Aristotle (384–322 BC) was born in Macedon, in what is now northern Greece, but spent most of his adult life in Athens. His life in Athens divides into two periods, first as a member of Plato’s Academy (367–347) and later as director of his own school, the Lyceum (334–323). The intervening years were spent mainly in Assos and Lesbos, and briefly back in Macedon. His years away from Athens were predominantly taken up with biological research and writing. Judged on the basis of their content, Aristotle’s most important psychological writings probably belong to his second residence in Athens, and so to his most mature period. His principal work in psychology, De Anima, reflects in different ways his pervasive interest in biological taxonomy and his most sophisticated physical and metaphysical theory.
Because of the long tradition of exposition which has developed around Aristotle’s De Anima, the interpretation of even its most central theses is sometimes disputed. Moreover, because of its evident affinities with some prominent approaches in contemporary philosophy of mind, Aristotle’s psychology has received renewed interest and has incited intense interpretative dispute in recent decades. Consequently, this entry proceeds on two levels. The main article recounts the principal and distinctive claims of Aristotle’s psychology, avoiding so far as possible exegetical controversy and critical commentary. At the end of appropriate sections of the main article, readers are invited to explore problematic or advanced features of Aristotle’s theories by following the appropriate links.
- 1. Aristotle’s Psychological Writings
- 2. Hylomorphism in General
- 3. Hylomorphic Soul-body Relations
- 4. Psychic Faculties
- 5. Nutrition
- 6. Perception
- 7. Mind
- 8. Desire
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Aristotle investigates psychological phenomena primarily in De Anima and a loosely related collection of short works called the Parva Naturalia, whose most noteworthy pieces are De Sensu and De Memoria. He also touches upon psychological topics, often only incidentally, in his ethical, political, and metaphysical treatises, as well as in his scientific writings, especially De Motu Animalium. The works in the Parva Naturalia are, in comparison with De Anima, empirically oriented, investigating, as Aristotle says, “the phenomena common to soul and body” (De Sensu 1, 436a6–8). This contrasts with De Anima, which introduces as a question for consideration “whether all affections are common to what has the soul or whether there is some affection peculiar to the soul itself” (De Anima i 1, 402a3–5). That is, in De Anima Aristotle wants to know whether all psychological states are also material states of the body. “This,” he remarks, “it is necessary to grasp, but not easy” (De Anima i 1, 402a5). In this way, De Anima proceeds at a higher level of abstraction than the Parva Naturalia. It is generally more theoretical, more self-conscious about method, and more alert to general philosophical questions about perception, thinking, and soul-body relations.
In both De Anima and the Parva Naturalia, Aristotle assumes something which may strike some of his modern readers as odd. He takes psychology to be the branch of science which investigates the soul and its properties, but he thinks of the soul as a general principle of life, with the result that Aristotle’s psychology studies all living beings, and not merely those he regards as having minds, human beings. So, in De Anima, he takes it as his task to provide an account of the life activities of plants and animals, along side those of humans (De Anima ii 11, 423a20–6, cf. ii 1, 412a13; cf. De Generatione Animalium ii 3, 736b13; De Partibus Animalium iv 5, 681a12). In comparison with the modern discipline of Psychology, then, Aristotle’s psychology is broad in scope. He even devotes attention to the question of the nature of life itself, a subject which falls outside the purview of psychology in most contemporary contexts. On Aristotle’s approach, psychology studies the soul (psuchê in Greek, or anima in Latin); so it naturally investigates all ensouled or animate beings.
There is, however, one telling point of contact between Aristotle’s investigations into the soul and the contemporary discipline of Psychology: in each case, different questions yield different directions and methods of inquiry, with the result that it is sometimes hard to appreciate how so many variegated enterprises, though conducted under one and the same rubric, could really belong to any one coordinated discipline. Someone studying methods of Freudian psychoanalysis will not, after all, have any immediate overlap of either interest or method with a brain physiologist or a behavioral geneticist. In a similar way, Aristotle seems reluctant to regard an inquiry into the soul as belonging exclusively to natural science, which is for him the branch of theoretical science devoted to investigating beings capable of undergoing change. (He contrasts “physics”, that is, natural science, with both mathematics and “first philosophy” along these lines; Meta. vi 1 1025b27–30, 1026a18; xi 7 1064a16–19, b1–3.) On the one hand, he insists that because various psychological states, including anger, joy, courage, pity, loving, and hating, all involve the body in central and obvious ways, the study of soul “is already in the province of the natural scientist” (De Anima i 1 403a16–28). At the same time, however, he insists that the mind or intellect (nous) may not be enmeshed in the body in the same way as these sorts of states, and so denies that the study of soul falls in its entirety to the natural scientist (Meta. vi 1 1026a4–6; De Partibus Animalium i 1 645a33-b10). This is presumably why in the opening chapter of De Anima Aristotle reports a deep and authentic perplexity about the best method for investigating psychological matters (De Anima i 1 402a16–22). If different sciences employ different methods and the study of soul is bifurcated so that it belongs to no one science, there will indeed be a genuine difficulty about how best to proceed in any inquiry concerning it. It seems fair to say that these sorts of quandaries have not left us altogether. Although purely naturalistic approaches to philosophy of mind have found staunch champions in contemporary times, it would nevertheless be safe to say that much of the discipline continues to employ traditional a priori methods; some branches of cognitive science seem an admixture of both. In any case, in view of the difficulties concerning the soul he enumerates, Aristotle evinces an appropriate modesty when undertaking its investigation: “Grasping anything trustworthy concerning the soul is completely and in every way among the most difficult of affairs” (De Anima i 1 402a10–11).
In De Anima, Aristotle makes extensive use of technical terminology introduced and explained elsewhere in his writings. He claims, for example, using vocabulary derived from his physical and metaphysical theories, that the soul is a “first actuality of a natural organic body” (De Anima ii 1, 412b5–6), that it is a “substance as form of a natural body which has life in potentiality” (De Anima ii 1, 412a20–1) and, similarly, that it “is a first actuality of a natural body which has life in potentiality” (De Anima ii 1, 412a27–8), all claims which apply to plants, animals and humans alike.
In characterizing the soul and body in these ways, Aristotle applies concepts drawn from his broader hylomorphism, a conceptual framework which underlies virtually all of his mature theorizing. It is accordingly necessary to begin with a brief overview of that framework. Thereafter it will be possible to recount Aristotle’s general approach to soul-body relations, and then, finally, to consider his analyses of the individual faculties of soul.
‘Hylomorphism’ is simply a compound word composed of the Greek terms for matter (hulê) and form or shape (morphê); thus one could equally describe Aristotle’s view of body and soul as an instance of his “matter-formism.” That is, when he introduces the soul as the form of the body, which in turn is said to be the matter of the soul, Aristotle treats soul-body relations as a special case of a more general relationship which obtains between the components of all generated compounds, natural or artifactual.
The notions of form and matter are themselves, however, developed within the context of a general theory of causation and explanation which appears in one guise or another in all of Aristotle’s mature works. According to this theory, when we wish to explain what there is to know, for example, about a bronze statue, a complete account necessarily alludes to at least the following four factors: the statue’s matter, its form or structure, the agent responsible for that matter manifesting its form or structure, and the purpose for which the matter was made to realize that form or structure. These four factors he terms the four causes (aitiai):
|The material cause: that from which something is generated and out of which it is made, e.g. the bronze of a statue.|
|The formal cause: the structure which the matter realizes and in terms of which the matter comes to be something determinate, e.g., the Hermes shape in virtue of which this quantity of bronze is said to be a statue of Hermes.|
|The efficient cause: the agent responsible for a quantity of matter’s coming to be informed, e.g. the sculptor who shaped the quantity of bronze into its current Hermes shape.|
|The final cause: the purpose or goal of the compound of form and matter, e.g. the statue was created for the purpose of honoring Hermes.|
For a broad range of cases, Aristotle implicitly makes twin claims about these four causes: (i) a complete explanation requires reference to all four; and (ii) once such reference is made, no further explanation is required. Thus, when appropriate, appeal to the four causes is both necessary and sufficient for completeness and adequacy in explanation. Although not all things which admit of explanation have all four causes, e.g., geometrical figures are not efficiently caused, even a brief overview of his psychological writings reveals that Aristotle regards all four causes as in play in the explanation of living beings. A monkey, for example, has matter, its body; form, its soul; an efficient cause, its parent; and a final cause, its function. Moreover, he holds that the form is the actuality of the body which is its matter: an indeterminate lump of bronze becomes a statue only when it realizes some particular statue-shape. So, Aristotle suggests, matter is potentially some F until it acquires an actualizing form, when it becomes actually F. Given his overarching explanatory schema, it is hardly surprising that Aristotle should advance a hylomorphic account of soul and body; this is, for him, standard explanatory procedure.
Still, it is noteworthy that this four-causal framework of explanation was developed initially in response to some puzzles about change and generation. Aristotle argues with some justification that all change and generation require the existence of something complex: when a statue comes to be from a lump of bronze, there is some continuing subject, the bronze, and something it comes to acquire, its new form. Thus the statue is, and must be, a certain kind of compound, one of form and matter. Without this type of complexity, generation would be impossible; since generation in fact occurs, form and matter must be genuine features of generated compounds. Similarly, but less obviously, qualitative change requires much the same apparatus: when a statue is painted, there is some continuing subject, the statue, and a new feature acquired, its new color. Here too there is complexity, and complexity which is readily articulated in terms of form and matter, but now of form which is evidently inessential to the continued existence of the entity whose form it is. The statue continues to exist, but receives a form which is accidental to it; it might lose that form without going out of existence. By contrast, should the statue lose its essential form, as would happen for example if the bronze which constitutes it were melted, divided, and recast as twelve dozen letter openers, it would cease to exist altogether.
For the purposes of understanding Aristotle’s psychology, the origin of Aristotle’s hylomorphism is significant for two reasons. First, from its inception, Aristotle’s hylomorphism exploits two distinct but related notions of form, one of which is essential to the compound whose form it is, and the other of which is accidental to its subject. In advancing his view of the soul and its capacities, Aristotle employs both of these notions: the soul is an essential form, whereas perception involves the acquisition of accidental forms. Second, because Aristotle’s hylomorphism was initially developed to handle puzzles of change and generation, its deployment in philosophical psychology is sometimes strained, insofar as Aristotle is not immediately willing to treat every instance of perception and thought as a straightforward instance of change in some continuing subject. Moreover, as we shall see, it is sometimes difficult to appreciate how Aristotle can justifiably regard the body as the matter of a human being in the way that the bronze is held to be the matter of a statue. Bronze can exist as an indeterminate lump, being potentially but not actually the statue of a great hero. There is no ready analogue in the case of the body: the body is not so much stuff lying about waiting to be enformed by a soul. Rather, in one important sense, human bodies become human bodies by being ensouled. If so, then they seem ill-suited to play the role of matter in precisely those terms given by Aristotle’s hylomorphic theory of generation. (For further discussion of this topic, after reading the next section, see Supplement: A Fundamental Problem about Hylomorphism.)
In applying his general hylomorphism to soul-body relations, Aristotle contends that the following general analogy obtains:
|soul : body : : form : matter : : Hermes-shape : bronze|
If the soul bears the same relation to the body which the shape of a statue bears to its material basis, then we should expect some general features to be common to both; and we should be able to draw some immediate consequences regarding the relationship between soul and body. To begin, some questions about the unity of soul and body, an issue of concern to substance dualists and materialists alike, receive a ready response. Materialists hold that all mental states are also physical states; substance dualists deny this, because they hold that the soul is a subject of mental states which can exist alone, when separated from the body. In a certain way, the questions which give rise to this dispute simply fall by the wayside. If we do not think there is an interesting or important question concerning whether the Hermes-shape and its material basis are one, we should not suppose there is a special or pressing question about whether the soul and body are one. So Aristotle contends: “It is not necessary to ask whether soul and body are one, just as it is not necessary to ask whether the wax and its shape are one, nor generally whether the matter of each thing and that of which it is the matter are one. For even if one and being are spoken of in several ways, what is properly so spoken of is the actuality” (De Anima ii 1, 412b6–9). Aristotle does not here eschew questions concerning the unity of soul and body as meaningless; rather, he seems, in a deflationary vein, to suggest that they are readily answered or somehow unimportant. If we do not spend time worrying about whether the wax of a candle and its shape are one, then we should not exercise ourselves over the question of whether the soul and body are one. The effect, then, is to fit soul-body relations into a larger hylomorphic pattern of explanation in terms of which questions of unity do not normally arise.
It should be emphasized, however, that Aristotle does not here decide the question by insisting that the soul and body are identical, or even that they are one in some weaker sense; indeed, this is something he evidently denies (De Anima ii 1, 412a17; ii 2, 414a1–20). Instead, just as one might well insist that the wax of a candle and its shape are distinct, on the grounds that the wax could easily exist when the particular shape is no more, or, less obviously, that the particular shape could survive the replenishment of its material basis, so one might equally deny that the soul and body are identical. In a fairly direct way, though, the question of whether soul and body are one loses its force when it is allowed that it contains no implications beyond those we establish for any other hylomorphic compound, including houses and other ordinary artifacts.
One way of appreciating this is to consider a second general moral Aristotle derives from hylomorphism. This concerns the question of the separability of the soul from the body, a possibility embraced by substance dualists from the time of Plato onward. Aristotle’s hylomorphism commends the following attitude: if we do not think that the Hermes-shape persists after the bronze is melted and recast, we should not think that the soul survives the demise of the body. So, Aristotle claims, “It is not unclear that the soul – or certain parts of it, if it naturally has parts – is not separable from the body” (De Anima ii 1, 413a3–5). So, unless we are prepared to treat forms in general as capable of existing without their material bases, we should not be inclined to treat souls as exceptional cases. Hylomorphism, by itself, gives us no reason to treat souls as separable from bodies, even if we think of them as distinct from their material bases. At the same time, Aristotle does not appear to think that his hylomorphism somehow refutes all possible forms of dualism. For he appends to his denial of the soul’s separability the observation that some parts of the soul may in the end be separable after all, since they are not the actualities of any part of the body (De Anima ii 1, 413a6–7). Aristotle here prefigures his complex attitude toward mind (nous), a faculty he repeatedly describes as exceptional among capacities of the soul.
Still, in general, the soul is the form of the body in much the same way the form of a house structures the bricks and mortar from which it is built. When the bricks and mortar realize a certain shape, they manifest the function definitive of houses, namely that of providing shelter. Thus, the presence of the form makes those bricks and that mortar a house, as opposed, e.g., to a wall or an oven. As we have seen, Aristotle will say that the bricks and mortar, as matter, are potentially a house, until they realize the form appropriate to houses, in which case the form and matter together make an actual house. So, in Aristotle’s terms, the form is the actuality of the house, since its presence explains why this particular quantity of matter comes to be a house as opposed to some other kind of artifact.
In the same way, then, the presence of the soul explains why this matter is the matter of a human being, as opposed to some other kind of thing. Now, this way of looking at soul-body relations as a special case of form-matter relations treats reference to the soul as an integral part of any complete explanation of a living being, of any kind. To this degree, Aristotle thinks that Plato and other dualists are right to stress the importance of the soul in explanations of living beings. At the same time, he sees their commitment to the separability of the soul from the body as unjustified merely by appeal to formal causation: he will allow that the soul is distinct from the body, and is indeed the actuality of the body, but he sees that these concessions by themselves provide no grounds for supposing that the soul can exist without the body. His hylomorphism, then, embraces neither reductive materialism nor Platonic dualism. Instead, it seeks to steer a middle course between these alternatives by pointing out, implicitly, and rightly, that these are not exhaustive options.
Further Discussion of Hylomorphism:
Although willing to provide a common account of the soul in these general terms, Aristotle devotes most of his energy in De Anima to detailed investigations of the soul’s individual capacities or faculties, which he first lists as nutrition, perception, and mind, with perception receiving the lion’s share of attention. He later also introduces desire, evidently as a discrete faculty on par with those initially introduced. The broadest is nutrition, which is shared by all natural living organisms; animals have perception in addition; and among natural organisms humans alone have mind. Aristotle maintains that various kinds of souls, nutritive, perceptual, and intellectual, form a kind of hierarchy. Any creature with reason will also have perception; any creature with perception will also have the ability to take on nutrition and to reproduce; but the converse does not hold. Thus, plants show up with only the nutritive soul, animals have both perceptual and nutritive faculties, and humans have all three. The reasons why this should be so are broadly teleological. In brief, every living creature as such grows, reaches maturity, and declines. Without a nutritive capacity, these activities would be impossible (De Anima iii 12, 434a22–434b18; cf. De Partibus Animalium iv 10, 687a24–690a10; Metaphysics xii 10, 1075a16–25). So, Aristotle concludes, psychology must investigate not only perceiving and thinking, but also nutrition.
There is some dispute about which of the psychic abilities mentioned by Aristotle in De Anima qualify as full-fledged or autonomous faculties. He evidently accepts the three already mentioned as centrally important. Indeed, he is willing to demarcate a hierarchy of life in terms of them. Even so, he also discusses two other capacities, imagination (De Anima iii 3) and desire (De Anima iii 9 and 10), and appeals to them in both his account of thinking and his philosophy of action. He does little, however, to characterize either in any intrinsic way. He evidently regards imagination as a sort of subordinate faculty, integrated in various ways with the faculties of nutrition, perception, and thought. Desire is still more complex. Despite its not occurring without the sensory faculty (De Anima iii 7 412a12–14), desire seems in the end elevated to a full capacity, primarily because of its role in the explanation of purposive behavior. His discussions of imagination and desire raise interesting questions about how Aristotle views the various capacities of soul as integrating into unified forms. They also raise questions along with his discussions of the other faculties as to how Aristotle conceives the unity of the whole soul. Some scholars seem content to characterize an Aristotelian soul as a set or sum of capacities, whereas Aristotle himself evidently demands a non-aggregative form of unity (De Anima ii 3 414b28–32, cf. iii 9 432a–b6).
When turning to these individual faculties of the soul, Aristotle considers nutrition first, for two related reasons. The first is straightforward: psychology considers all animate entities, and the nutritive soul belongs to all naturally living things, since it is “the first and most common capacity of soul, in virtue of which life belongs to all living things” (De Anima ii 4, 415a24–25). The second is slightly more complex, being at root teleological. Given that the higher forms of soul presuppose nutrition, its explication is prior to them in the order of Aristotle’s exposition.
Aristotle approaches his account of the nutritive soul by relying on a methodological precept which informs much of his psychological theorizing, namely that a capacity is individuated by its objects, so that, e.g., perception is distinguished from mind by being arrayed toward sensible qualities rather than intelligible forms (De Anima ii 4, 415a20–21). This induces him to offer what may sound initially like a pedestrian observation, that in nutrition there are three components, “that which is nourished, that by which it is nourished, and what nourishes (i.e. that which engages in nutrition).” This, however, Aristotle unpacks by maintaining that “what nourishes is the primary soul; what is nourished is the body which has this soul; and that by which it is nourished is nourishment (i.e. food)” (De Anima ii 4, 416b20–23). The interest of this suggestion lies in the implication that all and only living systems can be nourished, a consequence Aristotle makes more explicit by claiming that “nothing is nourished which does not have a share in life” (De Anima ii 4. 415b27–28) and that “since nothing is nourished which does not partake of life, what is nourished will be the ensouled body insofar as it is ensouled, with the result that nourishment (i.e. food) is related to the ensouled, and not coincidentally” (De Anima ii 4, 416b9–11). Here Aristotle means that food, as food, is definitionally related to life. Whatever is food is already such as to be necessarily related to living beings.
The significance of this observation resides in the thought that any adequate account of nutrition will make ineliminable reference to life as such. This in turn entails that it will not be possible to define life as the capacity for taking on nutrition. For then we would have a vicious circularity: a living system is the sort of thing which can take on nutrition, while nutrition is whatever stuff is such as to sustain a living system. So, if living systems cannot be reductively defined in some other way, it will follow that no reductive account of life will be forthcoming. Consequently, Aristotle’s discussion of nutrition provides some reason for thinking that he will resist any attempt to define life in terms which do not themselves implicitly appeal to life itself. That is, he will resist any reductive account of life.
This also seems to be the purport of Aristotle’s rejection of the simple mechanistic accounts of growth which he considers when discussing the nutritive soul (De Anima ii 4, 415b27–416a20; cf. De Generatione et Corruptione i 5). Aristotle objects to those who want to account for growth merely in terms of the natural tendencies of material elements. For growth is a constrained pattern of development, the source of which Aristotle ascribes to the soul. He takes it as evident that growth in organisms proceeds along structured paths, in end-directed ways. These structures in turn manifest capacities whose explication cannot be given in crude materialistic terms; for materialistic terms, as Aristotle understands them, fail to account for the fact that mature members of species cease growing, having realized the structures characteristic of their kind. Fire, for example, by contrast “grows” haphazardly, without directionality, flowing towards the combustible without end, until hindered by external impediments or lack of fuel.
Now, the forms of materialist explanations Aristotle considers are primitive. One critical question about his treatment of these explanations concerns whether he is right to suggest that facts about constrained patterns of development are incompatible with more explanatorily advanced forms of materialism, and, if so, whether those forms of materialism will be reductive in the sense that they will avoid all implicit or explicit reference to life. So far, there is little reason to think that Aristotle has been proven wrong; that is, there is at present no reductive account of life which enjoys universal or even broad support.
In any case, Aristotle’s discussion of nutrition is characteristic of his general approach to the soul’s faculties. His discussions often proceed on two levels. On the one hand, he simply seeks to provide an account of the relevant phenomena. At the same time, his interests in definition are conditioned by a host of broader methodological and metaphysical concerns. Consequently, he attempts to capture the nature of the individual faculties while at the same time investigating whether reductive accounts of them are plausible. In this way, at least, Aristotle’s investigations reflect sensitivity to an array of interlocking questions in definitional methodology, including most notably questions about the plausibility of reductive approaches to life’s most characteristic features. These same interests are apparent in his discussions of perception and mind.
Aristotle devotes a great deal of attention to perception, discussing both the general faculty and the individual senses. In both cases, his discussions are cast in hylomorphic terms. Perception is the capacity of the soul which distinguishes animals from plants; indeed, having a perceptive faculty is definitive of being an animal (De Sensu 1, 436b10–12); every animal has at least touch, whereas most have the other sensory modalities as well (De Anima ii 2 413b4–7). In broad terms at least, animals must have perception if they are to live. So, Aristotle supposes, there are defensible teleological grounds for treating animals as essentially capable of perceiving (De Anima ii 3, 414b6–9, 434a30–b4; De Sensu 1, 436b16–17). If an animal is to grow to maturity and propagate, it must be able to take in nourishment and to navigate its way through the world. Perception serves these ends.
This much, however, does not explain how perception occurs. Aristotle claims that perception is best understood on the model of hylomorphic change generally: just as a house changes from blue to white when acted upon by the agency of a painter applying paint, so “perception comes about with <an organ’s> being changed and affected … for it seems to be a kind of alteration” (De Anima ii 5, 416b33–34). So in line with his general account of alteration, Aristotle treats perception as a case of interaction between two suitable agents: objects capable of acting and capacities capable of being affected. That the agents and patients must both be suitable is important, since we need to distinguish between two ways, e.g., an odor might affect something. By being placed in its vicinity, a clove of garlic might affect a block of tofu. The tofu might well come to take on the odor of the garlic. But we would not want to say that the tofu perceives the garlic. By contrast, when an animal is affected by the same clove, it perceives the odor. Since the garlic is the same in both cases, the difference in these cases must reside in the character of the object affected. When animals receive perceptual forms, perception results; when non-living entities are affected by what seem to be the same forms, only non-perceptual alteration occurs.
In both kinds of alterations, Aristotle is happy to speak of an affected thing as receiving the form of the agent which affects it and of the change consisting in the affected thing’s “becoming like” the agent (De Anima ii 5, 418a3–6; ii 12, 424a17–21). So there is in both cases a hylomorphic model of alteration involving enforming, that is, a model according to which change is explained by the acquisition of a form by something capable of receiving it. Consequently, whatever is changed in a given way is necessarily such that it is capable of being changed in that way. This is not the mere triviality that whatever becomes actually F must already be possibly F. Instead, it is the recognition that specific forms of change require suitable capacities in the changing subjects, and that, consequently, analyses of specific forms of change will necessarily involve consideration of those capacities. No marshmallow can receive the form of an actual automobile; and only entities capable of perceiving can receive the perceptible forms of objects. This is Aristotle’s meaning when he claims: “the perceptive faculty is in potentiality such as the object of perception already is in actuality” and that when something is affected by an object of perception, “it is made like it and is such as that thing is” (De Anima ii 5, 418a3–6).
This hylomorphic restriction on the suitability of subjects of change has the effect of limiting cases of actual perception to those instances of form-reception which involve living beings endowed with the appropriate faculties. It does not, however, explain just what those faculties are, nor even how they are “made like” their objects of perception. Minimally, though, Aristotle claims that for some subject S and some sense object O:
|S perceives O if and only if: (i) S has the capacity requisite for receiving O’s sensible form; (ii) O acts upon that capacity by enforming it; and, as a result, (iii) S’s relevant capacity becomes isomorphic with that form.|
Each of these clauses requires unpacking. The plausibility of Aristotle’s theory turns on their eventual explications. The first clause (i) is intended to distinguish the active capacities of animals from the merely passive capacities of lifeless material bodies, including the media through which sensible forms travel. (Just as we do not want to say that the tofu in the refrigerator perceives the garlic next to it, we do not want to say that air perceives the color blue when affected by the color of a car.) But it does not yet specify what is required for having the requisite active capacities. Also difficult is the notion of isomorphism appealed to in (iii). As stated, (iii) invites, and has received, scrutiny. Interpretations range from treating the form of isomorphism as direct and literal, so that, e.g., the eyes become speckled when viewing a robin’s egg, to attenuated, where the isomorphism is more akin to that enjoyed between a house and its blue-print. Here especially the plausibility of Aristotle’s hylomorphic analysis of perception hangs in the balance.
Further Discussion: Perception and Imagination
Aristotle describes mind (nous, often also rendered as “intellect” or “reason”) as “the part of the soul by which it knows and understands” (De Anima iii 4, 429a9–10; cf. iii 3, 428a5; iii 9, 432b26; iii 12, 434b3), thus characterizing it in broadly functional terms. It is plain that humans can know and understand things; indeed, Aristotle supposes that it is our very nature to desire knowledge and understanding (Metaphysics i 1, 980a21; De Anima ii 3, 414b18; iii 3, 429a6–8). In this way, just as the having of sensory faculties is essential to being an animal, so the having of a mind is essential to being a human. Human minds do more than understand, however. It is equally essential to the human being to plan and deliberate, to ponder alternatives and strategize, and generally to chart courses of action. Aristotle ascribes these activities no less than understanding and contemplation to mind and consequently distinguishes the “practical mind” (or “practical intellect” or “practical reason”) from “theoretical mind” (or “theoretical intellect” or “theoretical reason”) ( Nicomachean Ethics vi 8 1143a35-b5; see Aristotle: ethics). In all these ways, investigating this capacity of soul thus has a special significance for Aristotle: in investigating mind, he is investigating what makes humans human.
His primary investigation of mind occurs in two chapters of De Anima, both of which are richly suggestive, but neither of which admits of easy or uncontroversial exposition. In De Anima iii 4 and 5, Aristotle approaches the nature of thinking by once again deploying a hylomorphic analysis, given in terms of form reception. Just as perception involves the reception of a sensible form by a suitably qualified sensory faculty, so thinking involves the reception of an intelligible form by a suitably qualified intellectual faculty (De Anima iii 4, 429a13–18). According to this model, thinking consists in a mind’s becoming enformed by some object of thought, so that actual thinking occurs whenever some suitably prepared mind is “made like” its object by being affected by it.
This hylomorphic analysis of thinking is evidently a simple extension of the general model of hylomorphic change exploited by Aristotle in a host of similar contexts. Accordingly, Aristotle’s initial account of thinking will directly parallel his analysis of perception (De Anima iii 4, 429a13–18). That is, at least in schematic outline, Aristotle will offer the following approach. For any given thinker S and an arbitrary object of thought O:
|S thinks O if and only if: (i) S has the capacity requisite for receiving O’s intelligible form; (ii) O acts upon that capacity by enforming it; and, as a result, (iii) S’s relevant capacity becomes isomorphic with that form.|
Unsurprisingly, the same questions which arose in the case of perception also arise here. Most immediately, to understand Aristotle’s approach to thinking, it is necessary to determine what it means to say that a thinker’s mind and its object become isomorphic.
Here, at least, Aristotle points out what is obvious, that when a thinker’s soul is made like its cognitive object, it does not become one with some hylomorphic compound, but with its form: “for it is not the stone which is in the soul, but its form” (De Anima iii 8, 431b29–432a1; cf. iii 4, 429a27). The suggestion is, then, that when S comes to think of a stone, as opposed to merely perceiving some particular stone, S has a faculty which is such that it can become one in form with that stone. Aristotle sometimes infers from this sort of consideration that thought is of universals, whereas perception is of particulars (De Anima ii 5, 417b23, Posterior Analytics i 31, 87b37–88a7), though he elsewhere will allow that we also have knowledge of individuals (De Anima ii 5, 417a29; Metaphysics xiii 10, 1087a20). These passages are not contradictory, since Aristotle may simply be emphasizing that thought tends to proceed at a higher level of generality than perception, because of its trading in comparatively abstract structural features of its objects. A person can think of what it is to be a stone, but cannot, in any direct and literal sense of the term, perceive this.
However that may be, Aristotle’s conception of thinking implicates him in supposing that thought involves grasping the structural features of the objects of thought. To take an initially favorable case, when thinking that tree frogs are oviparous, S will be in a psychic state whose internal structural states are, among other things, one in form with tree frogs. Since S’s soul does not become a tree frog when thinking of tree frogs (De Anima iii 8, 431b24–30), this form of isomorphism cannot be mere instantiation of the form being a tree frog. Rather, S’s mind will evidently be one in form with the tree frog, to revert to our earlier analogy, in something like the way a blueprint and the house of which it is the blueprint are one in form. There must be a determinate and expressible structural isomorphism, even though one could not say that the blueprint realizes the form of the house. Houses are, after all, necessarily three-dimensional.
For Aristotle, it is not a contingent state of affairs that S’s mind does not realize the form being a tree frog in the way that tree frogs themselves do. On the contrary, the mind cannot realize a broad range of forms: the mind is, according to Aristotle, not “mixed with the body”, insofar as it, unlike the perceptual faculty, lacks a bodily organ (De Anima iii 4, 429a24–7). As such, it would not be possible for the mind to realize the form of a house in the way bricks and mortar instantiate such a form: houses provide shelter, something a mind, so understood, cannot do. Consequently, when claiming that minds become isomorphic with their objects, Aristotle must understand the way in which minds become enformed as somehow attenuated or non-literal. Perhaps, though, this should be plain enough. If a mind thinks something by being made like it, then the way it is likened to what it thinks must be somehow representational. Consequently, Aristotle is reasonably understood as holding that S thinks some object of thought O whenever S’s mind is made like that object by representing salient structural features of O by being directly isomorphic with them, without, that is, by simply realizing the form of O in the way O does.
This approach to the nature of thinking has some promising features. Both in its own terms and in virtue of its fitting into a broader pattern of explanation, Aristotle’s hylomorphic analysis merits serious consideration. At the same time, one of its virtues may appear also as a vice. We noted in discussing Aristotle’s hylomorphic analysis of change generally that his account requires the existence of suitably disposed subjects of change. Only surfaces can be affected so as to be changed in color. An action, such as Socrates’ becoming unnerved by a glance of Alcibiades, cannot be made white; it is simply not the appropriate sort of subject. So, hylomorphic change requires at least the following two components: (i) something pre-existing to be the patient of the change, and (ii) that thing’s being categorially suited to be changed in the way specified.
Already at the first stage, however, Aristotle’s application of this hylomorphic analysis of change to thinking may seem an over-extension. For he maintains directly that mind is “none of the things existing in actuality before thinking” (De Anima iii 4, 429a24). His reasons for maintaining this thesis are complex, but derive ultimately from the forms of plasticity Aristotle believes the mind must manifest if it is to be capable of thinking all things (De Anima iii 4, 429a18). Now, if the mind is indeed nothing in actuality before thinking, it is hard to understand how the hylomorphic analysis of change and affection could be brought to bear in this arena. If some dough is made cookie-shaped, it is actually dough before being so enformed; even the sense organs, when made like their objects, are actually existing organs before being affected by the objects of perception. So, given a conception of mind as not existing in actuality before thinking, it is hard to appreciate how thinking lends itself to an analysis in terms of any recognizable hylomorphic approach to change.
How great a problem this will be depends in part upon how entrenched Aristotle’s commitment to the mind’s being nothing in actuality before thinking turns out to be. It equally turns on how adaptable Aristotle’s hylomorphic account of change proves to be. On this latter point, Aristotle notes that according to his account, there are various different types of change and alteration, illustrated by the difference between a brown fence’s being painted white and a builder’s taking up his tools and beginning to build. In the first case, there is a destruction and a loss, of the fence’s original color; in the second case, nothing is destroyed, but rather that which is already dispositionally F becomes occurently F by engaging in some F-ish activity. A builder is as such already able to build. When he begins building he becomes fully and actually a builder for the duration of his working. In this way, he loses nothing, but instead realizes an already established potential.
This second type of change, which Aristotle maintains is the appropriate model for many psychic activities, is either “not an instance of alteration … or is a different kind of alteration,” where one “should not speak of being affected, unless <one allows that> there are two kinds of alteration” (De Anima ii 5, 417b6–16). Perhaps Aristotle’s position will then be that the mind, at least insofar as its cognitive capacities for thought are concerned, is simply such as to be enformed by any of an infinite range of objects of thought. This would involve its being nothing determinate in itself; and far from being anomalous for Aristotle, the mind would be in the cognitive realm precisely what the most basic stuff, if there is a most basic stuff, would be in the material realm. Both would manifest unconstrained plasticity; and so each would be characterized essentially in terms of their range of potentialities.That said, it should be noticed that when it is detached from the idiosyncratic thesis that the mind is nothing in actuality before thinking, Aristotle’s hylomorphic analysis of thought retains whatever plausibility it may have independently. For the suggestion that thinking is to be understood at least partially in terms of isomorphisms between our representational capacities and the objects of our cognition has had, for good reason, a durable appeal. To the degree that hylomorphism is generally defensible, then, its application in this domain provides a theoretically rich framework for investigating the nature of thought.
In both perception and thinking, animal souls are in some ways active and in some ways passive. Although both mind and the sensory faculty receive their correlative forms when perceiving or thinking, neither is wholly passive in its defining activity. Perception involves discrimination, while thinking involves selective attending and abstraction, both activities, in the sense that each requires more than mere passive receptivity. Still, the sorts of activity required for cognition and perception do not explain in any obvious way another central fact about human beings and other animals: animals propel themselves through space in pursuit of objects they desire. Even in his first characterizations of soul in De Anima, Aristotle is alive to the widely held conviction that the soul is implicated in motion (De Animai 2, 405b11; i 5 409b19–24). Of course, this is a natural connection for him to make, given that every animate being, that is, every being with a soul, has within it a principle of motion and rest. So, it seems deeply characteristic of living systems that they are able to move themselves in ways likely to result in their survival and flourishing. Animals move themselves, however, in a distinctive way: animals desire things, with the result that desire is centrally implicated in all manner of animal action. Why did ostrich run from the tiger? Because, one says easily, it desired to survive and so engaged in avoidance behavior. Why did the human being drive to the opera and sit quietly in her seat? Because, it seems, she desired to hear the music and to observe the spectacle.
In these, as in countless other cases, the explanation of animal action, human and non-human alike, easily and unreflectively appeals to desire. This is why Aristotle does not end his De Anima with a discussion of mind. Instead, after discussing mind, he notes that all animals are capable of locomotion, only to deny that any one of the faculties of the soul so far considered (viz. nutrition, perception, or mind) can account for desire-initiated movement. Although he had initially identified only these three faculties of soul (De Anima ii 2, 413b12), Aristotle now notes that something must explain the fact that animals engage in goal-directed behavior in order to achieve their conscious and unconscious goals. The wanted explanation cannot, he urges, be found somehow in the nutritive faculty, since plants, as living beings, have that power of soul, but do not move themselves around in pursuit of their goals; nor is it due to perception, since even some animals have this faculty without ever moving themselves at all, in any way (Aristotle evidently has in mind sponges, oysters, and certain testacea, Historia Animalium i 1, 487b6–9; viii 1 588b12; Partibus Animalium iv 5, 681b34, 683c8); nor again can it be a product of mind, since insofar as it is contemplative, mind does not focus upon objects likely to issue in directives for action, and insofar as it does commend action, mind is not of itself sufficient to engender motion, but instead relies upon appetite (De Anima iii 9, 432b14–33a5). Indeed, using the same form of reasoning, that a faculty cannot account for purposive action if its activity is insufficient to initiate motion, Aristotle initially concludes that even desire itself (orexis) cannot be responsible for action. After all, continent people, unlike those who are completely and virtuously moderate, have depraved desires but do not, precisely because they are continent, ever act upon them (De Anima iii 9 433a6–8; cf. Nicomachean Ethics i 13, 1102b26). So their desires are insufficient for action. Consequently, he concludes, desire alone, considered as a single faculty, cannot explain purposive action, at least not completely.
Ultimately, though, Aristotle does come to the conclusion that there is a faculty of desire (orektikon) whose occupation it is to initiate animal motion. (Perhaps his initial reservations pertained only to one species of desire considered in isolation.) In any case, he says plainly: “It is manifest, therefore, that what is called desire is the sort of faculty in the soul which initiates movement” (De Anima iii 10, 433a31–b1). He understands this conclusion, however, in tandem with another which also serves as a qualification of his earlier finding that mind cannot be the source of motion. He holds, in fact, that it is reasonable to posit two faculties implicated in animal movement: desire and practical reason (De Anima iii 10, 433a17–19), though they do not work in isolation from one another. Rather, practical reason, broadly construed to incorporate the kind of image-processing present in non-human animals, is a source of movement when it focuses upon an object of desire as something desirable. So, practical reason and desire act corporately as the sources of purposive motion in all animals, both human and non-human (De Anima iii 10, 433a9–16), even though, ultimately, it is desire whose objects prick practical intellect and set it in motion (De Anima iii 10, 433a17–2). For this reason, Aristotle concludes, there is a faculty of desire whose activities and objects are primarily, if not autonomously or discretely, responsible for initiating end-directed motion in animals. What animals seek in action is some object of desire which is or seems to them to be good.
Aristotle displays some hesitation in his discussion of desire and its relation to practical reason in the aetiology of animal action. Some have consequently concluded that his treatment can be regarded as at best inchoate or, worse, as positively befuddled. There seem to be no grounds for any such harsh assessment, however. Equally likely is that Aristotle is simply sensitive to the complexities involved in any approach to the intertwining issues in the philosophy of action. Unlike some later Humeans, he evidently appreciates that the data and phenomena in this domain are unstable, wobbling and retreating at the approach of taxonomizing theory. The antecedents of action, he rightly concludes, involve some sort of faculty of desire; but he is reluctant to conclude that desire is the sole or sufficient faculty implicated in the explanation of purposive behavior. In some way, he concludes, practical reason and imagination have indispensable roles to play as well.
Texts, Translations, and Commentaries of De Anima
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Anthologies and Monographs
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- –––, 2002, “Aristotle on Consciousness,” Mind, 111: 751–815.
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