Notes to August Wilhelm Rehberg

1. See Rehberg to Nicolovius, September 25, 1790, Kant, Briefwechsel, ed.Otto Schöndorffer (Hamburg: Meiner, 1972), pp. 472-474. The query was directed to Kant through Nicolovius. Rehberg later gave his account of the correspondence in the introduction to his Sämmtliche Schriften (Hannover: Hahn, 1828-31), I, 52-60.

2. See Kant to Rehberg September 25, 1790, Gesammelte Schriften ed. Prussian Academy of the Sciences (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1902ff), XI 195-199.

3. See J.B. Jachmann to Kant, October 14, 1790, Schriften XI, 211.

4. Among the Hannoverian Whigs were Ernst Brandes, L.T. Spittler and A.L. Schlözer. They acknowledged a great debt to Justus Möser. On the Hannoverian school, see my Enlightenment, Revolution & Romanticism: The Genesis of Modern German Political Thought, 1790-1800 (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1992), pp. 302-305.

5. Klaus Epstein, The Genesis of German Conservatism (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1965), pp. 547-594.

6. Ibid, p. 549.

7. The Reflections were translated by Friedrich Gentz and published in 1793 under the title Betrachtungen über die französische Revolution nach dem Englischen des Herrn Burke (Berlin, 1793). The best study on Burke in Germany is Frieda Braune, Edmund Burke in Deutschland (Heidelberg: Winters, 1917).

8. See Reinhold Aris, A History of Political Thought in Germany, 1789-1815 (London: Cass, 1936), pp. 251, 252-258; and Friedrich Jaeger and Jörn Rüsen, Geschichte des Historismus (Munich: Beck, 1992), pp. 21, 28.

9. See Epstein, Genesis, p. 565. On Rehberg's relationship to Stein, see Gerhard Ritter, Stein: Eine politische Biographie (Berlin, 1931), I, 143-183; and Erich Weniger, ‘Stein und Rehberg’, Niedersächisches Jahrbuch 2 (1925), I, 1-124.

10. See Friedrich Schlegel, Kritische Ausgabe, ed. Ernst Behler, et al., (Munich: Schöningh, 1958f), I, 1 and clxxxvi-viii.

11. See Sämmtliche Schriften IV, 240-277.

12. Abhandlungen über das Wesen und die Einschränkungen der Kräflte, welcher die Königliche Akademie zu Berlin in May 1779 das Accessit zuerkannt hat (Leipzig: Wigand, 1779).

13. See the introduction to his Sämmtliche Schriften I, 7.

14. Ibid, I, 8, 11.

15. Ibid, I, 12, 19.

16. Ibid, II, 24.

17. Ibid, I, 15.

18. Epstein, Genesis p. 701, states that Über das Verhältnis der Metaphysik zu der Religion is “of little importance” for understanding his conservatism, and rarely refers to his philosophy in discussing his political views. Vogel stresses the importance of the early philosophy, Konservative Kritik, p. 12, but she stresses and focuses almost exclusively on his critique of Kant, p. 78. She underplays his early skepticism and his critique of Reinhold and Jacobi.

19. See his review of Jacobi, David Hume über den Glauben, A.L.Z. 1788, No. 92; and his review of Herder, Gott, Einige Gespräche, A.L.Z 1788, No. 2a. Rehberg republished these reivews in his Sämmtliche Schriften I, 23-49.

20. See his review of Eberhard's Philosophisches Magazin in A.L.Z. 1789 I, 713-716.

21.  See the introduction to Sämmtliche Schriften, p. 17.

22. Über das Verhältnis, pp. 9-15.

23. Ibid, pp. 108-110, 167-175.

24. Introduction to Sämmtliche Schriften, p. 16.

25. Über das Verhältnis, p. 140-1.

26. Ibid, p. 139.

27. The two most important reviews are ALZ I (1791) No. 26, 201-208 and No. 27, 209-214.

28. See KrV A 133/B 172: “…the power of judgment is a special talent that cannot be taught but only practiced”. Rehberg does not explicitly cite this text but he most probably has it in mind.

29. For a fuller account of Rehberg's argument, see Manfred Frank, Unendliche Annäherung: Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1997), pp. 336-346; and Dieter Henrich, Grundlegung aus dem Ich: Untersuchungen zur Vorgeschichte des Idealismus (Frankfurt: Surhkamp, 2004), pp. 604-612.

30. See the evidence cited in Frank, Unendliche Annäherung, p 336.

31. The locus classicus for the Hannoverian attitude toward Britian is Ernst Brandes ‘Über den politischen Geist Englands’, Berlinische Monatsschrift 7 (1786), 101-126, 217-241, 293-323.

32. See Brandes, ‘Geist Englands’, pp. 293-320.

33. See the introduction to his Über den deutschen Adel (Göttingen: Röwer, 1803), p. 8.

34. Epstein, Genesis, pp. 571-2.

35. Adel, pp. 92-93.

36. Ibid, pp. 160-1.

37. Untersuchungen über die französische Revolution (Hannover: Ritscher, 1793). All references in parentheses are to this edition.

38. Ibid, pp. 12, 14, 45-50, 54, 105.

39. KrV, B 171-2.

40. See Untersuchungen, p. 54; and Sämmtliche Schriften, I, 105-6.

41. Rehberg's review appeared in the Allgemeine Literatur Zeitung 188 (August 6, 1788), 345-352. Rehberg reprinted the review in his Sämtliche Schriften I, 60-84; it has been reprinted in Materialien zu Kants Kritik der praktischen Vernunft, eds. R. Bittner and K. Cranmer (Fanrkfurt: Suhrkamp, 1975), pp. 179-186. Since Rehberg's review touches on issues less relevant to his political theory, I will not consider its contents here.

42. ‘Über den Gemeinspruch: Das mag in der Theorie richtig sein, taugt aber nicht für die Praxis’, in Kant, Schriften, ed. Prussian Academy of Sciences (Berlin: de Gruyter, 1902f), VIII, 273-314.

43. ‘Über das Verhältnis der Theorie zur Praxis’, Berlinische Monatsschrift 23 (1794), 114-143. This essay has been reprinted in the collection Über Theorie und Praxis, ed. Dieter Henrich (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1967), pp. 113-130. References in parentheses are to this more accessible edition.

44. Rehberg, Schriften IV, 146.

45. Cf. Untersuchungen, I, 45-50.

46. Jaeger and Rüsen never mention him in their Geschichte des Historismus; Georg Iggers ignores him entirely in his popular study of historicism, The German Conception of History (Middletown: Wesleyan University Press, 1968).

47. Friedrich Meinecke, Entstehung des Historismus (Munich: Oldenbourg, 1965), pp. 287, 309.

48. See Friedrich Carl von Savigny, Vom Beruf unserer Zeit für Gesetzgebung und Rechtswissenschaft (Heidelberg: Mohr und Zimmer, 1814), pp. 44, 55, 112. Rehberg had attacked the code in his Über den Code Napoleon und dessen Einführung in Deutschland (Hannover:Hahn, 1814).

49. On Rehberg's critique of the natural law tradition, see Schriften I, 95-122, and Untersuchungen 61-69.

50. See, for example, Weniger, ‘Stein und Rehberg’, p. 54; Lessing, Rehberg und die französiche Revolution, p. 137; and Aris, History, p. 56. The rationalist side of Rehberg's position has been properly stressed by Epstein, Genesis, pp. 580-1, and Vogel, Konservative Kritik, pp. 76-77

51. See, for example, Rehberg's review of Gustave Hugo's Lehrbuch des Naturrechts, in Schriften IV, 102-121, esp. 108-109, 117-118, 120.

52. Fichte, Beiträge zur Berichtigung der Urteile des Publikums über die französische Revolution, in Fichte, Werke, ed. I.H. Fichte (Berlin: Veit, 1845-51), VI, 56-57.

53. Rehberg, Schriften IV, 145.

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