Supplement to Aristotle's Psychology

A Fundamental Problem about Hylomorphism

If we rely on a simple illustration of Aristotle's hylomorphism, then, as Ackrill (1972-3) first pointed out, we come with surprising rapidity to a significant problem for Aristotle's otherwise attractive treatment of soul-body relations. According to Aristotle's hylomorphic analysis of change and generation, when a lump of bronze comes to be enformed with the shape of Hermes, a statue of Hermes comes into existence. When this same bronze is later melted and recast as a statue of Domitian, then the Hermes statue goes out of existence and a statue of Domitian comes into existence. Crucial to this simple account of hylomorphic generation is the thought that the bronze which first acquires and then loses one shape (the Hermes shape) and then acquires a new shape (the Domitian shape) is itself only contingently enformed by either shape. We speak of the lump or quantity of bronze as continuing through the entire process; and this seems plausible, since the bronze itself has no one shape essentially. Perhaps it is essentially bronze or essentially metal, but it is not essentially either Hermes- or Domitian-shaped.

So it seems that any matter which underlies generation is only contingently enformed by the form which it acquires in the process of generation. Now, though, comes an oddness for hylomorphism in the case of soul-body relations: Aristotle evidently thinks that a human body is essentially enformed by the soul whose body it is. That is, unlike bronze, a body, the matter of a human being, cannot lose its form, its soul, and remain in existence. This, at any rate, seems to be a direct consequence of Aristotle's insisting that a body which has lost its soul is not a body at all, ‘except homonymously’ (De Anima ii 1, 412b10-24). In appealing to homonymy in this connection, Aristotle means to suggest that a body without a soul is no more a body than an eye in a sculpture of a human being is an eye. We do call it an eye, but only by an extension of the term. An eye in a sculpture or in a painting hanging on a wall in a museum is not really an eye; it is not an organ used for seeing. So Aristotle's suggestion is that a dead body, or a corpse, is more like a statue of a body than it is like a real body. It looks like a body, perhaps, but it is not, in fact, a body at all. This is presumably why Aristotle says of such a body: "The body which has lost its soul is not the one which is potentially alive; this is rather the one which has a soul" (De Anima ii 1 412b25-26). The purport is evidently that only a body already ensouled is potentially alive. That makes a body unlike a lump of bronze, which may be potentially a statue while it is yet in fact a lump and not a statue, something, that is, patently unenformed by the form of any statue at all. Indeed, that was supposed to be matter's principal virtue in Aristotle's hylomorphic account of generation.

Now, whatever Aristotle's motives for appealing to homonymy in this connection may be, it should first be appreciated that it has immediate and problematic consequences for his hylomorphic analysis of soul and body. For it entails that no human body is contingently ensouled; rather, every human body is essentially ensouled and goes out of existence at the moment it loses its soul, that is, at the moment of death. This will seem counterintuitive, insofar as it seems peculiar to speak of a human body as ceasing to exist at the moment of death. We say, after all, that many citizens in the Soviet Union made a special effort to view ‘Lenin's body’ on display in Moscow, or that ‘King Tut's body’ was preserved through mummification. Perhaps, though, one might agree that all this is just a manner of speaking, that a body embalmed and laid out for viewing or a body carted around to various museums for display is more like a statue than it is like the breathing organism belonging to a live human. This is not, however, the real problem noticed by Ackrill. It is rather that the hylomorphic account of change seems to require that bits of matter are only contingently enformed; the bronze is not made the bronze it is by gaining this or that shape. Instead, the bronze is the bronze it is because of its being an alloy of copper and tin, something it was before it was enformed by the shape of Hermes, something it remains while enformed by that shape, and, of course, something it is still after that shape has been lost. If human bodies are not bodies when they are not ensouled, and if the souls of bodies are, as Aristotle claims, their forms, then human bodies are not amenable to a hylomorphic treatment. The application of a general hylomorphic framework to the case of the soul and body does not even seem possible. Matter, according to hylomorphism, is contingently enformed; so, bodies, treated by Aristotle as matter, should also be contingently enformed. If, however, bodies are only homonymously bodies when they have lost their souls, then bodies are necessarily enformed: bodies are necessarily actually alive. So, human bodies are both contingently and necessarily enformed. That seems an unhappy and rather immediate consequence. In fact, Aristotle seems to have contradicted himself.

In view of this seemingly contradictory outcome, it is natural to wonder why Aristotle claims in the first instance that a human body is only homonymously a body when it has lost its soul. For surely it is that claim which is the root of his difficulty; it is precisely his appeal to homonymy which renders an application of hylomorphism to soul-body relations problematic. Perhaps, then, the easiest solution would be for Aristotle simply to retract his claim that a body without a soul is not a body at all, except homonymously. Then a human body could be, like other parcels of matter, only contingently enformed.

Unfortunately, there seems little hope of Aristotle's simply rescinding his claim that a dead body is not a body except homonymously. For he regularly employs a broad thesis of functional determination, according to which “all things are defined by their function” (Meteorologica iv 12, 390a10-15; cf. Generation of Animals ii 1,734b24-31; Politics i 2, 1253a19-25). This thesis states necessary and sufficient conditions for something's being a member of some kind F such that all and only F things manifest the function characteristic of that kind. (So, for instance, something is a computer if and only if it can be used to do the things computers do. No piece of salami is a computer; and everything which can be used to word process, create spread sheets, and in general to implement software programs is a computer.) The upshot of this approach to kind individuation for the body seems to be that nothing incapable of engaging in the life functions characteristic of human beings (eating, perceiving, thinking) will be a human body. This is why a body without a soul, a body which is completely lifeless, is not a human body, except homonymously. This is also why a soulless body is more like a statue or a painting of a body than it is like a human body. Although it may look like a body, a corpse can no more breathe than a statue can walk about and perceive. So, Aristotle is not at liberty to revoke his appeal to homonymy, at least not without sacrificing a deep principle of kind individuation.

That leaves, then, only one direction for resolving the contradiction which seems to result from the combination of hylomorphism and homonymy. Aristotle can allow, perhaps, that in addition to the human body which is necessarily actually alive there is a body which is only contingently ensouled and so only contingently alive. This body would presumably be the sort of matter Aristotle characterizes as non-proximate (Metaphysics v 6, 1016a19-24; viii 4, 1044a15-25; ix 7, 1049a24-7). Non-proximate matter is the matter which undergirds the matter actually used in the generation of some compound, even if it is not actually present or discernible in that compound. Thus, for example, while bricks and mortar are the proximate matter of the house, the clay which is the matter of the bricks is also, though non-proximately, the matter of the house, since it was used as the matter for the formation of the bricks. Although it is not so obvious in the case of a living being, whose proximate matter is already very highly structured, beneath the proximate matter will lie non-proximate matter which can then be only contingently enformed. That matter is not necessarily actually alive. This would also be the matter implicitly contrasted with what Aristotle identifies as the organic matter (De Anima ii 1, 412a28-b1), that is, the fully formed and living human matter, of an existing human being. The non-organic matter could then qualify as what continues through hylomorphic generation, in the way bronze persists through the loss and acquisition of various forms. So, there will be effectively two bodies, one organic and one non-organic, the first of which is indeed necessarily actually alive but the second of which is not. Perhaps the disinction between the organic and non-organic body parallels to some extent our own different ways of speaking of "flesh". We might say that flesh repairs itself when cut or damaged, though obviously this is said only of living flesh, even while we also speak of corruptible things as going the way of all flesh . In the first instance only we implicitly restrict ourselves to speaking of the sort of flesh which is living flesh. So too, then, with the organic body: it is a living body of which we speak, though there is also a body, the non-organic body, which goes the way of all flesh.

This solution may seem in one way or another extravagant, unparsimonious, or simply at variance with common sense. These are reservations which are fairly voiced and investigated; they evidently begin, however, by conceding that Aristotle need not buckle before a charge of self-contradiction. So, the hylomorphic project he initiates remains at least that much of an open possibility. In any case, it retains whatever advantages the general hylomorphic framework employed may carry with it. To be sure, though, the worry generated by Ackrill's problem is a deep one, with multifaceted ramifications for our understanding and eventual assessment of Aristotle's hylomorphic program in philosophy of mind.

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Copyright © 2010 by
Christopher Shields <>

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