Anaphora

First published Tue Feb 24, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jun 30, 2005

Anaphora is sometimes characterized as the phenomenon whereby the interpretation of an occurrence of one expression depends on the interpretation of an occurrence of another or whereby an occurrence of an expression has its referent supplied by an occurrence of some other expression in the same or another sentence.[1] However, these are at best very rough characterizations of the phenomena, since things other than anaphoric expressions satisfy the first characterization and many cases of anaphora fail to satisfy the second. For example, in some sense of ‘interpretation’, the interpretation of the expression ‘bank’ in the following sentence depends on the interpretation of other expressions (in particular, ‘of the river’):

1. John is down by the bank of the river.

But no one would say this is an example of anaphora. Similarly, again, in some sense of ‘interpretation’, the interpretation of the expression ‘some human’ in the following sentence depends on the interpretation of ‘It is possible that’, but again this is not an example of anaphora:

2. It is possible that some human should have climbed the World Trade Center Towers without ropes before they were destroyed.

In (2), on standard accounts, what domain the quantifier ranges over cannot be specified prior to interpreting ‘It is possible that’, and so the interpretation of the quantifier in this sense depends on the interpretation of the modal.[2] And as to the second characterization, though all agree that the following is an example of anaphora (and ‘he’ is an anaphoric pronoun here on one reading of the sentence), it is not a case of the referent of one expression being supplied by another expression, (since ‘he’ is not a referring expression on the reading in question):

3. Every male lawyer believes he is smart.

Hence, rather than attempting to characterize anaphora generally and abstractly, I shall begin with some examples. I should emphasize that though it is generally thought that expression of various syntactic categories can be anaphoric, I shall here concern myself exclusively with anaphoric pronouns, since these are the anaphoric expressions that have been of most interest to linguists and especially philosophers.

Some anaphoric pronouns are referring expressions that inherit their referents from other referring expressions. For example, on one reading of the following sentences

4. John left. He said he was ill.

‘He’ inherits its referent from ‘John’, which is said to be the antecedent of the pronoun. Such anaphora is simple and well understood. In cases such as (3) above, the anaphoric pronoun has as its antecedent a quantifier (‘Every male lawyer’ in (3)), and essentially functions as a variable bound by the quantifier. Again, such cases are well understood. There are some anaphoric pronouns that cannot be understood as referring expressions that inherit their referents from other referring expressions, nor as variables bound by quantified antecedents. These cases of anaphora are of interest to philosophers and linguists because formulating proper semantic theories for them has proved to be a difficult and interesting task. Many theories of these cases are currently being advocated.

1. Unproblematic Anaphora

The simplest sorts of anaphoric pronouns are those that “pick up” a reference from a previous referring expression whether in the same sentence or another. Consider for example:

4. John left. He said he was ill.
5. John left his wallet on the table.

on the readings of these sentences on which ‘he’ and ‘his’ are intended to co-refer with ‘John’. In such cases, the pronouns are anaphoric, and the expression ‘John’ is called the antecedent of the anaphoric expression. Obviously, the semantics of such anaphoric pronouns is very simple: the referent of the anaphoric pronoun is the referent of its antecedent. If this were all there is to anaphora, it would be of little interest to philosophers and linguists.

As indicated above, there are also anaphoric pronouns with quantifier (rather than referring expression) antecedents. Examples include (3) above and:

6. Every male skier loves his mother.

again, on the readings of these sentences on which ‘he’ and ’his’ “look back” to their antecedents for interpretation rather than being assigned independent reference (e.g., by pointing to Chris when uttering ‘he’ in (6). It is widely held that in such cases, the pronouns function semantically as variables bound by their quantifier antecedents. Thus, their semantic function is just like that of bound variables of first order logic.[3] The insight that some pronouns with quantifier antecedents function like bound variables in first order logic goes back at least to Quine [1960].[4] Though the insight is significant, again, if this were all there is to anaphoric pronouns, they currently would not be of much interest to philosophers or linguists.

2. Problematic Anaphora

Significant interest in anaphoric pronouns grew out of the realization that there are anaphoric pronouns that cannot be understood as having their references fixed by their antecedents (as in (4) and (5) above) nor as being variables bound by their quantifier antecedents (as in (3) and (6) above). The three sorts of examples of this discussed here have figured prominently in the literature on anaphora.

First, there is discourse anaphora: cases in which an anaphoric pronoun has an antecedent in another sentence, where that antecedent at least appears to be a quantifier.[5] Examples include:

7. An anthropologist discovered the skeleton called ‘Lucy’. He named the skeleton after a Beatle's song.

8. Few professors came to the party. They had a good time.

There are at least two reasons for thinking that the pronouns in (7) and (8) are not variables bound by their quantifier antecedents. Both reasons are discussed by Evans [1977]. The first is that such a treatment clearly yields the wrong truth conditions for examples like (8). If ‘they’ is a bound variable in (8), the two sentences of (8) together should be equivalent to

8a. Few professors : x (x came to the party and x had a good time)

(Or, more colloquially, ‘Few professors are such that they both came to the party and had a good time.’) This is clearly incorrect, since the sentences of (8) entail that few professors attended the party (i.e., the first sentence entails this), whereas (8a) could be true if many professors attended.[6]

The second reason for thinking pronouns in cases of discourse anaphora aren't bound variables is that it seems committed to the claim that the following anomalous sentences aren't anomalous:

*9. John bought no sheep and Harry vaccinated them.
*10. Every professor came to the party. He had a great time.

If the (apparent) quantifiers in (7) and (8) can bind variables in sentences after those in which they occur, why can't the quantifiers in (9) and (10)? If this could happen, (9) and (10) should be fine and should together be equivalent to, respectively:

9a. No sheep were both bought by John and vaccinated by Harry.
10a. Every professor came to the party and had a great time.

But they are not. Thus, pronouns in discourse anaphora are not variables bound by their quantifier antecedents.[7]

To see that these pronouns are not referring expressions either, we have to consider a slightly more complex example:

11. A man broke into Sarah's apartment. Scott believes he came in the window.

The crucial point is that the second sentence has a reading on which it attributes to Scott a general belief instead of a belief about a particular person. This reading would be true, for example, if Scott believed that some man broke into Sarah's apartment by coming in the window, but had no idea about who might have broken in. If the pronoun in the second sentence were a referring expression, the second sentence of 11 would only have a reading on which it attributes to Scott a belief about the particular person the pronoun refers to. Since this is incorrect, the pronoun in the second sentence of (11) is not a referring expression.[8]

Thus, with pronouns in discourse anaphora, we have examples of pronouns that cannot be understood as picking up their referents from their antecedents (11) nor as being variables bound by their antecedents (8-10).

A second sort of anaphoric pronoun that cannot be understood as a referring expression or as a bound variable is in fact a special case of discourse anaphora. However, it deserves separate mention because it has generated so much interest. Consider the following discourse, which I shall call a Geach Discourse, adapted from the analogous conjunction in Geach [1967]:

12. Hob thinks a witch blighted Bob's mare. Nob wonders whether she killed Cob's sow.

There is a reading of this discourse on which both sentences in it are true even if there are no witches, so that ‘a witch’ in the first sentence must take narrow scope with respect to ‘Hob thinks’. But then the scope of ‘a witch’ cannot extend to the second sentence to bind the pronoun ‘she’, since the “scope” of ‘Hob thinks’ doesn't extend to the second sentence. Hence on the reading in question, which I shall call the Geach Reading, the pronoun ‘she’ is not a bound variable. Further, since there are no witches, and ‘she’ is anaphoric on ‘a witch’, ‘she’ in the second sentence must in some sense being used to “talk about” a non-existent witch. Thus, it apparently cannot be a referring term either, since its alleged referent doesn't exist. So here again we have an anaphoric pronoun that cannot be understood as a referring expression nor as a bound variable. Examples of this sort are sometimes referred to (misleadingly, in my view) as instances of intentional identity.

The third sort of case in which an anaphoric pronoun cannot be understood as a referring expression nor as a bound variable is that of “donkey anaphora”.[9] Here there are two varieties, which I shall call conditional and relative clause donkey sentences, respectively:

13. If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
14. Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

On the readings we are concerned with, neither (13) nor (14) is talking about any particular donkey, and so the pronoun ‘it’ cannot be a term referring to a particular donkey. Further, in the case of (13), all independent evidence available suggests that a quantifier can't take wide scope over a conditional and bind variables in its consequent (*‘If John owns every donkeyi, he beats iti’). This suggests that the (apparent) quantifier ‘a donkey’ in (13) cannot bind the pronoun in the consequent. In addition, even if ‘a donkey’ could magically do this in (13), assuming it is an existential quantifier, we still wouldn't get the intuitive truth conditions of (1), which require that Sarah beats every donkey she owns. Similarly, the independent evidence available suggests that quantifiers can't scope out of relative clauses (*‘A man who owns every donkeyi beats iti’), and so again the pronoun in (14) is not within the scope of its quantifier antecedent and so is not bound by it. Thus, the pronouns in both conditional and relative clause donkey sentences cannot be understood as referring expressions nor as bound variables.

So now we have three cases of anaphoric pronouns that cannot be understood as referring expressions nor as bound variables: 1) pronouns in discourse anaphora; 2) pronouns in Geach discourses and 3) pronouns in (conditional and relative clause) donkey sentences. Let's call these cases of problematic anaphora. The recent interest in anaphora is largely an interest in finding a semantic theory for problematic anaphora. In the next section, I outline the main theories that have arisen to fill this void.

3. Recent Theories of Problematic Anaphora

Before discussing recent theories of problematic anaphora, a few caveats are in order. First, my discussion will not be exhaustive. I cover what I take to be the best known and most promising theories. Second, because each theory is a formal, sophisticated semantic theory, to describe a single theory in detail would itself be a paper length project. Thus, I try instead to give a simple, informal sketch of the main features of each theory. The notes and references point the interested reader to places where he/she can get more detail. Third, I shall confine myself to briefly describing how each theory handles simple discourse anaphora of the sort exhibited by (7) above, in which a pronoun in one sentence is anaphoric on an indefinite noun phrase in a previous sentence and donkey anaphora. Readers interested in Geach discourses or “intentional identity” should begin by consulting Asher [1987], Edelberg [1986], Geach [1967], Kamp [1990], King [1994], and the worked mentioned therein.

3.1 Discourse Representation Theory

In the early 1980s, Irene Heim [1982] and Hans Kamp [1981] independently formulated very similar semantic theories that were in part designed to handle problematic anaphora, particularly donkey and discourse anaphora. The theories developed by Heim and Kamp have come to be known as Discourse Representation Theory or DRT.[10] I shall not attempt to describe differences between the formulations of Heim and Kamp. Indeed, in my exposition I shall combine elements of the two theories. Readers interested in the differences between the two accounts should consult Heim [1982] and Kamp [1981] directly.

I believe it is fair to say that it was the development of DRT that made the semantics of anaphora a central issue in philosophy of language. One reason for this was the following bold statement by Kamp [1981]:

A theory of this form differs fundamentally from those familiar from the truth-theoretical and model-theoretical literature, and thus a substantial argument will be wanted that such a radical departure from existing frameworks is really necessary. The particular analysis carried out in the main part of this paper should be seen as a first attempt to provide such an argument. The analysis deals with only a small number of linguistic problems, but careful reflection upon just those problems already reveals, I suggest, that a major revision of semantic theory is called for.[11]

The problems that Kamp goes on to address are the treatment of donkey anaphora and simple discourse anaphora. Hence Kamp appears to be saying that these problems cannot be handled within more traditional frameworks and thus that a DRT approach is necessary. Obviously, the claim that the semantics of anaphora requires a radical revision in semantic theory got the attention of philosophers of language. Thus, the study of problematic anaphora blossomed during the 1980s and 1990s.

The first way in which DRT departs from more traditional approaches is that it claims that indefinite noun phrases such as ‘an anthropologist’ or ‘a donkey’ are essentially predicates with free variables rather than existential quantifiers. Thus, the above indefinites might as well look as follows at the level of “logical form”:

anthropologist(x)
donkey(x)

In effect, an indefinite introduces a “novel” variable, and a pronoun anaphoric on an indefinite is interpreted as the same variable as was introduced by its indefinite antecedent. Hence a simple discourse such as:

15. A man loves Annie. He is rich.

in effect can be represented as[12]

15a. man(x)
x loves Annie
x is rich

In addition to this, DRT builds in to the assignment of truth conditions default existential quantification over free variables. Thus, (15a) is true iff there is some assignment to the variable ‘x’ that is in the extension of ‘man’, ‘loves Annie’ and ‘rich’, that is, iff something is a man who loves Annie and is rich. Thus, that indefinites appear to have the force of existential quantifiers in cases like (15) is not because they are existential quantifiers but because of the default existential quantification of free variables.

Let us turn now to the DRT treatment of donkey anaphora. First, note that both relative clause and conditional donkey anaphora appear to have a sort of “universal force”: the truth of (13) and (14) above, repeated here, require that Sarah beats every donkey she owns and that every donkey owning woman beats every donkey she owns.[13]

13. If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
14. Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

Thus, the indefinite here mysteriously has universal force and expresses something about every donkey owned by someone. Recall that according to DRT, an indefinite is effectively a one-place predicate with a free variable. The central idea of DRT in the case of both conditional and relative clause donkey sentences is that the universal force of the indefinite results from the variable in it being bound by an operator with genuine universal force. In the case of (13), the “conditional operator” has universal force, since it in effect says that in every case (assignment to free variables) in which the antecedent is true, the consequent is true. So (13) claims that every assignment to ‘x’ that makes ‘Sarah owns x’ and ‘x is a donkey’ true, also makes ‘Sarah beats x’ true. So (13) is true iff Sarah beats every donkey she owns. In (14), by contrast, the universal quantifier (determiner) ‘every’ not only binds the variables associated with the predictive material ‘woman who owns a donkey’ (for example, presumably there is such a variable in the subject argument place of ‘beats’), but it also binds the variable introduced by the predicate-with-free-variable ‘a donkey’. So it is as though (14) has the “logical form”[14]

14a. Every x,y (woman(x) & donkey(y) & x owns y) (x beats y)

Note that this account requires allowing quantificational determiners (‘every’) to bind multiple variables. This, again, is a departure from more classical approaches.

Now since the DRT approach claims that indefinites get their apparent quantificational force from other elements that bind the variables in them, it predicts that when different determiners are involved in relative clause donkey sentences, as in

16. Most women who own a donkey beat it.

the indefinite should appear to have the quantificational force of the new determiner (‘Most’). So (16) should be true if most pairs of women and donkeys they own are such that the women beat the donkeys. Similar remarks apply to conditionals containing “non-universal” quantifiers such as ‘usually’, as in

17. Usually, if a woman owns a donkey, she beats it.

This should be true if most pairs of women and donkeys they own are such that the women beat the donkeys. But this prediction, particularly in the case of (16), seems clearly false. If there are exactly ten donkey owning women and one woman owns ten donkeys and beats them all, while the nine other women own a donkey each and don't beat them, (16) intuitively seems false: most donkey owning women fail to beat the donkeys they own. However, the DRT account as formulated claims 16 is true in this situation. This difficulty is one of the main criticisms of classical DRT in the literature and is often called the proportion problem.[15] The criticism is damaging, because it appears to refute what was claimed to be a central insight of DRT: that the apparent quantificational force of indefinites comes from other elements that bind the variables in them.

A second difficulty with classical DRT as formulated here involves cases such as (11) above, repeated here

11. A man broke into Sarah's apartment. Scott believes he came in the window.

As mentioned above, (11) has a reading on which the second sentence of the discourse attributes a general belief to Scott (something like the belief that a man who broke into Sarah's apartment came in through the window). But as formulated, DRT doesn't get this reading. For the default existential quantification of free variables acts in effect like a wide scope existential quantifier over the entire discourse. Thus, it is as if (11) were as follows:

(∃x)(x is a man & x broke into Sarah's apartment & Scott believes x came in the window).

But this attributes a belief about a specific person to Scott. Hence it can't capture the reading mentioned. Similarly, consider the following sentences:

18. Every women who has a secret admirer thinks he is stalking her.
19. If a woman has a secret admirer, usually she thinks he is stalking her

These sentences also appear to have readings on which they attribute general or de dicto beliefs to the women in question. That is, they have readings on which they attribute to the women in question general beliefs to the effect that they are being stalked by secret admirers. This is why these sentences can be true even though the women in question don't know who their secret admirers are, and so have no beliefs about particular persons stalking them. For reasons exactly similar to those given for the case of the analogous reading of the second sentence of (11), these readings can't be captured by DRT as formulated here. We shall see below that dynamic approaches have exactly similar problems. Asher [1987] and Kamp [1990] attempt to remedy this problem (among others). For further elaboration of the DRT framework, see also Kamp and Reyle [1993] and van Eijck and Kamp [1997].

3.2 The Context Dependent Quantifier Approach

The Context Dependent Quantifier, or CDQ, account of anaphora was suggested in Wilson [1984] and subsequently developed in King [1987, 1991, 1994]. The CDQ account of discourse anaphora was originally motivated by a felt analogy between the semantics of discourse anaphora and the semantics of “instantial terms” that figure in quantificational reasoning in natural languages and in derivations of systems of natural deduction for first order predicate logic. An example of an instantial term in natural language would be occurrences of ‘n’ when one supposes that n is an arbitrary prime number and on the basis of subsequently establishing the claim that n is F, one concludes that all prime numbers are F. Or given that some prime number is F, one might let n be "a prime that is F" and go on to establish certain other claims "about" n. In systems of natural deduction, instantial terms are the singular terms that are introduced in applications of existential instantiation and eliminated in applications of universal generalization. CDQ has been applied to the instantial terms of a certain range of systems of natural deduction.[16] In these applications, occurrences of formulas containing instantial terms in derivations are assigned truth conditions. The truth conditions assigned depend on the structure of the derivation containing the occurrence of the formula. Thus given an occurrence of a formula A in derivation D, one defines the truth conditions of A in context c, where c encodes the structural features of derivation D that are relevant to the truth conditions of the occurrence of A in D.

The idea underlying the application of CDQ to instantial terms is that such terms are quantifier-like expressions of generality, where the precise nature of that generality (e.g., universal or existential force, etc.) is determined by features of the natural language argument or derivation of a system of natural deduction in which the instantial term occurs. Advocates of CDQ thus called such expressions context dependent quantifiers (henceforth cdqs), to emphasize both that they are expressions of generality and that what sort of generality they express depends on features of their linguistic contexts.

Now the idea underlying the application of CDQ to discourse anaphora is that these expressions too look like expressions of generality, where the precise nature of the generality they express is determined by features of the linguistic context in which they occur. Thus, on the CDQ account, instantial terms and anaphoric pronouns with quantifier antecedents in discourse anaphora are contextually sensitive devices of quantification. That is, these instantial terms and anaphoric pronouns express quantifications; and which quantifications they express is partly a function of the linguistic environments in which they are embedded. Consider the following discourses:

20. A man from Sweden climbed Mt. Everest alone. He used no oxygen.
21. Most students passed the exam. They didn't get scores below 70%.

Looking at (20), suppose that in fact at least one Swede has soloed Mt. Everest without oxygen. Then it would seem that the sentences of 20 are true. If this is correct, then it appears that the second sentence of (20) expresses a (existentially) general claim. CDQ claims that the pronoun ‘He’ in the second sentence is itself a (existential) quantifier, and this explains why the second sentence expresses a general claim: the generality is a result of the presence of this quantifier in the sentence. Similar remarks apply to (21), (except that ‘They’ expresses a universal quantifier). Further, consider the following example, which is similar to our example (11) above:

22. A man killed Alan last night. Michelle believes he used a knife to kill him.

The second sentence of this discourse appears to have two different readings. On one reading, it asserts that concerning the man who killed Alan last night, Michelle believes of that very man that he used a knife. This would be the case if, for example, Michelle knew the man who killed Alan, believed that he killed Alan and based on his well-known fondness of knives, believed he used this sort of weapon. But the second sentence has another reading on which it ascribes to Michelle the general belief to the effect that a man killed Alan with a knife last night. On this reading the sentence would be true if e.g., on the basis of conversations with personnel at the hospital and having no particular person in mind, Michelle believed that a man fatally stabbed Alan last night.

Again, CDQ claims these facts are to be explained by holding that the pronoun in the second sentence is a quantifier. For then we should expect that, like other quantifiers, it could take wide or narrow scope relative to ‘Michelle believes’. On the wide scope reading of the pronoun/quantifier, the second sentence attributes to Michelle a belief regarding a particular person. On the narrow scope reading, it attributes to Michelle a general belief.

Occurrences of “ordinary quantifiers”, such as ‘every man’ have what we might call a force, in this case universal; what we might call a restriction, in this case the set of men; and scope relative to other occurrences of quantifiers, verbs of propositional attitude, and so on. CDQ claims that the anaphoric pronouns in question also have forces (universal, existential, etc.), restrictions (“domains over which they quantify”) and scopes relative to each other, verbs of propositional attitude, etc. However, unlike “ordinary” quantifiers, these anaphoric pronouns qua quantifiers have their forces, restrictions and relative scopes determined by features of their linguistic environments. King [1994] lays out how the forces, restrictions and relative scopes of these anaphoric pronouns are determined, and I shall not describe those details here.

As to donkey anaphora, without going through the details, let me just say that CDQ assigns to a relative clause donkey sentence such as (14) above (repeated here)

14. Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

truth conditions according to which (14) is true iff every woman who owns a donkey beats some donkey she owns.[17] Some think that the truth of (14) requires every woman who owns a donkey to beat every donkey she owns, and as we saw, DRT assigns these truth conditions to (14). Let us call the truth conditions CDQ assigns to (14) the existential truth conditions and call the truth conditions DRT assigns to (14) the universal truth conditions. Now there actually has been a debate in the literature as to which truth conditions sentences like (14) have. There are sentences that are exactly like (14) except for the descriptive material in them that clearly seem to have (only) the existential truth conditions. An example is:

23. Every person who had a credit card paid his bill with it.

It seems clear that the truth of this sentence does not require every person with a credit card to pay his bill with each credit card he has. I will discuss these matters further in Section (4), but for now let me simply note that CDQ and DRT differ on what truth conditions should be assigned to sentences like (14) and (23) and that it is simply unclear which truth conditions are the correct ones.

As for conditional donkey anaphora, the CDQ account is rather complicated and I am only able to provide the briefest outline of the account here.[18] As we saw above, a conditional donkey sentence such as (13)

13. If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.

is true iff Sarah beats every donkey she owns. Thus, ‘a donkey’ somehow seems to have ended up with universal force. The CDQ account holds that this illusion of universal force for the indefinite is really the result of the interaction of the semantics of the conditional, the indefinite, understood as an existential quantifier, and the cdq ‘she’, understood as a context dependent quantifier with existential force ranging over donkeys Sue owns. Roughly, the account goes as follows. The antecedent of (13) is equivalent to

13a. (∃x)(x is a donkey & Sue owns x)

Given the CDQ ‘it’ and its context in (13), the consequent of (13) is equivalent to

13c. (∃x)( x is a donkey & Sue owns x & Sue beats x)

The semantics of the conditional involves universal quantification over minimal situations. In particular, a conditional claims that for every minimal situation s1 in which its antecedent is true, there is a situation s2 that s1 is part of in which its consequent is true. In the case of (13), a minimal situation in which the antecedent is true consists of Sarah and a single donkey she owns. The final element here is that the definiteness and/or anaphoricness of the CDQ ‘it’ in the consequent of (13) makes a difference to its truth conditions. The definiteness and anaphoricness of ‘it’ in (13) induces a sort of “familiarity effect”.[19] In particular, for any (minimal) s1 in which the antecedent is true, there must be an s2 that s1 is part of in which the consequent (understood as expressing the claim that Sarah beats a donkey she owns) is true. But in addition, because of the “familiarity” condition induced by the anaphoric definite ‘it’, there must be a donkey in s2 that is also in s1 and that makes the consequent true. In other words, familiarity requires that a donkey that makes the CDQ-containing consequent true in s2 also be present in s1. In this sense, the donkey is “familiar”, having been introduced by the antecedent and the situation s1 in which it is true. To see what this means, consider a situation s1 that is a minimal situation in which the antecedent is true. s1 consists of Sarah owning a single donkey. If e.g., Sarah owns ten donkeys, there are ten such minimal situations. For (13) to be true, each such s1 must be part of a situation s2 such that s2 is a situation in which Sarah beats a donkey that she owns and that is in s1. Now the only way that every minimal s1 in which Sarah owns a donkey can be part of an s2 in which Sarah beats a donkey she owns in s1 is if Sarah beats every donkey she owns. Thus, the CDQ account claims that (13) is true iff Sarah beats every donkey she owns.

Turning now to difficulties with CDQ, a main difficulty is that it isn't clear whether the use of the notion of familiarity in the account of conditional donkey sentences can be ultimately upheld. Recall that the idea was that because ‘it’ is a definite NP, and because definite NPs generally are thought to involve some sort of familiarity, the pronoun in the donkey conditional induces a sort of familiarity effect. There are really two distinct problems here. One is that though the pronoun ‘it’ is “syntactically” definite in that the pronoun ‘it’ is thought to be a definite NP, according to CDQ it is “semantically” indefinite in (13), since it expresses an existential quantification (over donkeys owned by Sarah). But then if ‘it’ really is semantically indefinite in (13), why should it induce familiarity effects at all?[20] One might reply that it is the fact that ‘it’ is “syntactically” definite that triggers the familiarity effects CDQ posits. But familiarity probably is not well enough understood to allow us to assess this response. A second, and perhaps more pressing, difficulty is this. Generally, familiarity has something to do with whether what an expression is being used to talk about is familiar or salient to the audience being addressed. This is vague, of course, but the idea is that if I say ‘The dog is hungry’ to an audience who isn't even aware of any dog that is around or relevant to the conversation, my remark is somewhat infelicitous. That is because I used the definite NP ‘The dog’ to talk about something not familiar to my audience. Now the question is: is it plausible to claim that this and related phenomena are related to the rather complex effect CDQ claims is induced by the anaphoricness/definiteness of ‘it’ in donkey conditionals? In the latter case, CDQ claims the effect of familiarity is to make the cdq ‘it’ in the consequent of donkey conditionals quantify over donkeys in the minimal situations introduced by the antecedents of the conditionals (in the case of (13), situations consisting of Sarah and a single donkey she owns). The cdq can only quantify over “familiar” donkeys — those introduced by the antecedent. One may well wonder whether the effect CDQ posits here can really be seen to be a manifestation of phenomena that have traditionally been explained in terms of familiarity.

3.3 Descriptive Approaches

There have been many accounts of the semantics of anaphora according to which anaphoric pronouns in some sense function like definite descriptions. Though there are important differences between such theories, examples of theories of this sort include Evans [1977], Parsons [1978] (Other Internet Resources), Davies [1981], Neale [1990] and Heim [1990]. Theories of this sort are often called E-Type or D-type approaches. Because it is one of the best known versions among philosophers, I will discuss the view of Neale [1990]. I should add that though Neale developed the view in question in greater detail, Davies [1981] had earlier defended essentially the same view in all crucial respects.[21] Thus, the view I go on to describe should probably be called the Davies-Neale view. But since I shall focus on Neale's presentation of the view, I shall talk of Neale's view.

On Neale's view, in all instances of problematic anaphora, anaphoric pronouns “go proxy for” definite descriptions understood as quantifiers along roughly Russellian lines. First, consider discourse anaphora. Neale's view is that in a discourse such as:

24. John bought a donkey. Harry vaccinated it.

the pronoun ‘it’ “goes proxy for” the definite description ‘the donkey John bought.’ Hence the second sentence of such a discourse is equivalent to the sentence ‘Harry vaccinated the donkey John bought’ with the description understood in standard Russellian fashion. Within a generalized quantifier type framework, where ‘the’ is treated as a determiner that, like other determiners, combines with a set term to form a quantified NP, the evaluation clause a for sentences containing a singular description (with wide scope) can be given as follows

25. ‘the (F)^x[Y]’ is true iff |F|=1 and |F|−|^x[Y]|=0

(where ‘F’ is a term denoting a set, ‘Y’ is an open formula with free occurrences of ‘x’, ‘^x[Y]’ is a lambda expression denoting the set of things that satisfy ‘Y’ when assigned to ‘x’, |F| is the cardinality of the set denoted by ‘F’ and |^x[Y]| is cardinality of the set denoted by ‘^x[Y]’—I suppress reference to models, etc.) So the second sentence of (24) is true iff Harry vaccinated the unique donkey John bought. Thus far, then, the view is that pronouns anaphoric on singular indefinites are interpreted as Russellian definite descriptions.

There is, however, a further complication in Neale's theory that is invoked in the explanation of donkey anaphora. In particular, Neale introduces what he calls a “numberless description”: a description that, unlike semantically singular descriptions, puts no cardinality constraint on the denotation of the set term that combines with the determiner to form the quantified NP (other than that it must be nonempty — note above how in the singular case |F| is constrained to equal one.) Following Neale, let ‘whe’ be the determiner (corresponding to ‘the’) used to form "numberless descriptions." Then the evaluation clause for sentences containing numberless descriptions, analogous to (25) above, would be

26. ‘whe(F)^x[Y]’ is true iff |F| ≥ 1 and |F|−|^x[Y]|=0

Thus numberless descriptions are in effect universal quantifiers.

In addition to going proxy for Russellian singular descriptions in the way we have seen, Neale claims that anaphoric pronouns sometimes go proxy for numberless descriptions. In particular, Neale holds that pronouns anaphoric on singular existential quantifiers (but outside of their scope) can be interpreted either as standard Russellian descriptions or as numberless descriptions. Now if the pronouns in our conditional and relative clause donkey sentences (repeated here)

13. If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
14. Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

are interpreted as a numberless description, (13) asserts that if Sarah owns a donkey, she beats all the donkeys she owns and (14) asserts that every donkey owning woman beats every donkey she owns. Thus, Neale's account of donkey anaphora requires the pronouns here to be interpreted as numberless descriptions.

Having seen how Neale's theory handles discourse anaphora and donkey anaphora, we turn to difficulties with the account. An obvious question concerning an account like this that allows pronouns anaphoric on singular existential quantifiers to go proxy for both Russellian and numberless descriptions is: what determines whether such a pronoun is going proxy for a Russellian, as opposed to a numberless, description? This question is pressing for Neale's account, since there will be a substantial difference in the truth conditions of a pronoun-containing sentence depending on whether the pronoun receives a numberless or Russellian interpretation. In his most explicit statement about the matter (p. 237) Neale makes clear that it is primarily whether the utterer had a particular individual in mind in uttering the indefinite description that determines whether a pronoun anaphoric on it receives a Russellian or a numberless interpretation.[22]

If this is correct, then discourses of the form

27. A(n) F is G. He/she/it is H.

generally ought to display both readings (in the suitable contexts), depending on whether the utterer of the discourse had a particular individual in mind in uttering ‘A(n) F’. So the second sentences of discourses of the form of (27) ought to have readings on which they mean the unique F that is G is H (Russellian) and on which they mean every F that is G is H (numberless). But this does not seem to be the case. In particular, such discourses do not have readings corresponding to the numberless interpretation of the pronoun. Consider the discourse anaphora analogue of the donkey conditional (13):

13a. Sarah owns a donkey. She beats it.

It seems clear that this discourse has no reading on which the second sentence means that Sarah beats every donkey she owns, even if we imagine that the utterer of the discourse had no particular donkey in mind when she uttered the first sentence. Suppose, for example, that the Homeland Security and Donkey Care Bureau comes to town and wants information about local donkey ownership and beating. I tell them that I really don't know how many donkeys anybody owns, and I have never seen or had any other contact with particular local donkeys. But I tell them that I have received some information from reliable sources and it has been deemed “credible”. Asked what I have heard, I respond:

Sarah owns a donkey and she beats it.

Even though I have no particular donkey in mind in uttering these sentences, we simply don't get a numberless reading here. If Sarah beats some donkey she owns, I have spoken truly even if she owns others she fails to beat. Or again, suppose we are debating whether anybody has an eight track tape player anymore, and I say “I'll bet the following is true: some guy with a '68 Camaro owns an eight track player and he still uses it.” Again, there is no numberless reading for the pronoun in the second sentence, even though I clearly have no particular eight-track player in mind. If some '68 Camaro driving guy owns and uses an eight-track player, I have spoken truly even if he owns other eight track players that aren't used.[23]

So it appears that Neale's account has no explanation of why the pronouns in discourses like (13a) never have numberless readings. Neale's account has similar problems with sentences like:

28 Some woman who owns a donkey beats it.

Here again, Neale's theory predicts that this sentence has a reading on which its truth requires that some woman beats every donkey she owns. And again, even if we imagine the sentence being uttered without any particular woman or donkey in mind, we don't get this reading of the sentence predicted by Neale's theory, (say we are discussing women's tendencies towards animals they own, and I utter (28) simply thinking it is statistically likely to be true). So Neale's account has no explanation as to why the second sentence of discourse (13a) and sentence (28) lack the relevant readings assigned to those sentences by his theory.

These last points highlight a difference between the way the CDQ and DRT approaches explain the truth conditions of conditional donkey sentences and the way Neale's theory does. Both CDQ and DRT approaches hold that the requirement that Sarah beats all the donkeys she owns for 13 to be true arises due to the interaction of the semantic of indefinites, the semantics of anaphoric pronouns and the semantics of conditionals.[24] Indeed, it is the latter that is primarily implicated in (13)'s truth requiring that all donkeys owned by Sarah be beaten (since in both cases, the theories posit some sort of universal quantification in the semantics of conditionals). By contrast, on Neale's view, the requirement that Sarah beats all the donkeys she owns for (13) to be true (on one of its readings) essentially falls out of the semantics of the anaphoric pronoun alone, since on one of its readings, it expresses universal quantification over donkeys Sarah owns, (the numberless description reading).

3.4 Dynamic Logic Approaches

As its name suggests, Discourse Representation Theory was designed to capture the way in which certain features of a discourse, particularly intersentential relations such as intersentential anaphora, affect the interpretation of sentences in the discourse. At the same time, Discourse Representation Theory as originally formulated in Kamp [1981] failed to be compositional, at least in the sense of that term familiar from Montagovian approaches.[25]

The initial motivation for a dynamic logic approach to discourse and donkey anaphora was on the one hand to preserve the “dynamic” elements of DRT, that is the view that what a sentence means is given by the way in which the addition of a sentence to a discourse changes the information available to a hearer of the discourse, (“meaning as potential for changing the state of information”). On the other hand, dynamic logic approaches wanted to adhere to compositionality. This is made very clear in the introduction of the classic statement of the dynamic logic approach to discourse and donkey anaphora, namely Groenendijk and Stokhof [1991]. I shall here discuss their treatment of discourse and donkey anaphora, and gesture at other treatments in the dynamic logic tradition. Henceforth, I shall refer to their account as GSDL. Of the theories discussed in this entry, this is the most difficult to explain informally. I shall keep the discussion as informal as possible, and urge interested readers to consult the works cited directly for more detail.

To begin with, let's look at how simple discourse anaphora is handled on GSDL. So consider again:

15. A man loves Annie. He is rich.

Now in GSDL, indefinites such as ‘a man’ are treated as existential quantifiers. Further, GSDL idealizes a bit and treats consecutive sentences in discourses as being conjoined. So we can think of (15) as follows:

15a. (∃x)(man x & x loves Annie) & x is rich

Here we have rendered the anaphoric pronoun ‘He’ as the variable ‘x’, the same variable that is the variable of its quantifier antecedent. This represents the anaphoric connection. The important point to notice is that the anaphoric pronoun/variable in (15a) is not within the syntactic scope of its quantifier antecedent. This corresponds to the fact that in GSDL, the syntactic scopes of quantifiers are confined to the sentences in which they occur, as current syntactic theory tells us they should be.

The key to understanding the GSDL account of discourse anaphora lies in understanding the semantic accounts it offers of the existential quantifier and conjunction. Let's begin with existential quantification. The basic idea here it that when we interpret an existential quantifier, the output of that interpretation may affect the interpretation of subsequent expressions. Indeed, this basic idea is familiar from standard first order logic. We interpret an (wide scope) existential quantifier by determining which sequences of individuals satisfy the formula containing it. But which sequences satisfy that formula depends on which sequences that differ from the original at most on the variable in question satisfy the formula the quantifier embeds. In this way, when we check to see whether a sequence satisfies the existentially quantified formula (“interpreting the quantifier”), this determines which sequences we look at in determining whether they satisfy the formula the quantifier fronts (thus “affecting its interpretation”). Of course in standard first order logic, we interpret formulas by assigning them sets of sequences of individuals (those that satisfy the formulas). GSDL just takes this a step further by assigning to sentences sets of pairs of sequences, thought of as the input and output sequences. In the case of an existential quantified formula ‘(∃x)Φ’, the idea is that a pair of sequences <g,h> is in its interpretation just in case there is sequence k differing from g at most on x such that <k,h> is in the interpretation of ‘Φ’.[26] So note how “interpreting” the existential quantifier results in shifting from the “input” sequence g to k, where k is now the “input” sequence to ‘Φ’. This makes the existential quantifier “internally dynamic”, capable of affecting the interpretation of expressions within its syntactic scope. Further, the fact that the output sequence of interpreting the whole existentially quantified sentence, here h, is allowed to be a sequence different from the input to the interpretation, here g, means that the processing of the existentially quantified formula may affect the interpretation of expressions after the existentially quantified formula, and hence outside the scope of the existential quantifier. This is to say that the existential quantifier is “externally dynamic”, capable of affecting the interpretation of expressions outside its syntactic scope. As we will see, an expression can be internally dynamic and externally static (as well as internally and externally static). At any rate, putting things very roughly, the idea here is that once the existential quantifier “resets” the value of ‘x’ in a sequence so that it satisfies the formula the quantifier embeds, that value stays reset and can affect the interpretation of subsequent formulas.

Turning now to conjunction, the idea here is similar. Again, the fundamental idea is that the interpretation of the left conjunct can affect the interpretation of the right conjunct. A bit more formally, a pair of sequences <g,h> satisfies a conjunction just in case there is a sequence k such that <g,k> satisfies the left conjunct and <k,h> satisfies the right conjunct.[27] So note how interpreting the left conjunct changes the input sequence for the interpretation of the right conjunct. Again, this means that conjunction is “internally dynamic”, possibly affecting the interpretation of expressions in its scope. And again, that the output of interpreting a conjunction, here h, can differ from the input, here g, means that a conjunction is capable of affecting things outside of it and hence outside of the scope of that conjunction sign. Again, this is to say that conjunction is “externally dynamic”.

Given these treatments of existential quantification and conjunction, it is easy to show that on GSDL the following two formulas are equivalent even when ‘Ψ’ contains free occurrences of ‘x’:

(∃x)(Φ) & Ψ

and

(∃x)(Φ & Ψ)

So if we consider again our example of discourse anaphora (15) and its “representation” in GSDL 15a:

15a. (∃x)(man x & x loves Annie) & x is rich

this ends up being equivalent to

15b. (∃x)(man x & x loves Annie & x is rich)

and so the sentences of the discourse are true iff some rich man loves Annie. Since conjunction is externally dynamic, we can keep adding sentences with anaphoric pronouns to similar affect. Thus in a discourse such as

15c. A man loves Annie. He is rich. He is famous.

the sentences are all true iff some rich famous man loves Annie.

Because the treatment of donkey anaphora is a bit more complicated technically, and because some of the main ideas of GSDL are now on the table, I will be more suggestive here. Again, I urge the interested reader to consult Groenendijk and M. Stokhof [1991] directly.

First, consider conditional donkey anaphora. Our (13) above, repeated here:

13. If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.

gets regimented in GSDL as follows:

13a. (∃x)(Φ) → Ψ

where ‘Ψ’ contains an occurrence of the variable ‘x’ not in the scope of the existential quantifier in the antecedent. There are three crucial points to the GSDL treatment here. 1) the existential quantifier is externally dynamic and hence may affect the interpretation of variables outside its scope, and in particular ‘x’ in the consequent of (13a). 2) ‘→’ is internally dynamic and allows the interpretation of its antecedent to affect the interpretation of its consequent (just as is conjunction). 1 and 2 together mean that the quantifier in the antecedent of (13)/(13a) can “semantically” bind the variable in the consequent, even though it is not in the syntactic scope of the quantifier. But without doing anything further, we would be left with (13a) having the truth conditions of

13b. (∃x)(Φ → Ψ)

where ‘→’ is the standard material conditional. This doesn't give the intuitive truth conditions of (13) on the reading that concerns us, since (13b) would be true if something failed to be a donkey Sarah owns. The third and final element we need to get the truth conditions to come out right is to say that a pair of sequences <h,h> is in the interpretation of a conditional iff for all k such that <h,k> satisfy the antecedent, there is a j such that <k,j> satisfy the consequent.[28] This says, roughly, that for any output sequence k of a pair of sequences satisfying the antecedent of the conditional (assignment of a donkey Sarah owns to x in the case of in the case of (13)/(13a)), k is the input of a pair <k,j> that satisfies the consequent, for some j. In the case of a simple example like (13)/(13a), j=k. So that the account claims that any output of a pair of sequences that satisfies the existentially quantified antecedent (which means that the sequence assigns to ‘x’ a donkey Sarah owns), satisfies ‘Sarah beats x’, and so also assigns to ‘x’ something Sarah beats. That is, the truth of (13)/(13a) requires Sarah to beat every donkey she owns.

Turning now to our relative clause donkey sentence, (repeated here)

14. Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

I shall be even more schematic. This gets regimented in GSDL as follows, (giving the predicate letters here the obvious meanings):

14a. (x)((Wx & (∃y)(Dy & Oxy))→ Bxy)

Note in particular that the ‘y’ in ‘Bxy’ is not in the scope of the existential quantifier. Now given a quite straightforward treatment of the universal quantifier, on which it allows dynamic effects in its scope,[29] in all essentials, the example works like (13)/(13a). For stripping the universal quantifier away, we have:

14a.′ ((Wx & (∃y)(Dy & Oxy))→ Bxy

And overlooking the free variables left by stripping away the universal quantifier (which anyway were in its scope and bound by it) and the conjunct ‘Wx’ in the antecedent, we simply have another conditional with an existential quantifier in its antecedent and a formula in the consequent containing an occurrence of the variable of that existential quantifier. So the treatment goes essentially as it did for (13)/(13a) itself, with the externally dynamic existential quantifier, internally dynamic conditional, and universal quantification over sequences in the semantics of the conditional all working their magic so that (14)'s truth requires every donkey owning woman to beat every donkey she owns.

Though GSDL cannot handle relative clause donkey sentences such as:

29. Most women who own a donkey beat it.

since it is working within the framework of a first order logic without generalized quantifiers, this is only a limitation of this particular formulation and not of dynamic approaches generally. Others have formulated systems of dynamic logic with generalized quantifiers that are capable of dealing with examples like (29).[30]

On the other hand, GSDL and dynamic approaches generally do face a problem. Put crudely, GSDL (and dynamic approaches generally) solve the problems of discourse and donkey anaphora by formulating semantics for quantifiers that allows quantifiers to semantically bind variables that aren't in their syntactic scopes. In this they (self-consciously) resemble DRT. But then they face a problem similar to one faced by DRT and mentioned above. Consider again our discourse (11), repeated here

11. A man broke into Sarah's apartment. Scott believes he came in the window.

As mentioned above, (11) has a reading on which the second sentence of the discourse attributes a general belief to Scott (something like the belief that a man who broke into Sarah's apartment came in through the window). On a dynamic approach to (11), the quantifier in the first sentence semantically binds the variable in the second sentence. But then this semantically amounts to quantification into the verb of attitude, and so will not result in a reading of the second sentence on which it attributes a general belief to Scott. Hence, dynamic approaches need to invoke some other mechanism to get the reading of the second sentence in question.[31]

Similarly, again consider the following sentences discussed in connection with DRT above :

17. Every woman who has a secret admirer thinks he is stalking her.
18. If a woman has a secret admirer, usually she thinks he is stalking her

As mentioned there, these sentences also appear to have readings on which they attribute general or de dicto beliefs to the women in question. That is, they have readings on which they attribute to the women in question general beliefs to the effect that they are being stalked by secret admirers. This is why these sentences can be true even though the women in question don't know who their secret admirers are, and so have no beliefs about particular persons stalking them. For reasons exactly similar to those given for the case of the analogous reading of the second sentence of (11), these readings can't be captured by GSDL or dynamic approaches generally.

4. How Many Readings Do Donkey Sentences Have?

In discussing the CDQ approach in Section 3.2 above, I mentioned that there is some disagreement regarding the truth conditions of

14. Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

Some think that the truth of (14) requires every woman who owns a donkey to beat every donkey she owns. As we did above, let us call these (alleged) truth conditions for (14) the universal truth conditions. Others think that the truth of (14) requires that every donkey owning woman beats some donkey she owns. As above, these are the (alleged) existential truth conditions for (14).[32] As I mentioned above, there are sentences that are exactly like (14) except for the descriptive material in them that clearly seem to have (only) the existential truth conditions. The example I gave was:

23. Every person who had a credit card paid his bill with it.

It seems clear that the truth of this sentence does not require every person with a credit card to pay his bill with each credit card he has, but merely with some credit card he has. Now my comments to this point have suggested that the debate with respect to (14)/(23) and universal vs. existential truth conditions is over which one of the two sets of truth conditions (14)/(23) have. But this isn't correct. For some think that (at least some) donkey sentences have both sets of truth conditions (or readings corresponding to both sets). Chierchia [1994] and Kanazawa [1994b] are examples. In their favor, for a given determiner, one can find pairs of relative clause donkey sentences fronted by that determiner such that one has the existential truth conditions (on its most natural interpretation) and the other has the universal truth conditions (on its most natural reading). For example, consider the following pairs:

30. Existential Readings:
a. Every person who had a credit card paid his bill with it.
b. Most women who have a dime will put it in the meter.
c. No man with a teenage son lets him drive the car on the weekend.
31. Universal Readings
a. Every student who borrowed a book from Peter eventually returned it.
b. Most parents who have a teenage son allow him to go out on the weekend.
c. No man with an umbrella leaves it home on a day like this.

These examples and others suggest that whether a given relative clause donkey sentence appears to favor the universal truth conditions or the existential truth conditions is influenced by a variety of factors, including the monotonicity properties of the determiner on the wide scope quantifier, the lexical semantics of the predicates occurring in the sentence, and general background assumptions concerning the situations in which we are to consider the truth or falsity of the sentences. However, it is very hard to find significant generalizations regarding under what conditions a given reading is favored.[33] Further, it is very hard to find sentences that clearly allow both a universal and an existential reading. This makes the view that the sentences actually possess both readings as a matter of their semantics at least somewhat suspect. If they really do possess both readings, why is it so hard to find sentences that clearly allow both readings? And finally, relative clause donkey sentences fronted by the determiner ‘some’ seem always to only have the existential truth conditions:

32. Some women who own a donkey beat it.

Obviously, the facts here are quite complicated. The theories discussed in this entry only assign one of the existential or universal truth conditions to relative clause donkey sentences. Theories known to me that assign both sets of truth conditions to relative clause donkey sentences do so by positing some sort of ambiguity.[34] Though the matter isn't entirely clear, it seems plausible that the theories discussed here also may be able to assign both the universal and the existential truth conditions to relative clause donkey sentences by positing some sort of ambiguity. These matters require further investigation.[35]

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Other Internet Resources

  • Parsons, Terence, [1978], ‘Pronouns as Paraphrases’ (4 MB PDF file), unpublished ms. (Philosophy Department, UCLA).

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]

Copyright © 2005 by
Jeffrey C. King <jcking310@gmail.com>

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