Supplement to Aristotle's Psychology

The Active Mind of De Anima iii 5

After characterizing the mind (nous) and its activities in De Anima iii 4, Aristotle takes a surprising turn. In De Anima iii 5, he introduces an obscure and hotly disputed subject: the active mind or active intellect (nous poiêtikos). Controversy surrounds almost every aspect of De Anima iii 5, not least because in it Aristotle characterizes the active mind—a topic mentioned nowhere else in his entire corpus—as ‘separate and unaffected and unmixed, being in its essence actuality’ (chôristos kai apathês kai amigês, tê(i) ousia(i) energeia; DA iii 5, 430a17–18) and then also as ‘deathless and everlasting’ (athanaton kai aidion; DA iii 5, 430a23). This comes as no small surprise to readers of De Anima, because Aristotle had earlier in the same work treated the mind (nous) as but one faculty (dunamis) of the soul (psuchê), and he had contended that the soul as a whole is not separable from the body (DA ii 1, 413a3–5).

While not strictly a contradiction, this constellation of views does present a serious interpretative difficulty. How could the active mind be separable if it is a capacity of the soul and the soul is not separable? How, indeed, might a capacity be separated from that of which it is a capacity? Typically we expect capacities to be grounded and not free-floating. In what precise sense, then, is the active mind separable, conceptually or ontologically? For that matter, from what precisely is the active mind held to be separable—the body, the other faculties of the soul, or some unspecified category of being? What, exactly, is the active mind (nous poiêtikos) and how is it related to the unqualified mind (nous) discussed in the previous chapter? Should we, in fact, even regard the active mind as a capacity of the human soul, or is that merely an assumption of some of Aristotle's readers? If it is indeed a capacity of the human soul, does this imply that Aristotle envisages some form of personal immortality for human beings, perhaps something akin to the view espoused by Plato in the Phaedo?

These and like questions have exercised the commentary tradition from antiquity down to the present day.[1] When addressing them, Aristotle’s interpreters scatter in strikingly different exegetical directions. So varied are their approaches, in fact, that it is tempting to regard De Anima iii 5 as a sort of Rorschach Test for Aristotelians: it is hard to avoid the conclusion that readers discover in this chapter the Aristotle they hope to admire. Christian exegetes tend to see it as a vindication of the compatibility of personal immortality and soul-body hylomorphism;[2] other readers, thinking that a non-starter, regard the chapter as an abrupt change of topic in the midst of De Anima, by contending that in it Aristotle has left off talking about human beings and has turned his attention instead to the impersonal, self-thinking god of Metaphysics xii.[3] The first and most consequential fault line, then, concerns whether De Anima iii 5 should be taken as characterizing the human mind or the divine mind.

Those who read De Anima iii 5 as pertaining to the human soul are quick to point out that even as Aristotle introduced the inseparability of the soul earlier in the work, in De Anima ii 1, he held out mind (nous) as at least possibly exceptional: ‘nothing hinders some parts [of the soul] from being separable, because of their not being the actualities of any body’ (DA ii 1, 413a3–7; cf. i 1, 403a3–b19, ii 2, 413b24–7, iii 4, 429a10–13, b5–5). This exception, they further note, is continuous with a similar remark made in the Metaphysics: ‘We must inquire whether any [form] survives afterward. For in some cases nothing prevents this, for example if the soul is of this sort—not all soul but mind (nous), for perhaps it is impossible for the entire soul to survive’ (Met. xii 3, 1070a24–6). Those of the second persuasion, who think that Aristotle must be talking about the divine mind, are not impressed. They note in reply that in De Anima iii 5 Aristotle uses the sort of language he tends to reserve for the unmoved mover of the Metaphysics xii and Physics viii, and further that De Anima is best regarded as a work of biology with a focus on ensouled material beings, including plants no less than human and non-human animals. As such, it is a work whose general orientation leaves scant space for such extravagant, essentially Platonic hypotheses.

Unfortunately, it is not possible to settle even this basic controversy with confidence. To begin, given the extensive ambiguities of the language of the chapter, neither approach can be ruled out on narrowly textual grounds. Moreover, the several illustrations and analogies in the chapter all admit of multiple interpretations, while the argumentative structure of the chapter, upon which one might rely to force one interpretation over another, is regrettably thin. Consequently, De Anima iii 5 is permanently contestable in terms of its final commitments.

The chapter in its entirety runs as follows:

Since in all of nature something is the matter for each genus (and this is all those things in potentiality), while something else is their cause and is productive (poiêtikon), by producing them all as a craft does in relation to the matter it has fashioned, necessarily these same differentiations are present in the soul. And one sort of mind exists by coming to be all things and one sort of mind exists by producing all things, as a kind of positive state, like light. For in a certain way, light makes colors existing in potentiality colors in actuality.

And this mind is separate and unaffected and unmixed, being in its essence actuality. For what produces is always superior to what is affected, as too the first principle is to the matter.

[Actual knowledge is the same as the thing known, though in an individual potential knowledge is prior in time, though it is not prior in time generally.][4]

But it is not the case that sometimes it thinks and sometimes it does not. And having been separated, this alone is just as it is, and this alone is deathless and everlasting, though we do not remember, because this is unaffected, whereas passive mind is perishable. And without this, nothing thinks.

The translation offered represents something of the compression and obscurity of Aristotle's Greek. Very little is clear about the chapter, and nothing is uncontroversial.

To give some sense of the complexities involved in interpreting these few lines: Brentano's commentary runs to some seventy pages, a ratio of almost five pages to each one line of Greek (Brentano 1977). As one Aristotelian commentator has fairly noted, ‘There is no passage of ancient philosophy that has provoked such a multitude of interpretations as this half-page chapter. Its obscurity and extreme brevity are notorious’ (Theiler 1983, 142).

That allowed, most scholars will accept at least the following characterizations of De Anima iii 5, even as they differ about their proper interpretations:

  • Aristotle introduces a division into mind (nous) which he maintains is present generally in nature, between the active and the passive (DA 430a10–14).
  • The active mind is compared to a craft, while the passive mind is likened to matter (DA 430a12–13).
  • The active mind is compared to light, which in a certain way makes colours that exist in potentiality exist in actuality (DA 430a16–17).
  • Having been separated, the active mind alone is deathless and everlasting (DA 430a23–24).
  • Passive mind, by contrast, is perishable (DA 430a24–25).
  • Because the active mind is unaffected, we are not in a position to remember—something or other at some time or other. Unfortunately Aristotle does not specify what exactly we cannot remember or when (DA 430a23–24).
  • Without this (this = either the passive mind or the active mind), nothing thinks—or one thinks nothing (DA 430a25).

To the degree that there is agreement about these general claims, there is commensurate disagreement about how each is to be understood and developed.

The ambiguity of the last claim provides a useful illustration of the sorts of difficulties we encounter when we approach De Anima iii 5 for careful study: in the phrase (‘without this nothing thinks,’ or ‘without this x thinks nothing’; aneu toutou outhen noei; 430a25), one cannot even be sure about the intended referent of the demonstrative ‘this’ (touto) or about whether ‘nothing’ (outhen) is the subject or object of ‘thinks’ (noei). Thus, depending upon how it is construed, Aristotle's Greek can be understood in at least four different ways: (i) without the active mind, nothing thinks; (ii) without the active mind, the passive mind thinks nothing; (iii) without the passive mind, nothing thinks; and (iv) without the passive mind, the active mind thinks nothing. These possibilities are not idle: we find different commentators understanding Aristotle's text in these markedly different ways.[5] Each interpretation seems justifiable in its own terms, and so none is indisputably to be preferred over its competitors, at least not on narrowly linguistic grounds. Interpretive questions thus begin without firm textual data. What holds for this single phrase iterates through the entire chapter.

Consequently, although some progress is to be made by minute philological analysis of De Anima iii 5, the text as it stands leaves unanswered many of the questions with which we began. Evidently, if genuine progress is to be made regarding the final purport of Aristotle's doctrine of the active mind, it will be achieved by investigating De Anima iii 5 holistically, by ascertaining, that is, how various hypotheses concerning its possible claims and their likely significance integrate with other, comparatively settled doctrines in Aristotelian psychology and metaphysics.

Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Shields <Christopher.Shields@lmh.ox.ac.uk>

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