August Wilhelm Rehberg

First published Thu Jan 11, 2007

Though little known in the Anglophone world, and largely forgotten even in the Germanic world, August Wilhelm Rehberg (1757-1836) was a pivotal thinker in the era of classical German philosophy from Kant to Hegel. No thinker from that fertile period has been more unjustly neglected. He wrote some acute and highly-regarded reviews of Kant, and he corresponded with Kant about the philosophy of mathematics.[1] Kant's reply to Rehberg's objections is one of his most important explanations of his mathematical doctrines.[2] Such, indeed, was Rehberg's grasp of Kant that J.B. Jachmann, Kant's friend and biographer, regarded him as “the finest head among all your students.”[3] But Rehberg was much more than a Kantian epigone. He also made an original contribution to the pantheism controversy, where he staked out his own position vis-à-vis Jacobi, Mendelssohn, Herder and Kant; and he wrote an influential critique of Reinhold's Elementarphilosophie, which was a potent source of the skepticism surrounding neo-Kantian foundationalism in the early 1790s. All these facts are sufficient to give Rehberg a notable, if minor, place in the intellectual pantheon of his age. They are not, however, the main reason for remembering him.

Rehberg's historical importance lies chiefly in his critique of the French Revolution. In the early 1790s he became renowned as its foremost conservative critic. He was the chief spokesman for the so-called ‘Hannoverian Whigs’, a group of conservative writers based in Göttingen who defended the old Ständesstaat (i.e., a state based on the old society of estates) against revolutionary ideology.[4] Rehberg provided the philosophical foundations for the politics of the Hannoverians, and he saw more clearly than they, or any other conservative writer of his day, the general philosophical issues raised by the Revolution. The basis for his attack on revolutionary ideology was his skeptical epistemology, which grew out of his study of Hume and Kant. For all these reasons, Rehberg has been rightly regarded as a founding father of German conservatism.[5]

1. Life, Reputation, and Influences

In the few cases Rehberg has been recognized, his reputation has not been fairly assessed. He has been described as “next to Friedrich Gentz, the ablest literary opponent of the French Revolution in Germany”.[6] But such a tribute does not do him full justice, for the comparison should really be to the advantage of Rehberg, who was politically wiser and philosophically deeper than Gentz. To some scholars, Rehberg has seemed a pale German imitation of Edmund Burke, whose Reflections on the Revolution in France became extremely popular in Germany in the early 1790s.[7] It has been indeed customary to stress the indebtedness of the Hannoverians to Burke, as if they were all his mere epigones.[8] Here again, though, Rehberg has been done an injustice. He wrote his critique of the Revolution before Burke, and it is superior to Burke's in its philosophical content. Although Rehberg's writing has none of the rhetoric of Burke's, it makes up for its lack of style with greater substance. Unlike Burke, Rehberg realized that it was pointless to indulge in diatribe, no matter how flashy or brilliant, and that what was needed amid the passion and partisanship of revolutionary politics was sober and solid argument.

Rehberg's early articles on the French Revolution, which were published in the Allgemeine Literatur Zeitung, the most prominent journal of the day, quickly won him a national reputation. In the early 1790s, when pro-revolutionary sentiment swept through Germany, Rehberg stood out as an articulate spokesman for the conservative cause. He seemed to show that a case could be made for conservatism, that it was intellectually respectable to honor the historical traditions of the old German states. Apart from the immediate effect of his early articles, Rehberg's critique of the Revolution had a more lasting influence, and in two basic respects. First, by criticizing the abstract idealism of the radicals, and by stressing the importance of historical continuity for social and political stability, Rehberg made himself an important figure in the development of historicism. Second, as the close friend of Karl von Stein, the leader of the Prussian Reform movement, Rehberg's thinking had a direct effect on the politics of his age. Though Stein and Rehberg later fell out, Stein always acknowledged his great debts to Rehberg.[9]

Rehberg was born in 1757 into a middle class Protestant family. His father was a secretary for the estates of Calenberg, one of the duchies of Hannover. Although Rehberg aspired to an academic career, he was foiled in his ambitions. A plan to get him a teaching post at the Berlin Ritterakademie was thwarted by no less than Frederick the Great, who turned him down on the grounds that royal practice was to hire only cooks from Hannover. After a humiliating four years teaching German to Englishmen, he became in 1783 the secretary to the Duke of York, who was then bishop of Osnabrück. So impressed was the Duke with Rehberg's abilities that he made him in 1786 a secretary to the Hannoverian Geheime Ratskollegium (the secret counsel). The Ratskollegium consisted in aristocrats, though its affairs were usually conducted by bourgeois secretaries like Rehberg, who were denied any vote. It was one of the tragedies of Rehberg's career that his onerous duties gave him little time for philosophy. Hence his writings are scattered and occasional, and sometimes lack precision and polish. For the same reason, he never gave a systematic exposition of his philosophy.

It was a striking curiosity of Rehberg's cultural milieu that his father was a close friend of Johann Adolf Schlegel, the father of August Wilhelm and Friedrich Schlegel, two founding spirits of Romanticism. The families would often meet, and so the little Rehberg would often romp with the Schlegel kids. As it happened, Rehberg's younger sister Caroline became the first love of Friedrich Schlegel, who immortalized her as Luise in his Lucinde. During one of the family outings, Caroline sketched a drawing of the young Friedrich Schlegel, which now introduces the critical edition of his works.[10] If the Rehbergs inspired the Schlegels, the Schlegels did little for Rehberg. Known for his dry, sober and puritanical temperament, Rehberg distrusted the self-indulgence and libertinism of Romanticism. He always kept his critical distance from Romanticism when it spread throughout Germany in the early 1800s. The best indicator of his attitude toward Romanticism is his review of some of Adam Müller's writings, in which he deplored their mysticism and obscurantanism.[11]

Rehberg's early interests were in philosophy and literature rather than politics. Intellectually precocious, he learned to read Greek, Latin, Italian, Spanish, French and English before he was fifteen. From 1774 to 1777 he attended the University of Göttingen, then one of the main centers of intellectual life in Germany. Finding little inspiration from the Popularphilosophie then prevalent in Göttingen, Rehberg resolved to educate himself, and did so by studying Leibniz and Spinoza on his own. One hallmark of Rehberg's intellectual character—central for his philosophy and politics—was his skepticism, which he formed in his earliest years. When he was only fourteen, he had doubts about Christianity, and soon became an unbeliever, which he remained for the rest of his life. His skepticism soon extended to metaphysics itself. He had his doubts about Leibniz and Spinoza, because their systems rested upon questionable and indemonstrable first principles. In 1779 he wrote an essay for a competition organized by the Berlin Academy, where he took a skeptical position regarding metaphysics in general.[12] Although he argued that Leibniz's system was the best defense against Spinozism and skepticism, he also strongly suggested that it was by no means an adequate defense. The only reason he defended Leibniz, he later confessed, is that the Berlin Academy was dominated by Leibnizians, who would never have awarded a prize critical of their founder.[13] His real convictions were that Spinoza's system is the epitome of abstract thinking, though it suffers from irresolvable problems that demonstrate the inadequacies of all metaphysics.[14]

Three philosophers had a formative influence on Rehberg's intellectual development. He greatly admired Hume, a favourite author among Hannoverian circles, for his skepticism.[15] It was from Hume that Rehberg most probably learned how skepticism could serve the cause of political conservatism. Another crucial influence was Justus Möser, so-called advocatus patriae, famed defender of the Kleinstaat and seminal influence on historicism. When Rehberg did his apprenticeship as an Hannoverian bureaucrat, he was sent to Osnabrück, where he met Möser, who soon became his “fatherly friend”. It was Möser who taught him to appreciate the traditions and workings of the Kleinstaat, “the basic principles of [German] civil society as they prevailed before the French Revolution”.[16] Last but not least, Rehberg's skepticism was greatly abetted and strengthened by his study of Kant. Although his skepticism was already ripening in the late 1770s, before the publication of the first Kritik, Kant greatly assisted Rehberg in formulating his own skepticism.[17] He fully endorsed Kant's critique of rationalist metaphysics, accepted his account of the limits of human knowledge, and greatly admired his moral philosophy. However, for reasons we shall soon see, he took issue with Kant's attempt to extend his moral philosophy into the political world.

2. Early Philosophy

The basis of Rehberg's critique of the Revolution was his early philosophical views, which he developed from the late 1770s to the early 1790s. It has been a mistake of traditional scholarship on Rehberg that it attempts to compartimentalize his thought, separating his philosophical and political thinking.[18] No one would have been more astonished by such an artificial separation than Rehberg himself, who, in his retrospective account of his writings in the introduction to his Sämmtliche Schriften, stressed the centrality of his general philosophical principles. Apart from their importance for his politics, Rehberg's early philosophical views deserve attention in their own right. Rehberg staked out a unique and original position amid the controversies of his age.

Like so many intellectuals who came of age in the 1780s, the young Rehberg's intellectual landscape was formed by the pantheism controversy. This controversy began in 1785 when Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi proclaimed in his Briefe über die Lehre von Spinoza to a stunned public that Lessing had been a Spinozist. Jacobi used this juicy bit of gossip to make a provocative philosophical point: that all rational enquiry, of which Lessing was such a eminent exemplar, ends in the atheism and fatalism of Spinozism. The only way to save oneself from such atheism and fatalism, Jacobi suggested, was to take a “salto mortale”, a leap of faith in a personal God and freedom. Hence Jacobi presented his contemporaries with a dilemma: either a rational atheism and a-moralism or an irrational theism and morality. There could be no comfortable middle path: rational demonstrations of the essential beliefs of morality and religion. Jacobi's dilemma was a profound challenge to the German Enlightenment or Aufklärung, whose ultimate article of faith was that there must be some rational foundation for our moral and religious beliefs. The effect of Jacobi's book on the German intellectual stage was like “a bombshell”. Within the next year, Kant, Fichte, Herder, Reinhold and Mendelssohn would write responses to it. Virtually every young romantic—Friedrich Schlegel, Novalis, Hölderlin and Schleiermacher—would take a stand in the ensuing debate.

The young Rehberg too was drawn into the vortex of the pantheism controversy. Although his skepticism began in the late 1770s, he formulated much of his philosophy in response to the issues it raised. His contribution to the controversy were his reviews of Jacobi and Herder in the Allgemeine Literatur Zeitung, and his 1787 tract Über das Verhältnis der Metaphysik zu der Religion.[19] In these writings Rehberg continues to develop his skepticism, which now became his settled position. In this task he was greatly assisted by his close study of Kant's critical philosophy. Rehberg agreed with some of Kant's central critical teachings: that pure reason cannot know anything without the aid of sense experience, and that it is impossible for the senses to know anything beyond appearances. He found Kant's critique of dogmatic metaphysics compelling, and even defended Kant against Eberhard and the old dogmatic Wolffians.[20] He rejected, however, Kant's solution to the pantheism controversy: the concept of practical faith, the defense of religious belief on the basis of practical reason. While Rehberg agreed with Kant that the only justification of religion is practical,[21] he could not accept that a practical justification has its basis in reason alone. The only practical justification of religion was political: its utility in maintaining order among the people. A more educated man, however, did not need religious faith to love virtue and do his duty. Rehberg affirmed an austere stoic ethic, which demanded acting on duty alone, regardless of personal happiness. Like many of his contemporaries, he held that the doctrine of moral faith violated Kant's own strictures about the autonomy of morals. The moral law demands acting for the sake of duty alone, regardless of supernatural rewards and punishments.

Throughout the pantheism controversy, Rehberg maintained his skeptical attitude toward all religious belief. Such skepticism was unique, his original contribution to the controversy. All his fellow disputants— Kant, Herder, Jacobi, Mendelssohn, Goethe, Novalis, Schleiermacher, Hölderlin—affirmed some kind of religion, whether theism or pantheism. Although Rehberg agreed with Jacobi that all metaphysics ends in Spinozism, he did not take this as proof for pantheism, still less as reason for a salto mortale into theism. Since he rejected all metaphysics as empty speculation, he did not think that reason obliges us to accept pantheism, let alone theism. Metaphysics could never justify theism, Rehberg argued, because it at best establishes that there is a first cause of things, but never that this first cause is a personal being with understanding and will.[22] Although we can attribute understanding and will to God, we have to realize that such attributes are only anthropomorphisms that are true for us and never for things-in-themselves.[23] When his friend J.J. Engel later asked him “Do you want to reduce all religion down to poetry?”, Rehberg did not demur; his only qualification was that poetry sometimes has a moral worth.[24]

Already in Über das Verhältnis, published two years before the Revolution, some of Rehberg's conservative views make a brief appearance. His skepticism was beginning to bear political results. It is dangerous, he argues, to assume that reason is the basis for civil administration, because it leads to unwarranted expectations. The everyday administration of the state often rests on ad hoc or arbitrary decisions, and it is impossible to expect all of them to be based on some rational standard. Since conflict between people is inevitable, even in a purely rational constitution some things have to be decided on the basis of force alone.[25] Rehberg was also convinced of the necessity of elite rule, of the need for someone to make judgements about what is in the best interest of everyone. What is in the best interests of a state is a matter of specialized knowledge, which is not the concern of every man.[26]

After participating in the pantheism controversy, Rehberg made his mark in other philosophical controversies of his day. In the early 1790s he wrote several reviews for the Allgemeine Literatur Zeitung of Karl Leonhard Reinhold's Elementarphilosophie, which had been at the centre stage of the new debates surrounding Kant's critical philosophy.[27] Reinhold's Elementarphilosophie was a radical form of foundationalism, whose basic aim was to derive all the results of Kant's philosophy from a single self-evident first principle. The crucial question for Reinhold's contemporaries concerned the very possibility of such foundationalism. Is it possible to found all knowledge upon a single first principle? Given Rehberg's skepticism, it should not be surprising that he took a negative stand on this basic question. In his January 1791 review of Reinhold's Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, the chief exposition of the Elementarphilosophie, Rehberg sketched his misgivings about foundationalism. It is striking that his chief objections are strictly Kantian, coming straight out of the Kritik der reinen Vernunft itself. Rehberg implies that Reinhold is guilty of ignoring Kant's own strictures about the limits of knowledge; it is as if he were insinuating that Reinhold would better have heeded Kant's advice to limit himself to popularizing the critical philosophy. The problem with Reinhold's philosophy, Rehberg argues, is that it begins with definitions, ignoring Kant's warnings that definitions should end rather than begin philosophy. Reinhold neglected Kant's teaching that there is a fundamental difference in kind between the methods of mathematics and those of philosophy. While mathematical definitions can construct their objects in intuition, philosophical definitions have no such advantages. What we derive from a definition depends on how we interpret it, on what we read into it in the first place; and there are all kinds of interpretations of the same definition, so no basis of unanimity should be expected simply by beginning with a definition, no matter how simple and unproblematic. The chief theme of Rehberg's review—and indeed the leitmotif of all his political thought— is contained in his remark that “a definition need not contain a criterion of that which falls under it” (202). Rehberg develops this remark so that it becomes an objection against any attempt to apply general principles of philosophy to the practical world (205-6). To apply a general first principle, it is necessary to have a criterion to show the subordinate principles to which it applies; but there are no such criteria, because how we apply a principle is a matter of judgment, which, as Kant demonstrated, has no criteria.[28] As one might suspect, Rehberg's argument here is politically motivated, because he singles out Reinhold as one of those philosophers who think that his first principles are guidelines for the social and political world (204). The general conclusion of Rehberg's reasoning could not be more expressly political: “...the whole system of education and culture of man that should be based on scientific insight is false in theory and impossible in execution.” (205).

In the rest of his reviews, Rehberg doggedly pursued Reinhold's argument throughout the Beyträge, showing precisely how his principles are insufficient to derive even the most basic results of Kant's philosophy. We cannot begin to reconstruct here the details of his arguments.[29] Suffice it to say that Rehberg's reviews made an impact on his contemporaries, not least Reinhold himself, who fell into a fit of depression after reading them.[30] Rehberg's articles had made a great contribution toward skepticism about foundationalism, which would soon have a profound impact on the development of Romanticism.

The net result of Rehberg's participation in the philosophical controversies of the late 1780s and early 1790s was a deeper skepticism. There were two basic themes behind his skepticism. First, his adoption of Kant's critical thesis that we cannot know things-in-themselves, and that all knowledge is limited to appearances. Second, Rehberg's insistence that, even within the realm of appearances, there is a fundamental chasm between the universal and particular, between what we think and what we sense. There were in turn two aspects behind this latter dualism: that the universal concepts of theoretical reason cannot sufficiently explain or describe something particular; and that there is no criterion by which to apply the universal principles of practical reason to ordinary life. It was this latter aspect of the second theme, which was essentially an argument in behalf of the necessity of judgment to solve the basic problems of politics, that was decisive for Rehberg's political philosophy.

3. Political Convictions

Rehberg formed his political convictions early, long before the Revolution. Like all the Hannoverians, the inspiration for his politics came from the British constitution.[31] Hannoverian admiration for the British constitution is not surprising, given that Britian had long standing dynastic relations with the House of Hannover. But there were other sources for this admiration, all of them, ironically, perfectly French. Rehberg and the Hannoverians had read their Voltaire, Montesquieu and Jean Louis De Lolme, who had all praised the English constitution, making it their model for modern government and their antidote to absolutism. Like their French forbears, the Hannoverians admired the British constitution for its mixture of modern freedom and ancient institutions. The British had preserved their monarchy, their aristocracy and the ancient role of Parliament as a representative institution; but they had also liberalized these institutions by granting toleration, freedom of speech, and the right of commoners to hold office and participate in government. The great strength of the British constitution, in the Hannoverian view, is that it served as a bulwark against the two chief dangers of the modern political world: radical democracy and monarchic absolutism. The British constitution wisely limited the franchise to the aristocracy and wealthy bourgeoisie, which saved their system from ochlocracy; but it also ensured that the king had to govern with the co-operation of parliament. Contrary to Montesquieu and De Lolme, however, the Hannoverians did not see the balance of power, the system of checks and balances, as the reason for the success of the British system; they found it instead in the British party system, which they admired for two grounds: it organized politicans into effective groups in behalf of the public good, and it avoided corruption and complacency through opposition.[32]

Although Rehberg's conservative views were formed before the Revolution, his early reaction to events in France was not hostile. He was sympathetic to the moderate French reformers in the National Assembly, and he was hostile to royalists who insisted that France return to the days of absolute rule. Unlike Burke, he refused to whitewash the ancien régime, and he fully recognized that, before the Revolution, France had been in desperate need of social and political reform. Its taxes fell heavily on the poor, its aristocrats had undeserved privileges, and its monarchs had ruled by whim. Like all the Hannoverians, Rehberg's great hope was that France would evolve toward something like the British constitution, that it would become something like a Parliament along the Seine. He knew that France and Britian were very different societies, having different languages, traditions and values, and that it was impossible for one country to adopt wholesale the constitution of another. Nevertheless, he still hoped that the Estates General could become something like the British parliament. If only French aristocrats could be more like their British cousins, and if only Louis XVI could be persuaded to limits his powers like George III. When, however, it became clear that the Constituent Assembly was bent on more radical democratic and egalitarian changes, Rehberg's sympathy transformed into antipathy. His opposition became resolute, even passionate, when he saw that the French were ready to import these radical changes into Germany.

Despite his implacable hostility to radical democracy and egalitarianism, Rehberg's general stance toward the Revolution, as that of the Hannoverians in general, is best described as reform conservatism. Its task was to walk the fine middle path between revolution and reaction. Rehberg disapproved of the reactionaries in Germany no less than the revolutionaries in France. He realized that the expectations aroused by the Revolution made it impossible to return to the old authoritarian ways.[33] The only means to preserve the old order against revolutionary ferment was through timely reforms. Reform from above should placate and dampen the revolutionary demands coming from below. The best way forward, he believed, was for the German Kleinstaat to evolve in the direction of the English Parliament. The estates should become again what they had been in the medieval past: representative bodies that could check the power of kings and serve the interests of the public. Given Rehberg's mistrust of democracy and egalitarianism, it is perhaps going too far to describe his reform program as “one of constitutional advance under the disguise of antiquarian claims”.[34] Nevertheless, when we consider his liberal values and contempt for reactionaries, it is necessary to admit that there is some measure of truth to this description.

Although Rehberg and the Hannoverians were eager to uphold the traditional order against the radical currents of the Revolution, it is also important to be clear about just what kind of order they wanted to preserve. They were sharply critical of the ancien régime of Friedrich II's Prussia and of Louis XVI's France. They feared and condemned the despotic power of absolute monarchs, which they saw as threats to the traditional liberties of the estates. Their sympathies were for the pluralistic structure of the old Kleinstaat, where each locality or province had its traditional laws and customs, and where the estates gave some degree of representation. The Hannoverians saw the constitution of their own Electorate as the norm for the German Kleinstaat. In the late eighteenth century the Electorate of Hannover still had a thriving aristocracy, a pliable peasantry, and a still nascent middle class. The government was still in the hands of the Stände, i.e., governing committees representing clergy, town and landed interests. If these could only be reformed along the lines of the British Parliament, Rehberg believed, German states would not have to fear the excesses of absolutism or radical democracy.

The core of Rehberg's reform program came with his ideas about reforming the Stände. In the past the Stände had been dominated by aristocratic cliques who were concerned chiefly with their own interests rather than the public good. They would quarrel constantly with the princes to preserve their old privileges. The best positions were held by aristocrats, who alone had voting rights. Despite these defects, Rehberg believed that the Stände still had a valuable role to perform in the modern state, and that it would be a disaster to replace them with a bureaucracy. Whereas a bureacracy fostered a spirit of obedience and order, the Stände were open to discussion and debate about the public interest. Its members were not beholden to a monarch, but the interests of their locality and constituency. If the Stände were to survive in the modern era, they would have to respond more directly to their constituency, work more co-operatively with the monarch, and hold regular meetings to discuss and debate public affairs. Most importantly, they would have to be accessible to the bougeoisie as well as the aristocracy, so that men of talent could have the opportunity to rise to the top. Although Rehberg wanted the Stände to be more representative institutions, he still wanted to limit access to them. He feared direct representation of people—the slippery slope toward the dreaded universal franchise— and advocated representation on the basis of property. His chief demand for reform is that Landstandschaft—the right to participate and vote in committees—be extended to anyone who owned land and not simply to the traditional aristocracy. Hence a bourgeois purchaser of traditional aristocratic land could now be accepted into the Stände. Such a proposal is very modest and cautious; but it was also intended only for the near future; for Rehberg also advocated, though for the more distant future, the participation of the peasantry in the estates.[35]

Prima facie it is strange to find Rehberg, a burgher whose talents were thwarted by the aristocracy, to be such an advocate of its preservation. It seems as if he were a humble and obedient servant in his politics as well as in his bureacratic work. Yet aristocracy was fundamental to Rehberg's whole political outlook. Aristocracy was natural for him, given his insistence that rights and obligations are inherited, handed down from one generation to another (see below, section 4). More importantly, aristocracy was his bulwark against major fears: democracy and egalitarianism. The chief danger to democracy is that it could lead to ochlocracy, government by the mob. It was axiomatic for Rehberg that all government had to be meritocratic, and he could see no way of ensuring this principle in a radically democratic and equalitarian society. He believed firmly in the value of a social and political hierarchy, the importance of maintaining class differences between people.[36] Class differences were in his view both desirable and inevitable: desirable, because they allow merit to rule; and inevitable, because people have more or less merit or talent according to circumstances, temperament and birth.

4. Critique of the Revolution

Rehberg's critique of revolutionary ideology was based upon his general skepticism toward reason. He worked out his criticisms gradually and on scattered occasions from 1789 to 1792 in his reviews for the Allgemeine Literatur Zeitung. He later revised and collected these reviews, publishing them in 1793 under the title Untersuchungen über die Französische Revolution.[37] This work stands as one of the best German critiques of the French Revolution. In fundamental respects it laid the groundwork for German conservatism. Its significance was immediately recognized by Fichte, who devoted much effort to its refutation in his Beiträge zur Berichtigung der Urteile des Publikums über die französische Revolution.

For Rehberg, the Revolution was a failed experiment in idealism, a misguided attempt by French radicals to recreate society and state according to the principles of reason. There lay a fundamental fallacy behind this experiment: the belief that the principles of reason are guidelines for concrete political practice, that they are blueprints to reconstruct all society and the state. It was this belief, Rehberg argues, that sanctioned the frenzy of destruction behind the Revolution, the eagerness to abolish all the traditional political institutions of France. Since the French radicals believed that the principles of reason mandate a specific kind of constitution, and since traditional French institutions were very far from that ideal, they held that these institutions are contrary to reason, so that it was obligatory to abolish them. The chief fallacy behind revolutionary ideology, therefore, was its hyperrationalism, its belief that reason by itself dictates political practice. Hence Rehberg made it his chief business to expose this fallacy. In his many writings on the Revolution he argued emphatically and repeatedly that reason has no such powers. Although he accepted that pure reason does determine the general principles of morality, he denied that it is by itself sufficient to dictate political practice.[38] Reason by itself demands only that our principles are just and universal, applying without exception to everyone alike; but such principles are indifferent regarding the specific form of a constitution; they determine nothing about which laws are just and universal in the specific circumstances of a country. On their own, the general principles of reason are consistent with monarchy, democracy or aristocracy. Which form of government is best can be determined by experience alone, by seeing which laws have the greatest utility under specific circumstances.

It was one of Rehberg's central themes that the gap between theory and practice, between general principle and specific constitution, has to be bridged by judgment. Judgment is the special faculty and province of the statesman. Its task is to determine how best to apply the principles of reason under specific circumstances. It should never be confused simply with reason, the intellectual power of determining general rules; for, as Kant taught in the first Kritik,[39] judgment is that faculty that determines the application of rules and therefore does not stand under any rule itself. Judgment, however, is no easy task: there are many ways of applying the same principles; and the consequences of applying them have to be weighed against one another. Judgment is a faculty that improves with age and experience, and that sometimes requires technical expertise. The shortcoming of the French radicals is that they had underestimated judgment as they had overestimated reason. They assumed that each principle involves the criterion for its application, and that it should be applied in just one unique way, regardless of the circumstances.

Recognizing the role of judgment in politics means for Rehberg that another fundamental tenet of revolutionary ideology collapses: the principle of the autonomy of reason, i.e., the belief that each individual alone has the power and right to determine how to act in the state (15-17). Rousseau and Kant are right to claim that reason is inalienable, and that each individual is sovereign in having the power and right to ascertain general moral principles. But this does not give them, Rehberg argued, the power and right to determine how to apply these principles in specific circumstances. Since knowing how to apply these principles is a matter of judgment, and since judgment depends on experience and expertise, only a few qualified individuals will be able to determine the best form of a constitution and the laws of a country. Hence, in these cases, the individual should alienate his powers of judgment to those who are more qualified. Rehberg's advocacy of the role of judgment in politics thus became the basis for his defense of elite rule.

A central pillar of Rehberg's conservatism was his defense of tradition. The basis for that defense was, again, his critique of reason. Since reason by itself cannot determine the specific form of a constitution, it never lays down a mandate to abolish the established institutions of a country, and so it is permissible for the statesman to follow tradition. Sometimes, Rehberg argued, it is not only permissable but also obligatory for the statesman to respect the traditions and established institutions of a country.[40] A state is the product of the history of its people, of the experience of many generations; and each generation lays down the foundations on which another must build. What our forefathers built grew out of the unique circumstances of the country, and it has gradually adapted to them; to abolish it would leave us nothing to build upon and make it necessary to create ex nihilo. Rehberg's defense of tradition and precedent went even further: he argued that many of our social and moral obligations are themselves essentially historical, arising from inheritance. No state could persist for long, he argued, if future generations did not take over the obligations of past generations, or if children did not assume the duties of their parents (52-53). It was therefore a fundamental rule of civil society that children inherit the duties and responsibilities of their parents. Rehberg knew that this was a somewhat harsh doctrine, because it would mean accepting inequalities from birth and aristocratic privileges; yet he insisted upon it all the same:

“Human beings in civil society must be compelled to honor what their parents promised and began. No state could exist for long if children and other heirs were not made to take the place where the deceased once stood. Who would want to enter into commitments when the uncertain death of one of the committed parties released them of all obligations?” (52)

Given Rehberg's critique of rationalism and his respect for tradition, his reaction to social contract doctrine should not be surprising. He condemned it in the sharpest terms. This doctrine not only assumed that every individual has the power to judge political affairs, but it also seemed to absolve him from all traditional responsibilities and obligations. The social contract doctrine falsely holds, he argued, that we enter society and the state at will, as if we were born free and had some natural criterion by which to judge them; but we are born into society and the state, and the criteria by which we judge things are formed by them. We must give up the assumption, he insisted, that civil rights belong to people by nature; ranks and rights are inherited and depend upon the place in society into which we are born (62).

Rehberg saw the chief inspiration for French radicalism in the seductive and paradoxical writings of Jean Jacques Rousseau (6, 21). It was Rousseau who first advanced the principle of the autonomy of reason, and who made reason alone the touchstone of political legitimacy. His doctrine of the general will meant that every political principle should be tested in the light of reason, or according to what an ideally rational person would will. Rehberg found irresolvable ambiguities in Rousseau's doctrine, which, he claimed, made its application to the political world impossible. Rousseau's distinction between the general will and the will of all made it clear that it was not possible to determine the general will simply by what people happen to want; the general will was understood by Rousseau to be a norm that determines what everyone ought to will. But how is it possible to determine what everyone ought to will? And, more importantly, who is to determine it? The ambiguities of Rosseau's doctrine made it ripe for exploitation by Jacobin ideologues, who felt justified in “forcing people to be free”.

Another source of revolutionary ideology that became the special target of Rehberg's wrath was physiocratic doctrine. Though this doctrine was often associated with absolutism, Rehberg still saw it as a basic influence on radical thinking. He especially disliked what he took to be the physiocrats' leading principle: that everyone should have the right to do whatever they want as long as they do not interfere with anyone else. Such a principle laid down the path toward “a very crude egoism”. If this were made the governing principle of civil society, he argued, then people would recognize no obligations other than to leave others alone; the whole culture of social virtue would disappear (25-26). The physiocratic system also leads to materialism, he believed, because it values everything according to its utility, its ability to satisfy our basic needs. People will regard themselves as machines, who work to eat and eat only to work more (27). Since they show no immediate profit, there will be no point in developing our higher powers or in cultivating the arts (28).

5. Dispute with Kant

In the late 1780s, before his encounter with Reinhold, Rehberg took part in some of the heated debates surrounding Kant's critical philosophy. He was both an admirer and critic of Kant. While he defended Kant against the polemics of the Wolffians, he also wrote a critical review of the second Kritik, which was widely read in his day.[41] But the review of the second Kritik was only the first skirmish of a greater battle. Rehberg realized that his case against revolutionary ideology could triumph only if he defeated Kant. For Kant's ethical rationalism gave a strong philosophical foundation for the doctrines of Rousseau, which had been such an inspiration for the radicals in France. Some of Kant's basic concepts—the categorical imperative and moral autonomy— seemed post facto rationalization for Rousseau's social contract theory and republicanism. What was only a feeling or intuition in Rousseau became a concept or principle in Kant. These implications of Kant's doctrines became explicit in 1793 when Kant published his famous ‘Theory-Practice’ essay in the Berlinische Monatsschrift.[42] Here Kant argued that there is no gap between theory and practice in politics, and that reason is practical in political as well as moral life. He maintained that the principles of morality, which are determined by pure reason alone, are also binding in politics, and that pure reason provides the basis for a republican constitution involving the principles of liberty, equality and independence. Kant's theses were a direct challenge to Rehberg, who had made the gap between theory and practice the leitmotif of his critique of the Revolution. Sooner or later, then, he would have to reckon with the sage of Königsberg. His reply to Kant duly appeared in the Berlinische Monatsschrift in February 1794.[43]

Rehberg began his essay by expressing his agreement with the basic principles of Kant's moral philosophy. Unlike many opponents of Kant's moral theory, Rehberg was not an empiricist in ethics. He flatly denied that utility could settle matters of right,[44] and he held that the first principles of morality have to be established independent of experience, apart from any knowledge of the consequences of acting upon them. It was Kant's great merit, Rehberg declares, to have shown that the first principle of morality— ‘Act so that the maxim of your will becomes a universal law’—is determinable by pure reason alone. Where Rehberg disagrees with Kant is in his attempt to establish specific moral and political maxims from the first principle of morality. Like many later critics of Kant, Rehberg maintains that the categorical imperative is a purely formal principle, insufficient to determine the content of our specific duties. The categorical imperative amounts to nothing more than the general demand that our principles be universalizable, that they hold for everyone alike without exception, or that we treat like cases alike (117-118). As such it provides a merely negative condition for accepting a moral principle; the problem is that it does not provide a positive criterion to distinguish between the many maxims that satisfy this condition. The principle is still compatible with many different maxims, all of which are universalizable.

But why is the categorical imperative such a formal principle? Why cannot it derive any of our more specific duties? Rehberg's argument here becomes somewhat blurred and confused. While his intention is to show that the categorical imperative is a purely formal principle, some of his arguments tend to demonstrate not its formality but the impossibility of acting according to it in the real empirical world. It is one thing to show that the categorical imperative is not practical because it cannot determine specific duties; it is another thing to show that it is not practical because no one in the real world could act according to it, whether it derives specific duties or not. All told, Rehberg's polemic against Kant is an extraordinary mixture of insight and confusion. We can best summarize it in the following points:

  • If the categorical imperative is to derive any specific duties, it must tell us how to act in the empirical world. Yet pure reason can never determine a priori anything regarding the empirical world; hence the categorical imperative cannot determine any of our specific duties. Thus, for Rehberg, the dualism between the a priori and a posteriori in Kant's philosophy entails that the first principle of morality must be formal (119-120).
  • Yet this argument seems to suppose that because the categorical imperative cannot derive the content of a principle—how we should act in specific circumstances—it cannot determine its form—whether it is obligatory, permissible or forbidden. Kant always recognized, however, that the particular content of a maxim has to be derived from experience. All that must be derived a priori is its form. Hence on this score Rehberg's critique missed its mark.
  • Kant is right to hold that the first principle of morality is that man ought to be treated as an end in himself. However, once we examine the presuppositions of this principle, it becomes clear that it is severely limited in its application to the real world. This principle presupposes that everyone has a physical body that is their exclusive possession, which they are the sole master of, and which cannot be used by others as means to their ends. Yet such a presupposition is rarely, if ever, fulfilled in daily life. To preserve our bodies, it is sometimes necessary for people to use one another, to be means for one another's ends (118-119). The Kantian principle of morality as an end in itself is true only for a nation of angels, but not for human beings in the real world who depend on one another to survive.
  • In his ‘Theory-Practice’ Essay Kant attempts to derive from the categorical imperative the idea of equality before the law, or what he calls “the principle of equality”: Each member of a state has rights of coercion in relation to others. This means that everyone should enjoy equal protection before the law; in other words, if you violate my rights I can prosecute you as you can prosecute me if I violate your rights. Rehberg points out, however, that such a principle does not imply the radical view that everyone has equal rights; it entails only that everyone's rights must be equally respected, whatever the differences between them might be. The principle is indeed compatible with the greatest divergence in the extent and kind of rights (124).
  • Kant's principle of freedom — Everyone can seek happiness in their own manner as long as they do not interfere with a similar quest by others — applies to us only insofar as we are perfectly free beings who can live in complete independence of one another. But we are not such beings, because we depend on others simply to survive. What should these relations of dependence be? Kant's principles offer no concrete guidance (124).
  • All these difficulties with Kant's moral theory show, Rehberg concluded, that there is a gap between theory and practice, morals and politics after all. Kant's principles are either too general, so that they do not determine the specific maxims by which we should live, or they are too idealistic, incapable of application at all to the real world. If we are to determine our specific duties in the concrete world, and if we are to determine the best constitution for our country, we have no recourse but considerations of utility. We have to consider the needs of people in specific circumstances to ascertain which laws and policies are most beneficial. In some cases, however, even utility does not work, because we will have to decide between policies where the utility is indeterminable, incommensurable or equally balanced. In these cases we have no choice but to act according to convention or tradition (127).[45]

6. Rehberg and the Historicist Tradition

Rehberg's importance for the historicist tradition has long been appreciated by the few scholars who know him. It is scarcely recognized, however, among scholars of historicism, who either ignore him or treat him in a footnote.[46] In his magisterial Entstehung des Historismus Friedrich Meinecke treated Rehberg en passant, as if he were but a disciple of Möser.[47] This too is an injustice, since Rehberg was as great an influence on the historicist tradition as Möser himself. Though Möser was the more original thinker, Rehberg had a better understanding of its relevance for the post-revolutionary era. It is surely a telling sign of Rehberg's significance for historicism that Friedrich Savigny, the founder of the historical school of law, had praised him repeatedly for his critique of the Code Napoleon, the French attempt to impose a rational constitution upon the Electorate of Hannover.[48] Resistance to the Code Napoleon was the first cause célèbre of historicism, its first case in its battle against the legal rationalism of the Enlightenment; and in this respect Rehberg was Savigny's most weighty precedent. In sum, Rehberg's chief contribution to historicism was making it the antithesis to revolutionary ideology.

We find in Rehberg some standard historicist tropes before they became widespread in the nineteenth century. Like Herder and Möser, he taught that each nation is an organic whole, a unique individual, which cannot be reduced down to the mere sum of its members. Each nation has a singular and characteristic spirit (Volksgeist), which pervades every aspect of its life, and which persists over the generations. This meant for Rehberg, as later historicists, that moral and political values are sui generis and incommensurable, so that we should not judge one nation or epoch by the values of another. Rehberg also shared some of Möser's skepticism about the natural law tradition, which attempted to formulate universal values or moral standards above all the changes of history.[49] He too believed that these values often turned out to be the product of their own time and place, that they rested upon illicit generalizations from the values of one culture.

What was new to Rehberg's historicism was his critique of reason. His skepticism regarding the practical powers of reason gave historicism a new firmer foundation, one deeper than that dug by Möser or Herder. The ultimate upshot of his skepticism, as we have seen, is that there is a gap between theory and practice, between reason and conduct, in the realms of morality and politics. Since reason cannot lay down specific maxims for moral conduct, and since it cannot determine the specific form of a constitution, it proves to be a useless guide to moral and political action. What fills the gap between theory and practice is, for Rehberg, nothing less than history. There are two senses in which this is the case. First, we determine the specific maxims of our moral conduct, or the proper political constitution for a country, only by judging their utility, by seeing how well they fit into their cultural context, which is the product of history. Second, we sometimes have to lay aside utility and determine how to act by precedent and tradition, by learning the customs of a culture; but precedent, custom and tradition are also results of history. Both points show, Rehberg believes, that we are not completely free moral agents who simply choose to become part of a culture, and who choose principles of action based on pure reason alone; rather, we are born into our culture, which shapes our very identity, and which supplies the content for our principles. We cannot escape our history because it makes us who we are.

It is necessary to be precise, however, about the exact role played by history in Rehberg's philosophy. The historical strands of his thought have often been exaggerated, as if he completely rejected the natural law tradition and all rationalism in politics.[50] Although he was indeed skeptical about many claims made for natural law, he never denied its very existence; and although he doubted that practical reason determines concrete maxims, he never questioned that it could lay down the most general principles of morality. More exactly, his position is that natural law and practical reason are necessary, but not sufficient, for moral and political practice. History completes reason, but it does not replace it. This residual rationalism in Rehberg's political thought appears in some of his later articles on the historical school of law.[51] Reaffirming the Kantian view that there is an a priori dimension of right, he argued against the doctrine that all laws are nothing more than arbitrary commands. In this regard, Fichte's critique of Rehberg is unfair and misses the point.[52] Rehberg taught not that historical traditions determine the standard of right, as Fichte claimed, but only that they determine how it should be applied and developed in specific circumstances.

It is also important not to exaggerate Rehberg's traditionalism. His insistence on the indispenable role of tradition in political life was one of the characteristic features of his conservatism. It is important to add, though, that his faith in tradition was not that of a reactionary. He never went so far as to hold that custom and tradition are sacred. He admitted, indeed insisted, that we should change custom and tradition if they become oppressive or inconvenient in changing circumstances.[53]

Bibliography

Primary Sources: Rehberg's Chief Works

  • Sämmtliche Schriften. Hannover: Hahn, 1828-31. Planned to have four volumes, though only three appeared.
  • Cato. Basel: Thurneysen, 1780.
  • Philosophische Gespräche über das Vergnügen. Nürnberg, 1785.
  • Ueber das Verhältnis der Metaphysik zu der Religion. Berlin: Mylius, 1787.
  • Untersuchungen über die französische Revolution. Hannover: Ritscher, 1793. 2 vols.
  • Ueber den deutschen Adel. Göttingen: Röwer, 1803.
  • Ueber die Staatsverwaltung deutscher Länder und die Dienerschaft des Regenten. Hannover: Hahn, 1807.
  • Ueber den Code Napoleon und dessen Einführung in Deutschland. Hannover: Hahn, 1814.
  • Constitutionelle Phantasien eines alten Steuermannes im Sturme des Jahres 1832. Hamburg, 1832.

Secondary Sources

  • Epstein, Klaus, 1966, The Genesis of German Conservatism, Princeton: Princeton University Press; pp. 547–595 are on Rehberg.
  • Lessing, Kurt, 1910, Rehberg und die französische Revolution, Freiburg: Bielenfels.
  • Mollenhauer, Karl, 1904–05, A.W. Rehberg, ein hannoverscher Staatsmann im Zeitalter der Restauration, Blankburg am Harz.
  • Ritter, Gerhard, 1931, Stein: Eine Politische Biographie, Berlin: Deutsche Verlags Ansalt.
  • Rexius, Gunner, 1911, ‘Studien zur Staatslehre der historischen Schule, Historische Zeitschrift, 107: 513–26.
  • Vogel, Ursula, 1972, Konservative Kritik an der bürgerlichen Revolution: August Wilhelm Rehberg, Darmstadt: Luchterhand.
  • Weniger, Erich, 1925, ‘Stein und Rehberg’, Niedersächsisches Jahrbuch, 2: 1–124.

Copyright © 2007 by
Fred Beiser <fbeiser@syr.edu>

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