Ancient Political Philosophy

First published Mon Sep 6, 2010

Ancient political philosophy is understood here to mean ancient Greek and Roman thought from the classical period of Greek thought in the fifth century BCE to the end of the Roman empire in the West in the fifth century CE, excluding the rise of Christian ideas about politics during that period. Political philosophy as a genre was invented in this period by Plato and reinvented by Aristotle: it encompasses reflections on the origin of political institutions, the concepts used to interpret and organize political life such as justice and equality, the relation between the aims of ethics and the nature of politics, and the relative merits of different constitutional arrangements or regimes. Platonic models remained especially important for later authors throughout this period, even as the development of later “Hellenistic” schools of Greek philosophy, and distinctively Roman forms of philosophical adaptation, offered new frameworks for construing politics.

1. The Scope of Ancient Political Philosophy

We find the etymological origins of both “[the] political” and “philosophy” in ancient Greek: the former originally pertaining to the polis or city-state; the latter, as conceived by Plato and the subsequent tradition, being the practice of a particular kind of inquiry conceived as the “love of wisdom” (philosophia). These ideas were transmitted beyond the confines of the classical polis as the Greek city-states came under the suzerainty of larger kingdoms after an initial Macedonian conquest at the end of the fourth century B.C; those kingdoms in turn were eventually conquered and significantly assimilated by the Roman republic, later transmuted into an empire. Philosophers writing in Latin engaged self-consciously with the earlier and continuing traditions of writing about philosophy in Greek. In the case of political philosophy in particular, the ancient Greek classification of regimes or “constitutions” (politeia, singular)—the three “good” regimes being monarchy, aristocracy, and a moderate form of democracy; and their three “perversions” being tyranny, oligarchy, and a bad form of democracy—continued to inform the discussion of politics in the context of the “mixed regime” of the Roman republic, held to combine elements of all three of the good regimes. Neither the transformation of the republic into an empire in the first-century BCE, nor the eventual abdication of the last pretenders to the Roman imperial throne in the Western part of the empire in 476 CE, prevented continued engagement with this Greek and Roman heritage of political philosophy among late antique and later medieval scholars and their successors writing in Latin, Arabic and Hebrew. Thus while all societies have had politics, and also organized reflection on politics, “ancient political philosophy” in this article refers to the plurality of discourses comprised in that Greek and Roman heritage.

Because the Greeks invented political philosophy in its technical sense, but it has had a long history since then, it is a mistake to approach their thought with a modern menu of expectations of what the subject will contain. At the same time, because the Greeks also invented other genres widely recognized today—among them, history, tragedy, comedy, and rhetoric—no understanding of their thought about politics can restrict itself to the genre of political philosophy alone. Some argue, for example, that Thucydides' elaboration of the nature of the political through his History of the fifth-century Peloponnesian Wars between leagues led by Athens and Sparta is more important and instructive than that issuing from Plato's philosophical dialogues (Geuss 2005). While that argument is contentious, it rests on an important broader point. “Politics” and what is “political” emerged as part of a widespread set of sociolinguistic practices, most notably and best documented in Athens, while “philosophy” was invented by a relatively small number of self-professed thinkers. Thus the invention of “political philosophy” as a genre can be understood as a deliberate challenge to existing practices of “the political.” The challenge was directed in particular, though not exclusively, to democratic practices in mid to late fifth century Athens: the polis both intellectually dominant and politically exemplary at the time, as well as bequeathing the lion's share of our surviving evidence from ancient Greece (Meier, 1990; on the evidence for ancient philosophy in general, see [SEP: Doxography for Ancient Philosophy]).

This article therefore begins by surveying political practices and the reflective accounts to which they gave rise in the classical Greek period of the independent polis. It then turns to the thinkers who invented “political philosophy” par excellence: Socrates, Plato and Aristotle. It continues to Hellenistic Greek thinkers before considering the main currents and roles of political philosophy in the Roman republic. While offering a survey of certain developments in the Roman empire, it leaves aside the Christian Fathers, and in particular the great upheaval of thought effected by Augustine, who is the starting point for the SEP's treatment of medieval political philosophy. [LINK to SEP Medieval Political Philosophy] The article concludes with some reflections on how the nature of “ancient political philosophy” should, and should not, be understood.

2. Politics and Philosophy in Ancient Greece

2.1 Politics and Justice

The distinctive understanding of “politics” forged in Greece was marked by the historical emergence of the independent city-state[1] and the variety of regimes which it could harbor. Notwithstanding fantasies of a pre-political “Age of Kronos”, the polis was widely understood as the acme of human civilization and the principal domain in which human fulfillment could be sought. The city was the domain of potential collaboration in leading the good life, though it was by the same token the domain of potential contestation should that pursuit come to be understood as pitting some against others. Political theorizing began in arguments about what politics was good for, who could participate in politics, and why, arguments which were tools in civic battles for ideological and material control as well as attempts to provide logical or architectonic frameworks for those battles.

Such conflicts were addressed by the idea of justice, which was fundamental to the city as it emerged from the archaic age, sometimes reflected in Homer, into the classical period. Justice was conceived by poets, lawgivers, and philosophers alike as the structure of civic bonds which were beneficial to all (rich and poor, powerful and weak alike) rather than an exploitation of some by others. Hesiod's late eighth-century epic poem Works and Days, for example, contrasts the brute strength with which a hawk can dominate a nightingale (“You are being held by one who is much stronger… I will make a meal of you, if I want, or let you go,” lines 206–208), with the peace and plenty which flourishes wherever justice, such as rendering fair verdicts to foreigners, is preserved (lines 225–230).

So understood, justice defined the basis of equal citizenship and was said to be the requirement for human regimes to be acceptable to the gods. The ideal was that, with justice as a foundation, political life would enable its participants to flourish and to achieve the overarching human end of happiness (eudaimonia), expressing a civic form of virtue and pursuing happiness and success through the competitive forums of the city. Whether justice applied to the city's relation with other cities was a further and highly contested point, memorably debated in Thucydides' recounting of the “Melian Dialogue” in 416 BCE, in which emissaries of the Athenians debated the meaning of justice with the leaders of Melos, a city they were threatening with death and disaster should they fail to submit to Athenian domination (Thuc. V. 84–114).

2.2 Politics, Justice, and Equality

Justice, then, depended on treating equals equally, and only the equals as full citizens. Yet how should “the equal” be understood? This became the major political faultline of the Greek fifth century BCE Oligarchical regimes considered only the kalokagathoi[2] —the elite and well-born, usually also wealthy—to be equals; democratic regimes treated the “many” (or some large proportion of them) as political equals of the elite “few,” in the fullest democracies enfranchising all free- and native-born men.[3] Sparta, a unique political entity, still exemplified the same broad pattern in naming its citizens “the equals” (hoi homoioi).[4] The absence of slave status made one free but not necessarily a citizen. Slavery for its part was very little debated as a political question, serving to demarcate the domain of “politics” by contrast with it rather than being considered as a topic within it (see Garnsey 1996 for a full account including exceptions to that generalization). The exclusion of women from active citizenship in Athens was more consciously felt, giving rise to fantasies of female-dominated politics in Aristophanic comedy (Lysistrata, Assemblywomen) and to tortured reflection in many tragedies (consider the titles of Medea; Phaedra; Trojan Women).

Among equals, however defined, the space of the political was the space of participation in speech, decision, and action. That invention of the political was the hallmark of the classical Greek world. Citizens, whether the few (usually the rich) or the many (including the poorer and perhaps the poorest free adult men), deliberated together as to how to conduct public affairs, sharing either by custom, by election, or by lot—the latter seen in Athens as the most democratic—in holding the offices for carrying them out. Rhetoric played an important role especially, though not only, in democracies, where discursive norms shaped by the poor majority were hegemonic in public even over the rich (Ober 1989).

At the same time, politics was shaped by the legacy of archaic poetry and its heroic ethos and by the religious cults which included, alongside pan-Hellenic and familial rites, important practices distinct to each city-state. This was a polytheistic, rather than monotheistic, setting, in which religion was at least in large part a function of civic identity. It was a world innocent of modern bureaucracy and of the modern move to intellectual abstraction in defining the state: the entity we would call “Athens” in the abstract was called in its own day by the collective noun for its living and breathing citizens, “the Athenians.” So if ancient political philosophy left out much that modern political philosophy would include (e.g., for the most part, the question of the justness of slavery), it also included much that the latter would tend to exclude: viewing an unquestioned civic religious cult, as well as the patterns of child-rearing, cultural stories expressed in music, epic, and drama, gender roles and sexual practices, military participation, as forming part of the “way of life” which constituted the politeia or “constitution” in its broadest sense. This broadest sense was initially most evident to the Athenians when they looked at the peculiar customs of Sparta, but Plato taught them to recognize that democratic Athens was as distinctive a regime (Schofield 2006: 31–43).

Most of the wise men (sophoi) and students of nature (physikoi) who appeared in this milieu thought within the same broad terms as the poets and orators. Justice was widely, if not universally, treated as a fundamental constituent of cosmic order. Some of the physikoi influenced political life, notably the Pythagoreans in southern Italy. Others held themselves aloof from political action while still identifying commonalities between nature and politics. However, this picture of broad consonance was rudely challenged in the mid to late fifth century BCE by a new kind of thinker and political agent, the professional teachers (“sophists”), who began to ask whether the laws and customs (nomos, singular) embodying political justice were truly a reflection of justice in nature (phusis), or merely an imposition of arbitrary human norms. Most of the sophists argued the latter, though they did so along a spectrum of interpretation (for which our evidence rests heavily on Plato, who portrays Socrates arguing with a considerable number of sophists): for Protagoras (as depicted in Plato's Protagoras), the human creation of political life was a cause of celebration of human virtues and practical abilities; for Thrasymachus (as depicted in Plato's Republic), it was a cause of condemnation, the powerful in any city imposing laws to serve their own interests. This nomos-phusis debate raised a fundamental challenge to the ordering intellectual assumptions of the polis, even though the sophists advertised themselves as teaching skills for success within it, a number of them being employed as diplomats by cities eager to exploit their rhetorical abilities. Socrates and Plato would respond to this challenge in shaping a new genre of “philosophy” which broke the mould of their predecessors. If Greek political thought presupposed justice, it also increasingly problematized it.

2.3 Politics and Philosophy

In giving birth to philosophy, the polis also gave birth to a tension between what Aristotle would describe as two lives: the life of politics and the life of philosophy. A faultline between ethics and politics, so closely connected in an ancient culture preoccupied with flourishing (eudaimonia) and virtue (aretê), opened here. Should philosophers should act politically (and if so, should they engage in ordinary politics in existing regimes, or work to establish new ones), or should they abstain from politics in order to live a life of pure philosophy? There was likewise a question as to whether philosophers should think politically: were human affairs worth thinking about in the broadest perspective opened by the study of nature and of the gods? In engaging with questions of rhetoric, virtue, knowledge, and justice, Socrates' philosophical life was engaged with the political even before his philosophical death (his trial and execution at the hands of the Athenian democratic regime) embattled him with it. But for his student Plato and Plato's student Aristotle, the practice and even the study of human affairs such as politics were less divine, and so less admirable, than the broader study of truth about the world. Philosophy might have to address the political but its highest calling soared above it. If Socrates' political fate was part of the stimulus for Plato to invent a new metaphysics and epistemology in order to articulate an alternative realm of political possibility, he simultaneously asserted an independence for those disciplines from the bonds of the political alone.[5]

This distinctive Greek—and particularly Platonic – outlook must condition any historical understanding of the development of ancient political philosophy. While one influential approach to the history of political thought takes its bearings from what a thinker was trying to do, from what he meant to do by what he said or wrote, it is important to recognize that the founders of ancient political philosophy were in part trying to define a new space of doing as philosophizing, independent of ordinary political action. This is not to say that they did not also have ordinary political intentions, but rather to stress that the invention of political philosophy was intended as a problematizing of the value of ordinary political life.

3. Socrates and Plato

According to Cicero, Socrates (469–399 BCE) was the first to bring philosophy down from heaven, locating it in cities and even in homes (Tusc.V.10). A humbly born man who refused the lucrative mantle of the sophistic role as a professional teacher, yet attracted many of the most ambitious and aristocratic youth of Athens to accompany him in his questioning of them and their elders as to the nature of the virtues they claimed to possess or understand, he left no philosophical writings. We know him only through the surviving testimony of others, primarily the dialogues written by his student Plato and his associate Xenophon, and the remarks of Plato's student Aristotle (he was also lampooned in Aristophanes' comic plays). [SEP: SOCRATES]

3.1 Socratic Ethics and Its Relation to Politics

Socrates seems to have been the first philosopher to treat ethics – as opposed to cosmology and physics—as a distinct area of inquiry. Asserting in Plato's Apology that “the unexamined life is not worth living,” he pressed for definitions of the virtues or excellences which were widely recognized and claimed by his fellows, but which they found difficult to explain. As depicted by Plato, the search for such definitions led invariably to a concern with knowledge as not only one of the conventional virtues (in the form of wisdom) but also as underpinning, even constituting, them all. That elevation of knowledge in turn led Socrates to militate against the practices of rhetoric and judgment which animated the political institutions of Athens—the law-courts, Assembly and Council. Instead he posited the existence, or at least the possibility, of political expertise, claiming to be the one person in Athens who at least tried to pursue such a true politikê technê (Grg. 521d). The notion of political knowledge limited to one or a few experts, as opposed to the embedded and networked knowledge produced and exercised by the whole demos of Athens in their judgments and deliberations, struck at the central premises of Athenian democracy and those of Greek politics more generally (in oligarchies, wealth rather than knowledge was the relevant criterion for rule; in tyrannies, sheer power). Thus the nature of Socrates' concern with ethics led him directly into a form of political philosophizing. The relation between politics and knowledge, the meaning of justice as a virtue, the value of the military courage which all Greek cities prized in their citizens, all seem to have been central topics of Socratic conversation.

3.2 Socrates' Trial: The Political Philosophy of Citizenship

That engagement with political philosophy was dramatically intensified when Socrates was, at the age of seventy, arraigned, tried, and sentenced to death by an Athenian court. Brought in the usual Athenian way by a group of his fellow citizens who took it upon themselves to prosecute him for the sake of the city, the charges against him were three-fold: not acknowledging the city's gods; introducing new gods; and corrupting the young (Apol. 24b). Each of these had a political dimension, given the civic control of central religious cults mentioned earlier, and the broad political importance of educating the young to take their place in the civic order. Timed a few years after a short-lived oligarchic coup in which several of Socrates' sometime associates (Critias, Charmides) participated, and after the ignominious Athenian defeat in the wars with Sparta which saw another earlier follower of Socrates (Alcibiades) turn traitor to Athens, the trial must be suspected of having served as a substitute for the prohibited political trials of the oligarchic partisans (such trials having been barred by a general amnesty passed in 403 BCE by the restored democracy; see Cartledge 2009, Ch.7).

Socrates' speeches in the court trial—literary versions of which were produced by Plato, Xenophon, and a number of other followers—forced him to confront directly the question of his role in an Athens defined by its democratic institutions and norms. Socrates had played his part as an ordinary citizen, allowing his name to go forward for selection by lot to serve on the Council, and serving in the army when required. But he had not engaged actively in “public affairs” (ta pragmata, Apol. 32e): he had not spoken in the Assembly (31c), nor, so far as we know, brought prosecutions or volunteered for selection for jury service in the law-courts. In Plato's account, after countering the religious accusations, Socrates acknowledged this abstention from public affairs but claimed to have had a more significant mission laid on him by the god Apollo when his oracle at Delphi declared that no man was wiser than Socrates: his mission was to stir up the city like a gadfly (30e), discussing virtue and related matters (38a), and benefiting each person by “trying to persuade him” to care for virtue rather than wealth for himself and for the city (36c-d). He went so far as to claim that as a civic benefactor, he deserved not death but the lifetime free meals commonly awarded to an Olympic champion (36e-37a). Socrates here depicts himself as a new kind of citizen, conceptualizing the public good in a new way and so serving it best through unprecedented actions in contrast to the conventionally defined paths of political contest and success (Villa 2001).

While depicting himself in his defense speeches in the Apology as a new kind of virtuous citizen, Socrates makes three remarks which have in modern times been seized upon as indications of the principled limits which he might have put on the requirement to obey the law. The first two recalled political incidents: while serving on the Council, he had voted against an illegal proposal (32b-c); and under the short-lived oligarchical coup of “The Thirty”, he had disobeyed an order of the ruling body to arrest a democratic partisan for execution (32c-d). The third is a hypothetical remark. If, he imagines, the jurors were to say to him, “we acquit you, but only on condition that you spend no more time on this investigation and do not practice philosophy, and if you are caught doing so you will die,” his reply would be: “I will obey the god rather than you, and as long as I draw breath and am able, I shall not cease to practice philosophy” (both quotations excerpted from longer sentences, 29c-d). Particularly in Anglophone twentieth-century scholarship, these remarks have engendered a view of Socrates as endorsing civil disobedience in certain circumstances, and so have framed the question of civil disobedience and the grounds for political obligation as arising in Plato. A significant debate on these matters took shape in the United States in the 1960s and 1970s at the time of widespread civil disobedience relating to civil rights and the Vietnam War: see for example Konvitz 1964, Woozley 1972.

That debate has had to confront the fact that Socrates did not actually disobey his own death sentence with which his trial concluded: when the time came, he drank the poisonous hemlock prescribed. Before that moment, Plato imagines Socrates being visited in prison by his friend Crito (in a dialogue which bears his name), and urged to escape for the sake of his friends and family, a practice which was tolerated in Athens so long as the escapee fled into exile. Socrates is not persuaded by Crito's arguments. He begins his examination of them by recalling principles to which he and Crito had in the past agreed, including the principle that it is better to suffer injustice than to commit it (Cri. 47a-50a). He then goes on to ventriloquize a series of speeches which he ascribes to the “Laws of Athens” against escape.[6] These speeches have attracted the attention of scholars eager to find in them grounds on which civil disobedience might be justifiable, notwithstanding the fact that Socrates himself chooses to obey the court's verdict and the enigmatic remarks he makes at the end of the dialogue, comparing the speeches of the Laws to the sounds made by the Corybantic mystery followers and saying that they “buzz” in his head, which seem to distance him from the claims voiced in their name (Harte 1999).

The “Laws of Athens” appeal to a kind of social contract made between themselves and Socrates. The contract is unequal: the “Laws” compare themselves to parents and slaveowners, and Socrates to child and slave. Obedience is owed because the “Laws” have provided the whole basis for Socrates' education and life in the city, a city in which he has notably chosen to remain, never traveling abroad except on military service. But the “Laws” also speak of the opportunity they afford to Socrates to “persuade or obey” them (51b; 51e-52a). The meaning of this clause and its relevance to civil disobedience is again much debated (Kraut 1984 remains a landmark). Nevertheless, the image of Socrates tried, convicted, and (by his own hand) executed by the city has come to be the most vivid and powerful symbol of tension in the relationship between political philosophy and political authority.

3.3 The Defense of Justice in the Republic

The Crito depends upon a notion of justice and injustice which it never defines. In the Republic, by contrast, a dialogue in which Socrates is also the main character (and first-person narrator) but in which the views he advances go beyond the tight-knit pattern of debates in the dialogues discussed in section 3.1, Plato (424/3–348/7 BCE)[7] offers an account of justice linking the political to the psychological and justice to a higher understanding of true goodness. [SEP: PLATO] The Republic is, with the Laws, an order of magnitude longer than any other Platonic dialogue. Readers today are likely to think of the Republic as the home par excellence of political philosophy. But that view has also been challenged by scholars who see it as primarily an ethical dialogue, driven by the question of why the individual should be just (Annas 1999). This section argues that the ethical and political concerns, and purposes, of the dialogue are inextricably intertwined.

Near the beginning of the dialogue, a challenge is launched by the character Thrasymachus, mentioned above, asserting that all actual cities define justice in the interest of the rulers. He takes this to mean that the ethical virtue of justice which their subjects are enjoined to cultivate—traditionally seen as the necessary bond among citizens and the justification for political rule—is in fact a distorted sham. [SEP: Callicles and Thrasymachus] The ethical question which Thrasymachus poses and which Plato's brothers Glaucon and Adeimantus reformulate—why should the individual be just if he or she can get away with not being just, when elevated above the demands of ordinary justice either by special power or good fortune?—thus already has a political correlate from the outset.

Socrates then launches a speculation as to the origins of cities: the city is held to have an existence independently of ethical concerns, coming into being for economic reasons and immediately needing to defend itself in war (and also to be able to make offensive war for economic gain). However, this political structure is made ethical when rulers are established who are able to use their wisdom to help their subjects maintain a psychological balance in their souls that approximates, if it does not fully embody, the virtues of moderation and justice and so enables them to enjoy a unified rather than a divided soul. The question of why the individual should be just, figured at the outset by the contrast with the putatively happy tyrant, is resolved eventually by demonstrating that the tyrant is at once maximally unjust and maximally unhappy.

That resolution rests on the division of the soul into three parts by which the Republic places moral psychology at the heart of political philosophy. Both soul and city are posited by Socrates in arguments in Books II-IV and VIII-IX, in particular, to have a tripartite structure (at least when the soul is embodied in a living person). In the soul and city respectively, the rational part or class should rule; the spirited part or class should act to support the rule of that rational part; and the appetitive part of the soul and producing class in the city should accept being governed by it. Both soul and city are therefore in need of, and capable of exhibiting, four virtues (427e-444a). Two of these pertain to individual parts: the rational part being capable of wisdom, the spirited part of courage. Two however are defined by relations between the parts: moderation as the agreement of all three parts that reason should rule, justice as each part doing its own (this echoes, in a radically new context, a conservative Athenian suspicion of excessive democratic polupragmosunê or busybody interference).

The result is that justice is defined as primarily a condition of one's soul or city as a whole, not as any specific just action; yet if the soul or city is so ordered, the individual will have no cause to engage in the paradigmatically unjust action of pleonexia or grasping for more than one's fair share. A just soul will indeed reliably issue in traditionally just actions, such as refraining from theft, murder, and sacrilege (contra Sachs 1963, who argues that Plato has simply abandoned the usual domain of justice). Yet its advantageousness to its possessor goes beyond these particular actions and omissions, lying in the health and orderliness of such a soul contrasted with the chaotic or even tyrannical character of an unjust soul. To be an effective agent at all, one must be just, moderate, courageous and wise. The just person enjoys psychic health, which is advantageous no matter how he is treated (fairly or unfairly) by gods and men; correspondingly, the just society enjoys civic unity, which is advantageous in being the fundamental way to avoid the assumed supreme evil of civil war.

By treating these ethical and political questions as interrelated, and then going on to depict both an ideal political regime (“Kallipolis”, the fine or beautiful city) in which they could be solved, and the imperfect regimes into which such an ideal regime will decay, the Republic lays out a novel and ambitious template for political philosophy: not only to interrogate the meaning of virtue and citizenship, but also to develop an ideal regime and an account of how and why such regimes may fail. That template will be followed by Aristotle's Politics, by Cicero's De Re Publica, and by Thomas More's Utopia, among other successors. In Plato's hands, however, this template included some specific political prescriptions to maintain the unity of the ideal city which most of his successors abhorred. In particular, Book V of the Republic suggests that a sufficiently unified regime can be achieved only by depriving its guardian-rulers of private property and of private families, instead making them live in austere communal conditions in which they are financially supported by their money-making subjects and allowed to procreate only when and with whom will best serve the city. Aristotle and Cicero would deplore this abolition of private property, and even those following and radicalizing Plato on property (applying the abolition of property to all the citizens, rather than only the rulers, as would the sixteenth-century More), were generally opposed to if not scandalized by the suggestion of procreative communism.

The Republic is further distinguished from even its closest progeny by also laying out a further template, for the integration of ethics and political philosophy into a comprehensive account of epistemology and metaphysics. By making the claim of the philosophers to rule depend on their knowledge of the good and of the other Platonic Forms (in conjunction with their moral character and tested practical experience), the dialogue vindicates the Socratic and Platonic thought that ruling well—what we might call “rule” proper – requires a rare form of expertise rather than lay judgment, rhetorical advice, or common knowledge. In the Republic, the knowledge required for rule is not specialized, but comprehensive: the knowledge of the good and the Forms is somehow to translate into an ability to make laws as well as the everyday decisions of rule. The rulers are philosophers who take turns exercising political authority, mimicking to that extent the rotation of offices in democratic Athens. They define their vocation as that of philosophizing, engaging in rule out of some sort of compulsion or necessity (SEP: Plato's Ethics and Politics in the Republic). To that extent the Republic presents a paradox: if it is widely considered the first major work of political philosophy,[8] it is nevertheless a work in which there is no special content to political knowledge nor any special vocation for politics.

3.4 The Definition of Political Knowledge in the Statesman

In the Statesman, Plato turns his attention to precisely the topics identified at the end of the last section above. In a discussion led by an unnamed person, a philosopher visiting Athens from Elea, political expertise (harking back to the politikê technê met above with Socrates, sect. 3.1) is identified by separating it progressively by a set of distinctions from other forms of expertise. The discussion is interrupted but ultimately enriched by a story or myth in which politics is shown to be a matter of humans ruling other humans in place of living under divine guidance. That human expertise of statecraft is ultimately distinguished from its closest rivals—strikingly, the democratic arts of rhetoric, generalship, and judging—by its knowledge of the correct timing (kairos) for the exercise and cessation of these other arts (Lane 1998). The statesman is wholly defined by the possession of that knowledge of when it is best to exercise the other arts and its exercise in binding the different groups of citizens together, a knowledge which depends on a broader philosophical grasp but which is peculiarly political. Here, political philosophy operates not to assimilate politics to a broader metaphysical horizon but to identify its specificity.

3.5 The “Second-Best” Regime of the Laws

The Laws, a work reported to have been still on wax tablets, and so presumably left unfinished, when Plato died (Diogenes Laertius III. 37), treats the specificity of politics as a matter not of distinct vocational expertise but of the requirements of a second-best city, one in which the ideal regime of Kallipolis requiring an absence of private property for the guardians is not followed. Here politics still aims at virtue, and at the virtue of all the citizens, but those citizens all play a part in holding civic offices; the ordinary activities of politics are shared, in what is described as a mixture of monarchy and democracy. That description would give rise to an idea of the “mixed regime” or “mixed constitution” which would become influential in its own right, as we shall see below (section 6).

Another influential aspect of the Laws is its concern with the nature of law itself as a topic proper to political philosophy. The Republic takes law in its stride as something the “founders” of Kallipolis (the dialogue's participants, primarily Socrates, Glaucon and Adeimantus) will employ; the Statesman analyzes law as a stubborn and imperfect substitute for the flexible deployment of expertise. While the Laws shares that notion of law per se as a brutish and stubborn commander, it recommends a “double” notion of law, in which each such command is prefaced with a persuasive account of its rationale, addressed to the citizens, who are expected to read and understand it (719b-723d, and passim). Some scholars have found that to be a distinctively democratic and liberal account of law (Bobonich 2002; see also [SEP: Plato on Utopia]). That arguably goes too far in a proceduralist direction, given that the value of law remains its embodiment of reason or understanding (nous), so that while adding persuasive preludes is a better way to exercise the coercive force of law, no agreement on the basis of persuasion could justify laws which departed from the standard of nous. Nevertheless the emphasis on all citizens as eligible to hold offices differs significantly from the Republic, where the only offices mentioned seem to be monopolized by the philosopher-rulers and the auxiliary guardians who assist them.[9] It develops at much more length the closing passages of the Statesman, which refer to the offices of rhetor, general and juryman which the citizens will hold (as they did in Athens). The Statesman however reserves a special extraordinary role (a higher office, or perhaps not an office as such) for the statesman whenever he is present in the city. The role of the Statesman's eponymous figure must therefore be distinguished from that of the “Nocturnal Council” in the Laws (which is actually to meet just before dawn), a body of citizens who are selected for wisdom and judiciousness and whose role is to review and revise the laws rather than (as in the Statesman) to override them when it is better to do so.

The Athenian Visitor, the protagonist in the Laws, presents the imagined new Cretan colony of Magnesia for which he and his Cretan and Spartan companions engage in legislating, as “second-best,” (739a), in that it does not involve the community of women and children, and the absence of private property, for all citizens of a city (here advocating a more stringent standard than even that of Kallipolis in the Republic). Much literature on Plato's political philosophy has debated whether this turn to the “second-best” reflects a new form of realism on Plato's part about politics more generally, invoking other remarks by the Athenian which suggest that no one could ever be uniformly and reliably virtuous and immune to corruption, though this is not unequivocally stated. Has Plato in the Laws given up on his earlier idealism which rested on the possibility of the philosopher-king, or on the idea of the perfectly knowledgeable statesman? If so, should that be interpreted as disillusionment or pessimism on his part, or as a more democratic or liberal turn? These questions structure the broad debate about the meaning and trajectory of Platonic political philosophy (for an overview, compare Klosko 2006 to Schofield 2006).

4. Aristotle

The two Platonic themes of superior political knowledge and, expressed particularly in his Laws, political participation, also structure the political thought of Aristotle (384–322 BCE), who studied in Plato's Academy. Living much of his life as a resident alien in Athens, with close familial ties to the extra-polis Macedonian court which would in his lifetime bring Athens under its sway, Aristotle at once thematized the fundamental perspective of the Greek citizenship of equals and at the same time acknowledged the claim to rule of anyone of truly superior political knowledge. While building on Plato's project of demarcating political expertise and depicting ideal as well as imperfect cities, the advances and new directions that Aristotle pioneered in political philosophy reflect disagreements with Plato in their wider philosophies.

4.1 Aristotle's Philosophical Method and Ethics

Whereas Plato's philosophy continually sought a single or small set of unifying truths behind the veil of appearance, Aristotle's wide-ranging researches into what would now be considered the natural sciences, as well as in logic and other areas of inquiry, manifested respect for the opinions of “the many and the wise” as a starting-point for philosophical understanding. His approach likewise manifested appreciation of the multiplicity of forms of knowledge, in particular the cleavage between theoretical understanding of the world as it necessarily is, and practical knowledge of how to deliberate about acting in relation to whatever “could be otherwise.” Uniting his accounts of phenomena as different as plants, animals, ethics and politics, was a teleological structure of explanation. Biological creatures work to fulfill the realization of their end or telos, the distinctive purpose that defines their fundamental nature—just as human artifacts are designed and used for specific ends. Human action posits its own telos in light of which the nature of each action is intelligible, but these should ideally reflect the overall natural telos of humans as such.

Here arises a problem unique to humans. Whereas other animals have a single telos defining their nature (living the life of a frog being the sole telos of each frog, in the example used by Lear 1998), humans both have a distinctive human nature—arising from the unique capacity to use language to deliberate about how to act – and also share in the divine nature in their ability to use reason to understand the eternal and intelligible order of the world. Practical reason is the domain of ethics and politics, the uniquely human domain, but the political life is not necessarily the best life, compared with that devoted to the divinely shared human capacity for theoretical reason and contemplation (conmpare Nicomachean Ethics I with X.7–9).

4.2 From Ethics to Politics by way of Law

In considering practical reason to be the domain of both ethics and politics, Aristotle follows Plato in drawing no sharp line between those two domains (see on this point for ancient testimonies and modern arguments respectively, Bodéüs 1993: 22–24 and 59–63). In fact he closes his Nicomachean Ethics by remarking that for most people, the practice of ethics can only be ensured by their being governed by law, which combines necessity (compulsion) with reason. Because, for most people, the ethical life presupposes government by law, the student of ethics must become a student of political science, studying the science of legislation in light of the collection of constitutions assembled by Aristotle and his school in the Lyceum. All but one of the over one hundred items in this collection reported in antiquity have been lost: the analysis of the “Constitution of Athens” was recovered from a portion of a papyrus discovered in the nineteenth century. Aristotle's theoretical claims about the nature of politics in the Politics must be understood against this backdrop. The legislator (for this is the standpoint adopted in the Politics: [SEP: Aristotle's Political Theory]) needs to have a grasp of the nature of politics as such; an understanding of the major faultlines in the interpretation and practice of politics; and a grip on the structure and characteristics of the specific city for which he aims to legislate.

4.3 The Projects of the Politics

These requirements correspond to the three distinct projects which Malcolm Schofield (1999, ch.6) has proposed as a schema for reading the Politics: a “rational” model or regulative ideal of the nature of politics (Books I-III: most egalitarian); a “political” model in which factions contest the interpretation and application of the principles of the rational model (predominantly in Books III-V: in particular, the meaning of equality contested between democrats and oligarchs, as noted above a characteristic faultline in Greek political life); and a “sociological” model of the functions needed for the city as an organism, which in Aristotle's hands excludes craftsmen and farmers from political participation based on lack of excellence and leisure respectively (canvassed at points in Books IV-VI and also in the description of the best regime in Books VII-VIII: least egalitarian, most hierarchical). Josiah Ober (1998) has controversially suggested a further project: that of political realization of the ideal virtuous regime of Books VII-VIII through Macedonian-led colonization of western Asia. Even if this suggestion is rejected, it reminds us that the standpoint of the legislator was not merely the appropriate standpoint to be adopted by the student of Aristotelian politics (as by the protagonists of Plato's Laws, legislating for a projected Cretan colony of Magnesia), but was also a recognized role in Greek political life: both in legend and in historical time, the founder-legislators of cities shaped their nomoi (both written laws and unwritten customs) in the context of selecting colonists, site, and officials for those cities to prosper.

The Politics begins in what we may call rational-model mode, offering an analysis of the teleological ends of life and the human capacity for speech which together support one of its two most famous contentions: that “it is evident that the state is a creation of nature, and that man is by nature a political animal” (I.2, 1253a2–3). While for modern readers this sentence is resonant with democratic sentiments, for Aristotle it is an analytical claim. Necessary (though not sufficient) for humans to accomplish their full potential for virtuous life is their exercise of their capacity for deliberative reasoning in speech about actions taken at the highest and most complete level of the political community. As Hannah Arendt (1958) emphasizes, Aristotle's understanding of civic unity insists on respect for human plurality as the condition of political action; in Book II, he criticizes Plato's Kallipolis for interpreting the requirement of civic unity in so extreme a fashion as to have obliterated the properly political domain altogether (Nussbaum 1980). (Nevertheless, civic unity is still an aim of Aristotle's ideal virtuous regime, and a limited Platonic spirit survives in the common meals that this regime would offer to all citizens: VII.10.) However, since this potential for politics can only be fulfilled by those who are indeed capable of virtue, politics is most fully realized not by an arithmetically based democracy in which all who can be counted as individuals can vote, but rather by a regime in which citizenship is limited to all and only the (sufficiently) virtuous.

In another famous contention of the work—that “a citizen is one who shares in governing and being governed” (III.13, 1283b42–1284a1, often translated as “ruling and being ruled in turn”), the Greek dictum of citizenship among equals is presented as an analytical truth, leaving open how such equality is to be conceived in practice. The citizen “shares in the administration of justice, and in offices” (III.1, 1275a23–24). In defective regimes, the good citizen and the good man may come apart. The good citizen of a defective regime is one whose character suits the particular regime in question (whether oligarchic, or democratic, say) and equips him to support it loyally; hence he may be deformed or stunted by participation in offices defined on incorrect terms. In “the best state,” however, the citizen is “one who is able and chooses to be governed and to govern with a view to the life of excellence” (III.13, 1284a1–3). In such a state, “the citizens must not lead the life of artisans or tradesmen, for such a life is ignoble and inimical to excellence” (VII.9, 1328b39–41, nor that of farmers, as political participation requires leisure. Here the limitations and exclusions among actual humans licensed by the principled formulation of the possibility—but need for actual realization—of human virtue become apparent.

Aristotle recognizes that there are other possible titles for political rule: “There is also a doubt as to what is to be the supreme power in the state:—Is it the multitude? Or the wealthy? Or the good? Or the one best man? Or a tyrant?” (III.10, 1281a11–13). He develops in particular detail the arguments that might be made on behalf of the many and the knowledgeable one respectively. The many can judge, as they did in Athenian dramatic audiences, juries, and the Assembly (where they “judged” the merits of a speaker's proposal), and their collective judging benefits insofar as each contributes his particular perspective, as a potluck feast is superior to a meal catered by one person alone (Waldron 1995). But the lesson Aristotle draws from this limits the role of the many to that of judging and electing to offices rather than to serving themselves in offices (III.11, 1281b31). The many can contribute to virtuous decision-making in their collective capacity of judgment – presumably in assemblies and juries—but not as individual high officials.

In the case of the one supremely excellent person, Aristotle argues that such a person has, strictly speaking, no equals, and so cannot be made justly to take his turn in rule as one citizen among others. Instead it is right that such a person should rule:

If, however, there be some one person, or more than one, although not enough to make up the full complement of a state, whose excellence is so pre-eminent that the excellence or the political capacity of all the rest admit of no comparison with his or theirs, he or they can be no longer regarded as part of a state; for justice will not be done to the superior, if he is reckoned only as the equal of those who are so far inferior to him in excellence and in political capacity. Such a man may truly be deemed a god among men ….men like him should be kings in their state for life. (III.13, 1284a3–11…1284b32–34; cf. III.17, 1288a24–29)

Yet this argument is left at the hypothetical level of an alternative title for political rule, or better, of an alternative title for a form of rule that is not political. When Aristotle considers political rule as such, the formulation of mutual rule in turn by a large body of sufficiently virtuous citizens remains preeminent.

In the political model which begins to supplement the rational model from Book III onward, the major issue is conflict between rival factions over the basis for defining equality and so justice. In the Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, Aristotle had identified two types of equality: geometrical, or proportional to merit; and arithmetical, or proportional to mere numerical counting. In Politics III.9 he picks up this distinction and aligns it with the conflict between oligarchical and democratic justice. As he later puts it, “Democrats say that justice is that to which the majority agree, oligarchs that to which the wealthier class agree…” (VI.3, 1318a18–20), while truly aristocratic justice would enfranchise only those equal in virtue.

This attention to the actual political contentions of rival Greek groups leads into a discussion of the relative goodness and badness of imperfect regimes, modeled in part on Plato's Statesman. Whereas the Platonic text had distinguished monarchy from tyranny, aristocracy from oligarchy, and good from bad democracy on the basis of obedience to law (all these regimes being conceived as lacking the genuine political knowledge of the true statesman), Aristotle instead makes the dividing line the question of ruling in the common interest as opposed to ruling in the interest of a single faction. The “bad” democracy, for example, rules for the faction of the many as opposed to the faction of the few, whereas the “good” democracy—which Aristotle baptizes “polity”—rules in the common interest of all citizens.

To this political account of regimes, Aristotle adds an historical-sociological account which has much in common with the narrative of Athens offered in the Constitution of Athens compiled by his school. Democracy has historically taken on various forms in Athens, degenerating from an aboriginal democracy of non-meddling farmers (VI.4), through various intermediate forms to a democracy (seemingly that of contemporary fourth-century Athens) in which men rule, not laws. Yet this trajectory does not prevent him from asserting that in general democracy is “most tolerable” of the three perversions (IV.2, 1289b4–5) and noting that it at least involves the characteristic political liberty of ruling and being ruled in turn (VI.2). The sociological inquiry comes to a head when the question of some single “best” regime is replaced by a question about not what is “best” in the “ideal” sense, but the good constitution “that is easily attainable by all” (IV.1, 1288a37–39) and in practice best for most cities (IV.11). This Aristotle calls the middling regime: a political, because sociological, mean between oligarchy and democracy, in which the middle classes hold the preponderance of both wealth distribution and political power—hence it is attainable through reform of either an oligarchy or a democracy, the most prevalent constitutions among the Greeks. Strikingly, his example of such a regime is Sparta: presented as a case of democratic distribution of education (among citizens only, of course) coupled with the aristocratic principle of election to offices rather than selection by lot (IV.9).

4.4 Aristotle in Political Philosophy

“All modern discussions of citizenship as a noninstrumental good-in-itself are indebted, if only indirectly, to him [sc. Aristotle]” (Ober 1998: 290). The Politics emphasizes that “a state is not a mere society, having a common place, established for the prevention of mutual crime and for the sake of exchange” but is rather “a community of families and aggregations of families [sc. united] in well-being, for the sake of a perfect and self-sufficing life” (III.9, 1280b30-34, with square brackets added). It has been argued in this article that the final clause of that sentence is important: citizenship is a noninstrumental good-in-itself only so long as it does indeed aim at the telos of a perfect life. That is, while Aristotle indeed valued political participation, he saw it as an intrinsic good only insofar as it was an expression of virtue. Without virtue, participation was to be valued on the basis of expedience.

Nevertheless, Ober's observation rings true of the historical significance of Aristotle's political thought. The medieval rediscovery in the West of the full Greek texts of Aristotle's Ethics and Politics and their translation into Latin in the thirteenth century served as a basis for reconceiving civic life as valuable on the basis of reason independent of revelation. Thus 1260 – the date of William of Moerbeke's complete Latin translation of the Politics—symbolizes a fundamental turning point in political philosophy, one in which Aristotelian philosophy would be widely deployed within certain strands of thought of the Catholic Church, while also inspiring a wide range of philosophical movements and later becoming the target of others.

Modern debates over the meaning of Aristotle find him a precursor of or inspiration for a range of intellectual and political positions: Aristotle as a communitarian (MacIntyre 1984) vs. Aristotle as an exponent of class conflict (Yack 1993); Aristotle as a democrat, or at least as providing the basis for democracy (Frank 2005), vs. Aristotle in opposition to Athenian democracy in his day (Ober 1998). One interesting development has been the use of Aristotle to articulate an ethics of capability (Nussbaum 1993). In evaluating Aristotle's political thought, it is important to distinguish between modern democratic assumptions and his own starting points, many of which were in tension with the democracy of his own time.

5. Hellenistic Philosophies and Politics

There were important developments in political thinking and practice under the Hellenistic kingdoms that supplanted Macedon in its suzerainty over the formerly independent Greek city-states. These included, for example, a genre of rhetorical letters addressed to rulers, and the important analysis of Greek and Roman constitutional change by the second-century Greek historian Polybius (Hahm 2000). This section will focus however on the implications for politics of the Epicurean and Stoic philosophical schools which, alongside others, emerged in this period. If the Cynics eschewed the city altogether, and the Epicureans eschewed political participation for the most part, the skeptics adhering to the radical Pyrrhonist position allowed their adherents to live in an ordinary way but without inner assent or conviction to any doctrine, similarly not a stance supportive of active political engagement. Thus of the major Hellenistic-founded schools, only the Stoics—blending Cynic and certain Platonic themes in an original combination—endorsed the political life and engaged much in theorizing politics directly.

5.1 Persisting and New Schools

It should be stressed that in addition to the major movements of Epicureanism and Stoicism treated below, other schools also persisted and arose in this period. Those persisting included the Platonic Academy (transformed in a skeptical direction) and the Aristotelian Lyceum (the Peripatetic School). Newcomers, albeit tracing themselves to their own understanding of the figure of Socrates, included the Cynics and the Pyrrhonist skeptics.

The Cynics took their name from the Greek for “dog,” referring to the animal-like life indifferent to social conventions which they pursued, carrying out all their bodily functions in full public view. While this generally led them to advocate what might be considered more an anti-politics than a politics, a provocative statement by their founder Diogenes of Sinope (c.404–323 BCE) – answering a query about his birthplace by asserting himself to be a “citizen of the world,” (Diogenes Laertius, VI. 63) – would resonate with later Stoics and others developing a political philosophy of “cosmopolitanism” [SEP: Cosmopolitanism]. Diogenes' indifference to political power was also reflected in his reported reply to the visiting world-conqueror Alexander the Great, asking him to request a boon: all the Cynic wanted was for the emperor to step out of his light (Diogenes Laertius, VI. 38). In their rejection of political and moral conventional opinion, the Cynics directly influenced the Stoics, yet they also have some parallels with the Epicureans and even with the skeptics.

One branch of ancient skepticism had its roots in Plato's Academy, which from the time of Arcesilaus' headship in the mid-260s BCE turned in a skeptical direction, arguing that there was no clear criterion of truth and so philosophers can only suspend judgment. While that was an “Academic” position within philosophical debate, a legendary figure (Pyrrho) had recently demonstrated the tranquility of mind which such a position could bring, by living a life seemingly without any investment in the truth of his beliefs (though the question of how, and how far, Pyrrho was guided by appearances would perplex later followers). From the first century BCE, a radical movement of “Pyrrhonist” skepticism was developed outside the Academy by Aenesidemus, followed about a century later by Agrippa, in a movement summed up for posterity in the second-century CE work of Sextus Empiricius (Outlines of Pyrrhonism) which would have a considerable influence on early modern philosophy. Meanwhile the milder “Academic” skepticism, allowing the inquirer to incline to one side or another though not to invest in full belief, had significant influence on first-century BCE figures such as Cicero. [SEP: Ancient Skepticism]

5.2 Epicureanism

Like the Cynics, the Epicureans are perhaps better characterized as anti-political than as political thinkers, though they offered a more complex evaluation of the origins and nature of politics. Politics was not, for them, part of the good life or a fulfillment of human nature as it was for Aristotle. Reports of Epicurus' “Key Doctrines” include instead a contractarian view of justice for mutual protection from harm (reminiscent of Glaucon's initial proposal about justice in Republic Book II, which itself seems to echo the nomos-phusis debate among the sophists). Justice serves utility. “If someone makes a law and it does not happen to accord with the utility of social relationships, it no longer has the nature of justice” (KD 36, LS 22B). The greatest utility is that of tranquility or security, which is the naturally desired end or goal. Hence the social contract is not fortuitous or merely conventional or second-best: it arises from and meets a natural need. While, as Annas 1993: 298 argues, the individual agent will be disposed to justice as part of the path to tranquility properly understood (“The just <life> is most free from disturbance…”, KD 36, LS 22B), nevertheless laws will be necessary to enforce obedience to the contract by most people.

The city serves a legitimate and necessary function in ensuring security. But this does not mean that an active public life is also a path to security. On the contrary, while many people will be attracted to the possible fortune and glory of such a life, and while cities need such people, the Epicurean wise man will on the whole refrain from active political participation. Instead the insecurities of life are best met by the formation of a community of friends. Friendships both secure us against risks and anxieties (more reliably than the hazards of a political career) and also provide pleasures and indeed joy: “The man of noble character is chiefly concerned with wisdom and friendship. Of these the former is a mortal good, but the latter is immortal” (Vatican Sayings 78, LS 22F (7)).

A sticking point for Epicurean ethics and politics is the justification for a further dimension of communal life: the willingness to sacrifice oneself for a friend, or to risk breaking the law for the greater good of one's fellow citizens (Sharples 1996: 122). That it is difficult to construct a compelling theoretical justification for such actions from Epicurean premises, which privilege obedience to law in order to avoid civic strife (as seen for example in Lucretius' poem De Rerum Natura, v.925–1157), did not prevent a number of Epicureans from such risky public service, not least the Roman Cassius who was one of the assassins of Julius Caesar. A more modest but still striking example of Epicurean public service is the huge portico inscribed with Epicurean sayings and exegesis in second-century Oenoanda (in modern-day Turkey) by one Diogenes of that city (Smith 1992, 2003). Whether or not his fellow citizens appreciated the instruction, modern archaeologists and philosophers are grateful for this unparalleled source of knowledge of ancient philosophy.

5.3 Stoicism

While Epicurus' default stance for the sage was not to engage in politics except if “some special circumstance disturbs him,” the Stoic Zeno held that such a person “will engage in politics unless something prevents it” (Seneca, De Otio 3.2, as translated and quoted in Sharples 1996: 124). Nevertheless, Stoics too had difficulty in justifying assassination of tyrants, holding that “civil war was worse than a law-flouting monarchy,” as one Roman Stoic would say in rebuffing Junius Brutus' attempt to recruit him to the conspiracy to murder Caesar (Plut. Brut. 12. 3–4; see Sedley 1997). As we shall see, their commitment to politics was generally expressed through a commitment to law and orderliness, despite a certain Cynic tincture of questioning whether existing laws are truly in accordance with the natural law.

Both the founder of the school, Zeno, and the school's later head Chrysippus wrote works in the Platonic genre entitled Republic, neither of which survives in full. (So too, reportedly, had Diogenes the Cynic.) Zeno's was written as a young man under Cynic influence, rejecting the use of money in the characteristic Cynic vein. His portrait of the republic combines the Stoic idea of a natural law by which human conduct is harmonized with cosmic order, with a classical vision of politics in which a Platonic ideal of friendship through communist and sexual bonding (more erotic than familial for Zeno) persists (Schofield 1991: 22–56). He seems to have adopted Plato's prescription for the community of women and children, and at least some aspects of his insistence on the potential civic equality of men and women and political irrelevance of their anatomical differences. Humans share many characteristics and tendencies with other animals, and their initial impulse to form into society is a social rather than strictly political one: they are animated by a tendency to associate with those akin to themselves (the Stoic notion of oikeiôsis). Such a social tendency is, according to what is reported of Chrysippus' lost treatise On Law, transformed into a political relationship by means of law (LS 67R). As for some tendencies in Platonism and Cynicism, such law might have to be radically different from existing laws if it is to be in full conformity with nature and reason. For Chrysippus, even certain forms of incest are said to have been “discredited without reason” (LS 67F): a comparison with animals would license them.

Plutarch's characterization of Zeno's Republic as prescribing that “we should regard all men as our fellow-citizens and local residents” (LS 67A) has often been read as prescribing cosmopolitanism: indeed Plutarch himself went so far as to take the aim of Zeno's treatise to have been fulfilled by the world-conquests of Alexander the Great (LS 67A), though this claim seems to have been a willful misunderstanding for his own purposes (Schofield 1991: 24, 104–11). But in fact, as in the case of Aristotle, the underlying kinship by nature establishes a potential only for a civic membership which is to be based solely on virtue. Thus it is reported that Zeno presented “only virtuous people in the Republic as citizens, friends, relations and free” (LS 67B). Especially for the early Stoics, the city remained an accepted arena both for political action—Stoic sages and scholars advising kings and serving in offices (LS 67W)—and for defining the nature of politics in terms of justice. However, over time later Stoics moved away from this classical concern with participation in specific cities, to a new ideal of a cosmic city in which all and only the wise are citizens. Malcolm Schofield (1991: 103) has argued that this development “mediates the transition from republicanism to natural law theory,” so bequeathing a crucial resource to early modern thinkers who sought to construct new versions of the latter. Nevertheless, in the years of the Roman republic, the affinity between Stoic and republican ideas proved significant, as we will now see.

5.4 Hellenistic Philosophies and Roman Republican Politics

Roman fascination with Greek philosophy was catalyzed by the Athenian embassy of three leading philosophers sent to Rome to plead the legal case of their city in 156/155 BCE;[10] it would continue as late as the early sixth century CE, exhibiting a last flourish in the life of the eminent philosophical polymath and Roman senator under barbarian rule, Boethius. Roman aristocrats were especially attracted to the Stoic willingness to countenance the kingly and political lives alongside the scholarly one as equally preferable (LS 67W), beginning to study the Stoa seriously from the late second century BCE. The affinity between Stoicism and Roman republicanism was enhanced by the second-century Stoic teacher Panaetius, who seems to have argued that the Roman mos maiorum or ancient ways and customs were the best form of government, so burnishing philosophical principle with the ancestral piety dear to the Romans. Thus the distinctive lineaments of the Roman republic, now to be described, were debated and interpreted by the philosophically minded in terms of Greek political theory.

While the founders of the city were said to be the legendary twins Romulus and Remus, Romans identified the origins of their distinctive liberty in the killing of a tyrannical king in 510 BCE, by the ancestor of the Junius Brutus who would eventually kill Julius Caesar. The position of king was replaced by two annually elected consuls, the royal council became the Senate, and popular assemblies were established to elect magistrates and pass the laws they proposed. By Cicero's time, this regime—self-identified as the S.P.Q.R., the “Senatus populusque Romanus” or “Senate and people of Rome”[11] – had become interpreted as the ideal form of the “mixed constitution” which had had a long if complicated and until then relatively minor history as an idea in the works of Thucydides, Plato, and Aristotle (Hahm 2009). An influential account of Rome as a mixed constitution, in this case combining the three classical regime forms of monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy, had already been given by the Greek historian Polybius, who referred to this as the distinction of powers (Histories 6.11–18; see von Fritz 1954). Cicero himself would refer to it as a system of checks and balances (compensatio, De rep. II. 57) with the language of “mixing” and “tempering” paramount, as observed by E.M. Atkins (2000: 491).

Each element of the constitution exercised a distinctive form of power. The elected consuls wielded imperium or executive power; the Senate enjoyed the power to deliberate and consent to specific policies; and the popular assemblies served as the source of authoritative law, also electing the magistrates and the popular tribunes who exercised veto powers over the Senate. An originally republican formula relating the consuls to the people as the source of authoritative law survives in a complete prescript of the Augustan period: “Titus Quinctius Crispinus [consul] lawfully asked the people, and the people lawfully resolved,” as translated in Lintott 1999: 3). The perennial Greek contest between oligarchs and democrats had been tamed in Rome to allow a recognized security of role for the Senate, a group drawn from no lower than the minor ranks of aristocracy and typically rewarding birth as well as merit. Yet the tumultuous personal quest for office and influence led many aristocrats to seek support among the people, sometimes with radical measures of land reform which Cicero, among others, resolutely opposed. The theorizing of the proper role of aristocratic leadership and Senatorial independence, together with Platonic analogies for the requisite concord and harmony in the city, would become central themes of Cicero's political philosophy. (“What the musicians call harmony with respect to song is concord in the state, the tightest and best bond of safety in every republic; and that concord can never exist without justice,” De rep. II.69.)

6. Cicero and the Roman Republic

6.1 Cicero: Life

Marcus Tullius Cicero (106–43 BCE) was the most famous “new man” of Roman politics, hailing from a minor provincial landowning family rather than the great clans of hereditary nobility. He rose to the office of consul and the Senatorial membership it conferred by his wits and audacity as a lawyer and orator in public prosecutions. His greatest moment as consul in 63 BCE came in exposing a conspiracy by Catiline; his brutal suppression of the conspiracy, executing Roman citizens without trial, would however tar his political legacy. He became an enemy of Julius Caesar (though accepting a pardon from him at the end of a stretch of civil wars in 47 BCE), seeing the assertion of rule by first Caesar and then Marc Antony as fatal to the republic. Having defended in his De officiis the murder of Caesar in 44 BCE, Cicero was himself murdered a year later by partisans of the then-ruling Triumvirate in which Antony figured.

The writings of Cicero were virtually canonized subsequent to his death as classic models of rhetoric and philosophy; as Richard Tuck (1990: 43) has remarked, “For fifteen hundred years, from the fourth century to the nineteenth, schoolchildren in Europe were exposed daily to two books. One was the Bible, and the other was the works of Cicero.”

His many speeches and letters are themselves of considerable political and often philosophical interest, while his philosophical writings—composed for the most part as a student of philosophy in Rome and Athens, and then in a brief period (46–44 BCE) when political developments led him to retreat from active public life – cover a wide range of topics of which politics is only a part. While Cicero would adhere to a moderate skepticism in general philosophical matters, he admired Panaetius and drew on a number of Stoic ideas in formulating his own ethical and political teachings. In particular, he emphasized the natural affinity for society and the existence of natural law. Here we will focus on his two writings modeled on Plato's, De re publica and De legibus (respectively On the Commonwealth and On the Laws), followed by his most important work of ethics, the De officiis (On Duties), which exercised particular influence on subsequent Western moral and political thought.

6.2 De re publica

De re publica was composed by Cicero between 54 and 51 BCE, a turbulent period of strife in Roman politics. Its dramatic setting is in 129 BCE at time of the crisis caused by Tiberius Gracchus, a consul who had championed a property redistribution law for the people and whom the Senate had suppressed as a threat to Roman civil order. All of it except the “Dream of Scipio” (Book VI) was lost from the Middle Ages onward; it has been reconstructed from references and excerpts in later authors, supplemented by a palimpsest of much of Books I-III discovered in 1819. Framed as a dialogue between Scipio Aemilianus, a hero of the anti-Gracchi resistance, and several others of his actual contemporaries, the dialogue has a discernible structure as identified by E.M. Atkins (2000: 490): Books I-II treat “the best condition of the res publica”; Books III-IV treat “justice and human nature”, topics common to the best city and the best citizen; and Books V-VI treat the “best citizen’ in the discussion of the statesman and in the Dream of Scipio.

While justice was for Cicero, as for the Greeks, the fundamental bond of the commonwealth, he offered distinctive and influential linked definitions of the res publica (“commonwealth”, but literally the “public thing”) as the res populi, the “property/thing of the people”, and of a populus or “people” in turn as “an assemblage associated with one another by agreement on law [iuris consensu] and community of interest [utilitatis communione]” (both, I.39). This could be interpreted either as a strong normative claim –the people agree on law, also translatable as right or justice, and share a common interest – or in a weaker deflationary manner, in which the people nominally accept a common law and share a common conception of their self-interest which may or may not be in accord with justice.[12] Such ambiguity would be famously exploited by Augustine, who used Cicero's definition to argue that lacking justice, conflicted and divided republican Rome had been no commonwealth, before offering his own even weaker definition of a “people” as those united in (any) common love (City of God, II.21). In Cicero's own hands, the definitions were used to stress that the commonwealth was the property of the people, who entrusted it to the magistrates to be used for the common good (I.51–2), and that the “welfare of the people is the supreme law” (“salus populi suprema lex”, De leg. III.8; this was a reference to a maxim in the ancient “Twelve Tables” compendium of Roman law). It followed too that just as Plato denied the title of a (single unified) regime to the imperfect regimes torn by civil discord, so Cicero inferred that corrupt regimes were not strictly speaking res publicae at all (III.43–48). The role of the statesman (rector rei publicae) is to aim at the happiness of the citizens, defined in a laxer way than most Greek philosophers would allow, as wealth, glory, and virtue all combined.

Cicero's spokesman Scipio adheres to Greek philosophical principles in declaring that “the commonwealth cannot possibly function without justice” (II.70), adhering to the standard abstract definition in an Aristotelian vein of justice as “giving each their due” (ius suum cuique tribuere). In Book III, two other dialogue participants present respectively the famous arguments given on one day for justice, and on the next day against justice, by the skeptical Greek philosopher and ambassador to Rome Carneades. Cicero's presentation reverses the order, no doubt to give justice the last word.

In Cicero's hands, Carneades' case against justice avails itself of the nomos/phusis contrast and of the kind of ambition for power expressed by Plato's character Callicles in the Gorgias. Justice is not natural, as it differs radically among different peoples; it conflicts with wisdom, which tells us “to rule over as many people as possible, to enjoy pleasures, to be powerful, to rule, to be a lord” (III.24b), and it is fatal for states and empires, which can't survive without injustice. The speech for justice avails itself in contrast of Stoic themes: “true law is right reason, consonant with nature”; there is “one eternal and unchangeable law” [i.e. what has come to be known as “natural law”] (III.33). This includes rule of the best over the weakest for the benefit of the latter (III.36): as in Plato's Republic, the justice of rulership is not exploitation but paternalistic benefit. And as in Plato's Book X, where the myth of Er supplies a revisionary religious justification for justice (it will help you to choose your next reincarnation well), so Cicero's Republic concludes with a dream recounted by Scipio Aemilianus about his even more eminent Roman ancestor, Scipio Africanus. The dream describes the divine order which both rewards humans for just service to their city (VI.13), and also puts human affairs in a cosmic perspective designed not to humble humans but to embolden them to care more for justice than for petty human advantage:

you must always look at these heavenly bodies and scorn what is human. What fame can you achieve in what men say, or what glory can you achieve that is worth seeking?” (VI.20)

In a dramatic rejection even of the traditional Roman motive of honor and glory as a motivation to virtue, the imagined elder statesman asks: “…and even the people who talk about us—how long will they do that?” (VI.21).

6.3 De legibus

De legibus, or On the Laws, is also written as a dialogue, but one set in Cicero's own day with himself, his brother, and closest friend as the interlocutors, gathered at his country estate of Arpinum. Probably begun after De re publica, it was likewise written in the years immediately before 51 BCE, and similarly survives only in piecemeal and fragmentary form. Books I-II treat natural law or ius naturae, with “Marcus” (Cicero himself) declaring that “law is the highest reason, rooted in nature” (I.18), and that men, bound to the gods by reason, are “born for justice” (I.28–32). However, “the corruption of bad habits…extinguishes…the sparks given by nature” (I.33) and can result in the formation of bad laws. Such iniquitous laws as those passed by tyrants are not just (I.42); nor is the title of law to be conferred upon “what bandits have agreed among themselves” (II.13).

In Books II-III, the speakers prescribe an ideal law code, based on but modifying Roman law; notably, for example, the institution of the tribunate is defended (III.16–17). As these prescriptions, and the circumstances of their writing (a temporary retreat from active politics), show, Cicero was not troubled by the Greek dilemma posing the lives of philosophy and of politics as opposed alternatives. He saw philosophy as a source of insight and perspective relevant to politics, but after his early studies, devoted himself to it only when temporarily debarred from more active pursuits: philosophy became a form of alternative public service when the forum was too dangerous for him to enter.

6.4 De Officiis

“The De officiis, not the De re publica, is Cicero's Republic” (Long 1995: 240). A. A. Long's dictum is true not only in the sense that for Cicero, as for Plato and Aristotle, ethics was inseparable from politics. It is true also and more profoundly insofar as the De officiis takes as its subject the same subject as Plato's Republic, namely the apparent conflict between justice and individual advantage, and proposes broadly the same resolution, namely that the conflict is only ever apparent: violating one's ethical duties can never serve one's advantage so long as both are properly understood. Book I treats what is virtuous, or honestas; Book II treats what is advantageous, or utilitas; and Book III considers cases to show that any apparent conflict is illusory.

The most difficult case to resolve according to the overall argument of the book is that of advantage when understood as political ambition, driven by greatness of spirit in the pursuit of glory. As Cicero acknowledges, and as was especially true in the highest echelons of Roman society, “Men are led most of all to being overwhelmed by forgetfulness of justice when they slip into desiring positions of command or honour or glory” (I.26). The solution is for true glory to be gained only through the fulfillment of one's officia. Similar casuistry enables Cicero to resolve in accordance with his thesis a range of common cases where advantage might be sought at the expense of justice (in administering the estate of an orphan, for example, a common duty of eminent Romans). Yet such casuistry is always advanced within a context of celebration of justice and natural law: it is not simply that in fact justice never conflicts with advantage, but that justice properly understood is always to one's advantage as a human being.

As in Plato, a redefinition of the virtues plays a crucial role in the overall argument for the benefits of justice. For Cicero, the virtues are Romanized as officia or obligations of role or relationship, each attaching to someone in virtue of a distinct persona (as father, consul, neighbor, etc.). Some virtues are rooted in one's persona as a human being subject to natural law, others in the specific roles and customs of one's city. Four principal virtues are identified: wisdom; justice, resting on fides (good faith and credit) and respect for property; greatness of spirit; and decorum. Respect for property is a keystone of Cicero's political thought, here very far from the Platonism which subordinated property to civic harmony.

Strikingly, whereas tyrannicide might appear to be a difficult case for such an ethical code to confront, Cicero presents it – writing later in the year that Caesar was assassinated—as the straightforwardly ethically correct choice. Cicero couches his case in Stoic terms of naturalness and fellowship. His pivotal move is to deny that tyrants are party to the otherwise universal nature of human fellowship: “…there can be no fellowship between us and tyrants…just as some limbs are amputated if they are…harming other parts of the body, similarly if the wildness and monstrousness of a beast appears in human form, it must be removed from the common humanity…of the body” (Off. III.32: ostensibly about the tyrant Phalaris). Yet it has been observed that for the committing of tyrannicide, at least, Stoicism was not a strong or obvious support: if the wise are already free, and only the foolish are slaves, why should the Stoic risk his own life in killing a tyrant?[13] In extremis, Cicero prized the survival of the republic above all else, and so fashioned an eclectic justification, blending Stoic themes with Platonic imagery, for the elimination of its would-be destroyers.

7. Political Philosophy in the Roman Empire

Although Rome had an empire before Cicero died and remained technically a republic for centuries afterward, the transformation of the republic into an empire is standardly associated with the elevation of Octavian as princeps or prince, literally first citizen among equals, who was proclaimed “Augustus” by the Senate in 27 BCE. Stoicism continued to exercise an important hold over many Roman political minds under the empire, drawing in part on the Hellenistic genre of advice to kings to which Stoics among others had contributed. In the imperial era, important Stoics ranged from the philosopher Seneca—tutor and advisor to the first-century emperor Nero—to the second-century emperor, Marcus Aurelius, and the Stoic ex-slave Epictetus who taught and wrote around the turn of the first and second centuries CE. Other forms of philosophy also flourished however, in particular new forms of Platonism among Greek-speaking philosophers. Such Platonism was also influential on Christian and Jewish thinkers alike, but this article leaves aside such developments. It also leaves aside the many and varied important contributions to political thought in Rome and its possessions made not by philosophers but by historians, including Livy, Sallust, Diodorus Siculus, Tacitus, and Suetonius.

7.1 Later Stoicism

If Cicero as a new man made senator had to contend with the competitive pressures of republican politics, Seneca (c. 3 BCE–65 CE), as a new man (from Spain) made senator a century later, had to contend with the problem of advising, and surviving, the poisonous politics of the imperial court. Seneca too wrote essays in natural philosophy, as well as a De officiis (which is lost), and important collections of letters, including his distinctive “consolations” which would inaugurate a new philosophical genre [SEP: Seneca]. His most important surviving work for political philosophy is his De clementia (“On mercy”), addressed to the emperor Nero whom he served as tutor and advisor. Presenting itself as a “mirror” in which Nero could see himself and the consequences of his virtue (1.1.1), this text would become a fountainhead of the “mirror for princes” genre revived in the Renaissance.

For Seneca, Stoic philosophy can be squared with politics if and only if the ruler is supremely virtuous: in that case, the Stoic wise man is king or prince. Clemency or mercy is so crucial a virtue because the ruler has power derived from, and akin to, that of the gods; it is of the utmost importance that this power not be abused. Rooted in but going beyond the Greek idea of philanthrôpia or love of humankind, clemency responds to the Stoic conception of universal human fellowship while at the same time embodying the ruler's distinctive virtue (it had been one of “the four virtues attributed to Augustus on an honorific shield,” as observed by Griffin 2000: 540). This clemency should also extend to slaves: Seneca concerned himself with their welfare, but his cosmopolitanism stopped short of advocating their manumission or the abolition of slavery (Griffin 1992: 256–85).

Seneca did not limit himself to the political function of advising rulers. Instead, he conceived the role of philosophy as benefiting people generally, in the widest sense of a cosmopolitan ethics and even politics. His De otio (“On Leisure”) contrasts the single commonwealth embracing gods and men in a cosmic and cosmopolitan citizenship, with the ordinary multiple commonwealths to which the accidents of birth assign us (4.1). Should such an ordinary regime turn lethal, the philosopher remains a citizen of the cosmic commonwealth and his serenity should remain intact. That fate befell Seneca himself in 65 CE, when Nero accused him of conspiring in a planned assassination of the emperor and ordered him to commit suicide. Seneca's suicide however reflected not so much political obedience as the belief, previously expressed in his writings (in particular De providentia and De ira, as well as his letters) that suicide is a supreme mark of freedom. No tyranny can so enslave us as to take away this freedom: a freedom to act based on the inner liberation of realizing that death and other worldly losses are in fact indifferent and irrelevant to happiness (Inwood 2005: 307–9).

Seneca's appeal to a cosmopolitan context for philosophizing reflects the general shift in later Stoicism noted above (section 5.3). For the early Stoics—Zeno, Chrysippus, and Cleanthes—discussion of natural law did not nullify the fact that the Greek polis remained the principal frame of reference. So too did the republic serve Roman Stoics of and before Cicero's time. However, as Rome became an empire under Augustus, so the frame of reference for Stoicism shifted to emphasize the cosmic political world-order as the relevant framework for ethics, if not for politics, whether one were a senator (Musonius Rufus), former slave (Epictetus), or emperor (Marcus Aurelius). The latter two figures in particular made significant contributions to ethics, some of which can be interpreted as bearing on political philosophy. For example, for Epictetus, the political distinction between slavery and freedom, which earlier Stoics had interpreted in terms of moral status, became relevant again on a cosmic and divine scale: “…know that you are a slave in a great family. So also the people of Nicopolis are used to exclaim, ‘By the fortune of Caesar, we are free’” (Diss. IV.1.12–14:). Yet such slavery to the divine was consistent with perfect moral freedom achieved by reason. Marcus Aurelius, despite his imperial power, eschewed political philosophizing for individual ethics and incremental political reform, admonishing himself and his reader in his Meditations: “Don't hope for Plato's Republic, but be content to advance a tiny extent, and reflect that its outcome is not something trivial” (2.49). None of these philosophers constructed an extensive or developed political theory.

7.2 Platonisms and Other Philosophies in the Empire

While the men of affairs in the Roman Senate and imperial court turned often (though not exclusively) to Stoicism, in the Greek centers of philosophy and among provincial Greek men of affairs Platonism remained an important framework for thinking about both ethics and politics, as did a related if somewhat shadowy form of Pythagoreanism which can be seen as a continuation of the genre of Hellenistic kingship treatises (Centrone 2000). The most important contributions made to political thought by the Platonist philosopher of the second-century AD, Plutarch, are his paired biographical lives of Greek and Roman statesmen, each with a comparison drawing political morals. Together with the histories of Thucydides, Livy and Sallust, these Lives instructed generations of students in the principles and perils of political ethics, and instituted the distinction between statesman and demagogue as we have come to know it today: with figures like the fifth-century BCE Athenian “Aristides the Just” embodying the ideal statesmen, in contrast to the Platonic view of all past and present statesmen as fatally flawed. Plutarch also made important contributions to political philosophy in the many essays collected in his volumes of Moralia.

Plutarch was a committed but in some ways revisionist Platonist. His attitude to public life was more Roman than Platonic (befitting the role in public affairs that he played in his own city): the political life was for him unproblematically noble, not inferior to the life of philosophy. Similarly, he revised the strict Platonic dictum that philosophers must rule by allowing that philosophers might rule merely in the sense of advising rulers, not of being rulers themselves. (In fact, this move had some Platonic pedigree in the Statesman's insistence that the science of statecraft is the same whether known and exercised by an advisor or by an actual ruler.) And he considered philosophy to be more of a character-building study than a source of knowledge of exact or politically relevant knowledge. Where statesmen were educated in philosophy, as for example in the Lives of Pericles, Cicero, Brutus, and Cato Minor, he treats this as valuable mainly because of the virtue—in particular, moderation and self-restraint—which it imparts to them (Van Raalte 2005). The study of philosophy serves as a sort of inoculation against greed and immoderate ambition. But it need not impart any particular substantive knowledge to the statesman (so competing philosophies could all be useful in shaping virtue: Anaxagaorean influence on Pericles, an eclectic mixture of Stoicism, Academic skepticism, and Platonism on Cicero; Stoicism on the younger Cato). Indeed, excessively rigid adherence to a philosophy could be deleterious, making a statesman rigid and inflexible. The younger Cato was defeated when he stood for the consulship because, Plutarch says, he experienced the same thing that happens to fruits that appear “out of season” (Phoc. 3.1). Like such fruits, he was admired, but “the weight and grandeur” of his virtue was “out of all proportion to the immediate times” (asummetron tois kathestōsi kairois, Phoc. 3.2–3).

Plutarch's political sympathies lay with monarchy. He treated the exemplary Greek or Roman statesman as inherently and ideally a kind of monarchical figure, even when functioning within a democratic or republican environment. “Aristocratic and kingly” was his praise for Pericles' type of true statesmanship (literally, his “politics” or “policy”, politeia), once he has given up his initial recourse to demagogic methods (Per.14.2). Thus for all his admiration for Greek statesmen of the classical age (Spartan as well as Athenian, we must remember) and profound later influence on republican sentiments in Europe, Plutarch preferred monarchy as the best constitution and believed that he was following his master Plato in so doing. As John Dillon puts it, he held “that the accomplished statesman, like a first-rate musician, will be able to make the best of any of the three basic constitutions [monarchy, aristocracy, or democracy] that he is given to work on” (Dillon 1997). To quote Plutarch himself on this point from his fragmentary writing “On Monarchy, Democracy, and Oligarchy”:

…if he [the statesman] is given the choice among governments, like so many tools, he would follow Plato's advice and choose no other than monarchy, the only one which is able to sustain that top note of virtue, high in the highest sense, and never let it be tuned down under compulsion or expediency. For the other forms of government in a certain sense, although controlled by the statesman, control him, and although carried along by him, carry him along, since he has no firmly established strength to oppose those from whom his strength is derived… (Peri mon. 827bc)

Plato's collective virtuous aristocracy (his philosopher-kings and -queens, in the plural; though contrast the singular figure identified in the Statesman) was transmuted by Plutarch into a monarch.

Later Platonic philosophers, known as Neoplatonists, also focused primarily on ethics in the context of cosmology and theology, stressing the ascent of the soul to a disembodied pure understanding of the One. Yet they made room for the political virtues of the embodied soul as a first step in this process of divinization or “becoming like God” (O'Meara 2003). In working out the political implications of such views, Plato's Laws became an important model for theocratic political reform, especially as Neoplatonism became influential for a certain strand of Christian thinkers, in particular those able to absorb the translation of Greek texts into Arabic.

8. Conclusion

On a continuum of political rule stretching from the sheer domination of some over others on one extreme, to a vision of collaborative deliberation among equals for the sake of the good life on the other, most ancient Greek and Roman political philosophers clearly staked out the latter ground. The very idea of the city and the civic bond as rooted in justice was common ground across the spectrum of ancient political philosophy. Even the Epicureans saw society as rooted in justice, although understanding justice in turn as rooted in utility. (However, this generalization, like many about ancient philosophy, leaves the ancient skeptics and Cynics aside.) Such philosophers were not however innocent of objections to this approach. The diagnosis of politics as domination has never been more powerfully advanced than by Plato's character Thrasymachus, nor has the attack on justice as a good life for the individual ever been as powerfully made as by Plato's character Callicles or the skeptic Carneades. The nostalgic view of ancient political philosophy as predicated on widely shared conceptions of human nature and the human good, before the splintering and fracturing of modernity, is an oversimplification.

It is true that those ancient visions of politics which rooted themselves in a commitment to ethical cultivation and the common good did not have to contend with the absolutist claims of rival versions of monotheistic religions. But the ancients did have to answer various forms of relativism, immoralism, and skepticism, contending with rival philosophical schools which disagreed profoundly with one another. If some of them chose to see politics as a domain of common benefit and a space for the cultivation of virtue, this was not because it had not occurred to them that it could be thought of otherwise, but in part because they had developed powerful philosophical systems to support this view. The experience and practices of the Greek polis and the Roman res publica played important roles in shaping these approaches.

Plato and Aristotle can in many ways be seen as defending some fundamental tenets of Greek ethics (such as the value of justice), but doing so by means of advancing revisionist philosophical doctrines and distancing themselves from the ways in which those tenets were interpreted by the democratic institutions of their day. The range of ethical and political views which they, along with their Hellenistic successors, laid out, continue to define many of the fundamental choices for modern philosophy, despite the many important innovations in institutional form and intellectual approach which have been made since. Many of those innovations, indeed, came in response to a revival of the ancient skeptical and relativist challenges: challenges already known from their evolution within ancient political philosophy itself.


This bibliography focuses on political philosophy rather than the entire corpus of an author's work, and gives only an overview of some important sources for this vast field. Fuller bibliographies for most of the works and authors discussed can be found in the related articles listed below.

Primary Literature

The Oxford Classical Text series has been used for citation, together with A. A. Long and D. N. Sedley (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [Greek and Latin texts in vol.2], which is abbreviated LS in the body of this entry. Other editions of reference include the Teubner and Budé series, and for the Stoics, Hans von Arnim, Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta (Leipzig, 1903– 5; vol. 4 indexes, 1924).


The list below is arranged chronologically in relation to the Greek and Latin texts that are translated in each case.

  • Gagarin, M. and P. Woodruff, (eds.), 1995, Early Greek Political Thought from Homer to the Sophists, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cooper, J. M., (ed.), 1997, with D.S. Hutchinson (assoc.ed.), 1997, Plato: Complete Works, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Barnes, J., (ed.), 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Everson, S., (ed.), 1996, Aristotle, The Politics and The Constitution of Athens, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [uses translations from Barnes (ed.) 1984].
  • Long, A. A., and D. N. Sedley, (eds.), 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [translations and commentary, volume 1].
  • Griffin, M.T., and E.M. Atkins, (eds.), 1991, Cicero, On Duties, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Zetzel, J.E.G., (ed.), 1999, Cicero, On the Commonwealth and On the Laws, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Inwood, B., (ed.), 2007, Seneca: Selected Philosophical Letters translated with introduction and commentary, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cooper, J. M. and J.F. Procopé, 1995, Seneca: Moral and Political Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dobbin, R.F., (ed.) 2008, Epictetus: Discourses and Selected Writings, London: Penguin.
  • Farqharson, A.S.L., (ed.), 2008, The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

The Loeb Classical Library is a useful collection of classical texts with facing translations, and has been used here for the English translations of Plutarch's Lives (in eleven volumes, all translated by Bernadotte Perrin) and Moralia (in sixteen volumes, by various translators).

Secondary Literature

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  • Atkins, E.M., 1990, “‘Domina et regina virtutum’: justice and societas in De Officiis,” Phronesis, 35: 258–89.
  • –––, 2000, “Cicero,” in Rowe and Schofield 2000, pp. 477–516. Bobonich, C., 2002, Plato's Utopia Recast: his later ethics and politics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bodéüs, R., 1993, The Political Dimensions of Aristotle's Ethics, trans. J.E. Garrett, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Cartledge, P., 2009, Ancient Greek Political Thought in Practice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • De Blois, L., J. Bons, T. Kessels and D.M. Schenkeveld (eds.), 2005, The Statesman in Plutarch's Greek and Roman Lives (vol.2 of The Statesman in Plutarch's Works), Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Dillon, J., 1997, “Plutarch and the end of history,” in Mossman 1997, pp. 233–240.
  • Frank, J., 2005, A Democracy of Distinction: Aristotle and the work of politics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • von Fritz, K., 1954, The Theory of the Mixed Constitution in Antiquity: a critical analysis of Polybius' political ideas, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Garnsey, P., 1996, Ideas of Slavery from Aristotle to Augustine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • –––, 2000, “Seneca and Pliny,” in Rowe and Schofield 2000, pp. 532–558.
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  • –––, 2009, “The Mixed Constitution in Greek Thought,” in A Companion to Greek and Roman Political Thought, R.K. Balot (ed.), Chichester: Wiley-Blackwell, pp. 178–98.
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  • Inwood, B., 2005, Reading Seneca: Stoic philosophy at Rome, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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  • Konvitz, M., 1964, “Civil Disobedience and the Duty of Fair Play,” in Law and Philosophy: A Symposium, S. Hook (ed.), New York: New York University Press, pp. 19–28.
  • Kraut, R., 1984, Socrates and the State, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Laks, A., 1990, “Legislation and demiurgy: on the relationship between Plato's Republic and Laws,” Classical Antiquity, 9: 209–29.
  • –––, 1991, “L'utopie législative de Platon,” Revue philosophique, 4: 417–28.
  • –––, 2000, “The Laws,” in Rowe and Schofield 2000, pp. 258–292.
  • Laks, A., and M. Schofield, (eds.), 1995, Justice and Generosity: studies in Hellenistic social and political philosophy: Proceedings of the Sixth Symposium Hellenisticum, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lane, M.S., 1998, Method and Politics in Plato's Statesman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lear, J., 1988, Aristotle: The Desire to Understand, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lintott, Andrew, 1999, The Constitution of the Roman Republic, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Long, A.A., 1995, “Cicero's Politics in De officiis,” in Laks and Schofield 1995, pp. 213–40.
  • Meier, C., 1990, trans. David McLintock, The Greek Discovery of Politics, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Mossman, J., (ed.), 1997, Plutarch and His Intellectual World, London: Duckworth.
  • Nails, D., 2002, The People of Plato: a prosopography of Plato and other Socratics, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Nightingale, A., 1993, Genres in Dialogue: Plato and the construction of philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nussbaum, M.C., 1980, “Shame, separateness, and political unity: Aristotle‟s criticism of Plato,” in Essays on Aristotle's Ethics, A.O. Rorty (ed.), Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, pp. 395–436.
  • Nussbaum, M., 1993, “Non-relative virtues: an Aristotelian approach,” in The Quality of Life, M.C. Nussbaum and A. Sen (eds.), 1993, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 242–69.
  • Ober, J., 1989, Mass and Elite in Democratic Athens: rhetoric, ideology, and the power of the people, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1998a, “The Polis as a Society: Aristotle, John Rawls, and the Athenian Social Contract,” as reprinted in his The Athenian Revolution, Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 161–187.
  • –––, 1998b, Political Dissent in Democratic Athens: intellectual critics of popular rule, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2008, Democracy and Knowledge: innovation and learning in classical Athens, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • O'Meara, D.J., 2003, Platonopolis: Platonic political philosophy in late antiquity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Powell, J.G.F., and J.A. North, (eds.), 2001, Cicero's Republic, London: Institute of Classical Studies.
  • Sachs, D., “A Fallacy in Plato's Republic,” The Philosophical Review, 72 (1963): 141–158; reprinted in G. Vlastos (ed.) Plato: a collection of critical essays, II: Ethics, Politics, and Philosophy of Art and Religion (New York: Doubleday and Company, 1971), pp. 35–51.
  • Schofield, M., 1991, The Stoic Idea of the City, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; reprinted 1999, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 1999, ‘Equality and hierarchy in Aristotle's thought’, in his Saving the City: Philosopher-Kings and other classical paradigms, London and New York: Routledge, ch.6 (pp. 88–100).
  • –––, 2006, Plato. Political Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Sedley, D.N., 1997, “The ethics of Brutus and Cassius,” Journal of Roman Studies, 87: 41–53.
  • Sharples, R., 1996, Stoics, Epicureans and Sceptics: an introduction to Hellenistic philosophy, London: Routledge.
  • Smith, M. F. (ed.), 1992, The Epicurean Inscription / Diogenes of Oenoanda, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • –––, (ed.), 2003, Supplement to The Epicurean Inscription / Diogenes of Oenoanda, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Tuck, R., 1990, “Humanism and Political Thought,” in A. Goodman and A. MacKay (eds.), The Impact of Humanism on Western Europe, New York: Longman, pp. 43–65.
  • Van Raalte, M., 2005, “More philosophico: Political Virtue and Philosophy in Plutarch's Lives,” in De Blois et. al. (eds.) 2005, pp. 75–112.
  • Villa, D., 2001, Socratic Citizenship, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Waldron, J., 1995, “The Wisdom of the Multitude: Some Reflections on Book 3, Chapter 11 of Aristotle's Politics,” Political Theory, 23: 563–584.
  • Weiss, R., 1998, Socrates Dissatisfied: an analysis of Plato's Crito, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Woozley, A.D., 1972, “Socrates on Disobeying the Law,” in The Philosophy of Socrates: a collection of critical essays, G. Vlastos (ed.), Garden City, NY: Anchor Books, pp. 299–318.
  • Yack, B., 1993, The Problems of a Political Animal: community, justice, and conflict in Aristotelian political thought, Berkeley: University of California Press.

Reference Works

  • Aalders, G.J.D., 1975, Political Thought in Hellenistic Times, Amsterdam: H.M. Hakkert.
  • Algra, K., and J. Barnes, J. Mansfeld and M. Schofield, (eds.), 1999, The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Armstrong, A.H., (ed.), 1967, The Cambridge History of Later Greek and Early Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Balot, Ryan K., (ed.), A Companion to Greek and Roman Political Thought, Chichester: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Coleman, J., 2000, A History of Political Thought, vol.1: From Ancient Greece to Early Christianity, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Keyt, D., and F.D. Miller, Jr., (eds.), 1991, A Companion to Aristotle's Politics, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Keyt, D., and F.D. Miller, Jr., (eds.), 2007, Freedom, Reason, and the Polis: Essays in Ancient Greek Political Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rowe, C., & M. Schofield, (eds.), 2000, The Cambridge History of Greek and Roman Political Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sharples, R. W., 1996, Stoics, Epicureans and Skeptics, London: Routledge.

There are useful series of Cambridge Companions, Cambridge Histories, and Blackwell Companions, among other such series, to various authors, texts, and schools, some of which are cited above. An authoritative source of important articles is H. Temporini (ed.), 1972-, Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt, Berlin and New York: De Gruyter.

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Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | Aristotle, General Topics: political theory | Carneades | cosmopolitanism | doxography of ancient philosophy | Epicurus | ethics: ancient | Plato | Plato: Callicles and Thrasymachus | Plato: ethics and politics in The Republic | Plato: on utopia | Pythagoreanism | Seneca | skepticism: ancient | Socrates | Socratic Dialogues | Stoicism

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