Notes to Bell's Theorem

1. For two papers which argue that EPR did not depend upon counterfactual reasoning but only upon ordinary induction, see d'Espagnat (1984) and Shimony (2001).

2. In Bell (1964) a deterministic hidden variables theory is assumed, and the Inequality derived depends upon the Quantum Mechanical assumption that a complete state m of a pair of spin-½ particles in a Quantum Mechanical singlet state assigns definite values opposite in sign to σ1·n and σ2·n for any direction n. Clauser et al. (1969) also assume a deterministic hidden variables theory but use no Quantum Mechanical information for the purpose of deriving an Inequality. Bell (1971) proves an Inequality in the framework of a stochastic hidden variables theory and makes no use of Quantum Mechanical information for this purpose. Clauser and Horne (1974) prove a mathematical lemma in order to simplify the derivation of their Inequality, and Aspect (appendix of 1983) adapts the lemma for the purpose of simplifying the proof of the BCHSH Inequality (16). Aspect's proof of the Inequality is valid when there are more than two exit channels from each analyzer, as is that of Mermin (1986).

3. (Roman numerals are used here instead of Arabic numerals in Fine's theorem in order to avoid confusion with equation numbering throughout this article.) There exist interesting general results showing that families of single and double distributions are the marginals of a single multiple distribution if and only if some corresponding Bell-type inequalities hold (Pitowsky 1989). Notice that these inequalities are used in a purely probabilistic context and are not directly related to locality or Bell's Theorem.

4. A number of authors suggest that backward causation from the overlap of the future light cones may be more acceptable than conspiracy in the overlap of the backward light cones. One of the most articulate proponents of this view is Price (1996).

Copyright © 2009 by
Abner Shimony <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007.