Notes to Ancient Political Philosophy

1. I will use both “city” and “city-state” to refer to the polis, though neither of these nor any English word fully captures its meaning; unlike our “city,” the polis encompassed both an urban area and a rural hinterland, while unlike our “state,” its political identity was not conceived as distinct from the body of active citizens which comprised it.

2. This is roughly translatable by the British ‘the great and the good’, but with those two terms synonymous rather than disjunctive: not a separate group of ‘the good’ such as the bishops still sitting in the House of Lords, but rather ‘the good’ as precisely the wealthy and well-born.

3. Free women had a passive citizen status, and only a very few manumitted slaves and aliens were, exceptionally, granted citizenship in any city.

4. On the fundamental difference between democracy and oligarchy, see Aristotle: ‘…what is authoritative everywhere is the governing body of the polis, and the governing body is the politeia. I mean, for example, that in democracies the dēmos is authoritative, while by contrast it is the few (hoi oligoi) in oligarchies; we say that the politeia too is different in these [two] cases,’ (Politics III.1278b8–12, as trans. in Ober 1998a, 164). Herodotus' ‘Persian debate’ in his Histories 3.80–82 contrasted spokesmen for monarchy, aristocracy (the honorific form of oligarchy: ‘rule of the best’), and democracy. Monarchy and tyranny (originally not necessarily pejorative) were also important forms of government, but the major civic conflicts of the mid-fifth to late-fourth centuries were contests between partisans of democracy and of oligarchy.

5. It is worth noting that while Plato is most often credited with inventing ‘political philosophy’ as a genre, he did not qualify philosophia with politikê. While he postulated a politikê technê or epistêmê, he saw the philosopher's knowledge as encompassing a comprehensive rather than narrowly political field. Likewise, while he wrote in the first half of the fourth century, those of his dialogues with historical settings are all fifth century: he appears to see this as the distinctive crucible of Athenian politics.

6. The relation between the principles advanced in his own name, and those advanced by the “Laws”, is controversial; it would be attractive, with Weiss 1998, to be able to find sufficient grounds for Socrates' obedience in the “never commit injustice” principle, though this requires an account to be given of why escape would constitute injustice, which is difficult to make out in this portion of the dialogue alone.

7. In giving these dates for Plato's life, contrary to those offered in certain other SEP articles, I follow Nails (2002).

8. See however Laks 2000: 258, who reserves that distinction for Plato's Laws.

9. This may help to explain a striking contrast. In Kallipolis, the poor farmers and artisans are citizens, but they do not hold offices: only the philosopher-kings and their assistant guardians seem to hold offices. In Magnesia, all citizens hold offices (including certain educational offices reserved for female citizens), but the citizen body is defined much more narrowly, similarly to that of Aristotle's ideal virtuous regime in the Politics, with artisans and the landless poor being excluded.

10. The ambassadors were the Academic [skeptic] Carneades, the Stoic Diogenes, and the Peripatetic [Aristotelian] Critolaus. The Romans had sent emissaries of their own about three centuries earlier to study Greek constitutions, in the course of drawing up their own first set of law codes.

11. Compare the acronym U.S.A., which refers to the states as the components of the federation rather than referring to the Senate and the people as the joint sources of its governance.

12. See Kempshall 2001 for an analysis of these divergent possibilities and their significance for later political thought.

13. Junius Brutus, for his part, was no Stoic, but rather an Academic Platonist, belonging to the one philosophical school that had consistently hated tyrants: Sedley 1997.

Copyright © 2010 by
Melissa Lane <>

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