on which Zabarella wrote a detailed commentary. According to Zabarella, the two methods involved here—the methodus resolutiva (analysis) and methodus compositiva (synthesis)—are to be combined in providing the joint method for natural philosophy, all other methods, such as Plato’s method of division, being inadequate to generate genuine knowledge. (Cf. Copenhaver and Schmitt 1992, 118-21; N. Jardine 1988, 689-93.) Zabarella may have failed to recognise the importance of mathematics, which was to play a decisive role in the forthcoming scientific revolution; but his idea of the double method was to influence Galileo in his inauguration of that revolution.

If there is one method of analysis that does lie at the root of subsequent methods, it is that utilised in ancient Greek geometry, but this was not appreciated until fairly late in the Renaissance. Pappus’s famous account of analysis was only translated into Latin by Federigo Commandino in 1589. At first, as had happened with other translations of Greek texts, the rendering of the Greek terms ‘analusis’ and ‘sunthesis’ by ‘resolutio’ and ‘compositio’ encouraged conflation of the various methods, but gradually, as the significance of geometrical analysis sunk in, the original Greek terms were reappropriated (in their transliterated form) to signal the more exact meaning. (Cf. Gilbert 1960, 81-3). The wider connotations of the terms ‘resolution’ and ‘composition’ remained, however, and these soon transferred themselves to the Greek terms too, an attachment that has persisted to the present day, causing confusion ever since.

Annotated Bibliography, §3.2

Copyright © 2014 by
Michael Beaney <>

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