# Bell's Theorem

*First published Wed Jul 21, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jun 11, 2009*

Bell's Theorem is the collective name for a family of results, all showing the impossibility of a Local Realistic interpretation of quantum mechanics. There are variants of the Theorem with different meanings of “Local Realistic.” In John S. Bell's pioneering paper of 1964 the realism consisted in postulating in addition to the quantum state a “complete state”, which determines the results of measurements on the system, either by assigning a value to the measured quantity that is revealed by the measurement regardless of the details of the measurement procedure, or by enabling the system to elicit a definite response whenever it is measured, but a response which may depend on the macroscopic features of the experimental arrangement or even on the complete state of the system together with that arrangement. Locality is a condition on composite systems with spatially separated constituents, requiring an operator which is the product of operators associated with the individual constituents to be assigned a value which is the product of the values assigned to the factors, and requiring the value assigned to an operator associated with an individual constituent to be independent of what is measured on any other constituent. From his assumptions Bell proved an inequality (the prototype of “Bell's Inequality”) which is violated by the Quantum Mechanical predictions made from an entangled state of the composite system. In other variants the complete state assigns probabilities to the possible results of measurements of the operators rather than determining which result will be obtained, and nevertheless inequalities are derivable; and still other variants dispense with inequalities. The incompatibility of Local Realistic Theories with Quantum Mechanics permits adjudication by experiments, some of which are described here. Most of the dozens of experiments performed so far have favored Quantum Mechanics, but not decisively because of the “detection loophole” or the “communication loophole.” The latter has been nearly decisively blocked by a recent experiment and there is a good prospect for blocking the former. The refutation of the family of Local Realistic Theories would imply that certain peculiarities of Quantum Mechanics will remain part of our physical worldview: notably, the objective indefiniteness of properties, the indeterminacy of measurement results, and the tension between quantum nonlocality and the locality of Relativity Theory.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Proof of a Theorem of Bell's Type
- 3. Experimental Tests of Bell's Inequalities
- 4. The Detection Loophole and its Remedy
- 5. The Communication Loophole and its Remedy
- 6. Variants of Bell's Theorem
- 7. Philosophical Comments
- 8. Appendix
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

In 1964 John S. Bell, a native of Northern Ireland and a staff
member of CERN (European Organisation for Nuclear Research) whose
primary research concerned theoretical high energy physics, published a
paper in the short-lived journal *Physics* which transformed the
study of the foundation of Quantum Mechanics (Bell 1964). The paper
showed (under conditions which were relaxed in later work by Bell
(1971, 1985, 1987) himself and by his followers (Clauser et al. 1969,
Clauser and Horne 1974, Mermin 1986, Aspect 1983)) that *no physical
theory which is realistic and also local in a specified sense can agree
with all of the statistical implications of Quantum Mechanics.*
Many different versions and cases, with family resemblances, were
inspired by the 1964 paper and are subsumed under the italicized
statement, “Bell's Theorem” being the collective name for
the entire family.

One line of investigation in the prehistory of Bell's Theorem concerned the conjecture that the Quantum Mechanical state of a system needs to be supplemented by further “elements of reality” or “hidden variables” or “complete states” in order to provide a complete description, the incompleteness of the quantum state being the explanation for the statistical character of Quantum Mechanical predictions concerning the system. There are actually two main classes of hidden-variables theories. In one, which is usually called “non-contextual”, the complete state of the system determines the value of a quantity (equivalently, an eigenvalue of the operator representing that quantity) that will be obtained by any standard measuring procedure of that quantity, regardless of what other quantities are simultaneously measured or what the complete state of the system and the measuring apparatus may be. The hidden-variables theories of Kochen and Specker (1967) are explicitly of this type. In the other, which is usually called “contextual”, the value obtained depends upon what quantities are simultaneously measured and/or on the details of the complete state of the measuring apparatus. This distinction was first explicitly pointed out by Bell (1966) but without using the terms “contextual” and “non-contextual”. There actually are two quite different versions of contextual hidden-variables theories, depending upon the character of the context: an “algebraic context” is one which specifies the quantities (or the operators representing them) which are measured jointly with the quantity (or operator) of primary interest, whereas an “environmental context” is a specification of the physical characteristics of the measuring apparatus whereby it simultaneously measures several distinct co-measurable quantities. In Bohm's hidden-variables theory (1952) the context is environmental, whereas in those of Bell (1966) and Gudder (1970) the context is algebraic. A pioneering version of a “hidden variables theory” was proposed by Louis de Broglie in 1926–7 (de Broglie 1927, 1928) and a more complete version by David Bohm in 1952 (Bohm 1952; see also the entry on Bohmian mechanics). In these theories the entity supplementing the quantum state (which is a wave function in the position representation) is typically a classical entity, located in a classical phase space and therefore characterized by both position and momentum variables. The classical dynamics of this entity is modified by a contribution from the wave function

(1) ψ(x,t) = R(x,t)exp[iS(x,t)/ℏ],

whose temporal evolution is governed by the Schrödinger Equation. Both de Broglie and Bohm assert that the velocity of the particle satisfies the “guidance equation”

(2)v= grad(S/m),

whereby the wave function ψ acts upon the particles as a “guiding wave”.

De Broglie (1928) and the school of “Bohmian mechanics” (notably Dürr, Goldstein, and Zanghì (1992)) postulate the guidance equation without an attempt to derive it from a more fundamental principle. Bohm (1952), however, proposes a deeper justification of the guidance equation. He postulates a modified version of Newton's second law of motion:

(3)md²x/dt² = −grad[V(x,t) + U(x,t)],

where V(**x**, *t* ) is the standard
classical potential and U(**x**, *t* ) is a
new entity, the “quantum potential”,

(4) U(x,t) = −(ℏ²/2m) grad²R(x,t)/R(x,t),

and he proves that if the guidance equation holds at an initial time
*t*_{0}, then it follows from Eqs (2), (3), (4) and the
time dependent Schrödinger Equation that it holds for all time.
Although Bohm deserves credit for attempting to justify the guidance
equation, there is in fact tension between that equation and the
modified Newtonian equation (3), which has been analyzed by Baublitz
and Shimony (1996). Eq. (3) is a second order differential equation in
time and does not determine a definite solution for all *t*
without two initial conditions — **x** and
**v** at *t*_{0}.

Since **v** at *t*_{0} is a contingency,
the validity of the guidance equation at *t*_{0} (and
hence at all other times) is contingent. Bohm recognizes this gap in
his theory and discusses possible solutions (Bohm 1952, p. 179),
without reaching a definite proposal. If, however, this difficulty is
set aside, a solution is provided to the measurement problem of
standard quantum mechanics, i.e., the problem of accounting for the
occurrence of a definite outcome when the system of interest is
prepared in a superposition of eigenstates of the operator which is
subjected to measurement. Furthermore, the guidance equation ensures
agreement with the statistical predictions of standard quantum
mechanics. The hidden variables model using the guidance equation
inspired Bell to take seriously the hidden variables interpretation of
Quantum Mechanics, and the nonlocality of this model suggested his
theorem.

Another approach to the hidden variables conjecture has been to
investigate the consistency of the algebraic structure of the physical
quantities characterized by Quantum Mechanics with a hidden variables
interpretation. Standard Quantum Mechanics assumes that the
“propositions” concerning a physical system are isomorphic
to the lattice **L**(**H**) of closed linear
subspaces of a Hilbert space **H** (equivalently, to the
lattice of projection operators on **H**) with the
following conditions: (1) the proposition whose truth value is
necessarily ‘true’ is matched with the entire space
**H**; (2) the proposition whose truth value is
necessarily ‘false’ is matched with the empty subspace
**0;** (3) if a subspace *S* is matched with a
proposition *q*, then the orthogonal complement of *S* is
matched with the negation of *q*; (4) the proposition
*q*, whose truth value is ‘true’ if the truth-value
of either *q*_{1} or *q*_{2} is
‘true’ and is ‘false’ if the answers to both
*q*_{1} and *q*_{2} are
‘false’, is matched with the closure of the set theoretical
union of the spaces *S*_{1} and *S*_{2}
respectively matched to *q*_{1} and
*q*_{2}, the closure being the set of all vectors which
can be expressed as the sum of a vector in *S*_{1} and a
vector in *S*_{2}. It should be emphasized that this
matching does not presuppose that a proposition is necessarily either
true or false and hence is compatible with the quantum mechanical
indefiniteness of a truth value, which in turn underlies the feature of
quantum mechanics that a physical quantity may be indefinite in value.
The type of hidden variables interpretation which has been most
extensively treated in the literature (often called a
“non-contextual hidden variables interpretation” for a
reason which will soon be apparent) is a mapping *m* of the
lattice **L** into the pair {1,0}, where
*m*(*S*)=1 intuitively means that the proposition matched
with *S* is true and *m*(*S*)=0 means intuitively
that the proposition matched with *S* is false. A mathematical
question of importance is whether there exist such mappings for which
these intuitive interpretations are maintained and conditions (1)
– (4) are satisfied. A negative answer to this question for all
**L**(**H**) where the Hilbert space
**H** has dimensionality greater than 2 is implied by a
deep theorem of Gleason (1957) (which does more, by providing a
complete catalogue of possible probability functions on
**L**(**H**)). The same negative answer is
provided much more simply by John Bell (1966) (but without the complete
catalogue of probability functions achieved by Gleason), who also
provides a positive answer to the question in the case of
dimensionality 2 ; and independently these results were also achieved
by Kochen and Specker (1967). It should be added that in the case of
dimensionality 2 the statistical predictions of any quantum state can
be recovered by an appropriate mixture of the mappings *m*. (See
also the entry on the
Kochen-Specker theorem.)

In Bell (1966), after presenting a strong case against the hidden
variables program (except for the special case of dimensionality 2)
Bell performs a dramatic reversal by introducing a new type of hidden
variables interpretation – one in which the truth value which
*m* assigns to a subspace *S* depends upon the context
*C* of propositions measured in tandem with the one associated
with *S*. In the new type of hidden variables interpretation the
truth value into which *m* maps *S* depends upon the
context *C*. These interpretations are commonly referred to as
“contextual hidden variables interpretations”, whereas
those in which there is no dependence upon the context are called
“non-contextual.” Bell proves the consistency of contextual
hidden variables interpretations with the algebraic structure of the
lattice **L**(**H**) for two examples of
**H** with dimension greater than 2. (His proposal has
been systematized by Gudder (1970), who takes a context *C* to
be a maximal Boolean subalgebra of the lattice
**L**(**H**) of subspaces.)

Another line leading to Bell's Theorem was the investigation of
Quantum Mechanically entangled states, that is, quantum states of a
composite system that cannot be expressed as direct products of quantum
states of the individual components. That Quantum Mechanics admits of
such entangled states was discovered by Erwin Schrödinger (1926)
in one of his pioneering papers, but the significance of this discovery
was not emphasized until the paper of Einstein, Podolsky, and Rosen
(1935). They examined correlations between the positions and the linear
momenta of two well separated spinless particles and concluded that in
order to avoid an appeal to nonlocality these correlations could only
be explained by “elements of physical reality” in each
particle — specifically, both definite position and definite
momentum — and since this description is richer than permitted by
the uncertainty principle of Quantum Mechanics their conclusion is
effectively an argument for a hidden variables interpretation. (It
should be emphasized that their argument does not depend upon
counter-factual reasoning, that is reasoning about what would be
observed if a quantity were measured other than the one that was in
fact measured; instead their argument can be reformulated entirely in
the ordinary inductive logic, as emphasized by d'Espagnat (1976) and
Shimony (2001). This reformulation is important because it diminishes
the force of Bohr's (1935) rebuttal of Einstein, Podolsky, and Rosen on
the grounds that one is not entitled to draw conclusions about the
existence of elements of physical reality from considerations of what
would be seen if a measurement other than the actual one had been
performed. Bell was skeptical of Bohr's rebuttal for other reasons,
essentially that he regarded it to be
anthropocentric.^{[1]}
See also the entry on the
Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen paradox.)

At the conclusion of Bell (1966), in which Bell gives a new lease on
life to the hidden variables program by introducing the notion of
contextual hidden variables, he performs another dramatic reversal by
raising a question about a composite system consisting of two well
separated particles 1 and 2: suppose a proposition associated with a
subspace *S*_{1} of the Hilbert space of particle 1 is
subjected to measurement, and a contextual hidden variables theory
assigns the truth value *m*(*S*_{1}/*C*)
to this proposition. What physically reasonable conditions can be
imposed upon the context *C*? Bell suggests that *C*
should consist only of propositions concerning particle 1, for
otherwise the outcome of the measurement upon 1 will depend upon what
operations are performed upon a remote particle 2, and that would be
non-locality. This condition raises the question: can the statistical
predictions of Quantum Mechanics concerning the entangled state be
duplicated by a contextual hidden variables theory in which the context
*C* is localized? It is interesting to note that this question
also arises from a consideration of the de Broglie-Bohm model: when
Bohm derives the statistical predictions of a Quantum Mechanically
entangled system whose constituents are well separated, the outcome of
a measurement made on one constituent depends upon the action of the
“guiding wave” upon constituents that are far off, which in
general will depend on the measurement arrangement on that side. Bell
was thus heuristically led to ask whether a lapse of locality is
necessary for the recovery of Quantum Mechanical statistics.

## 2. Proof of a Theorem of Bell's Type

Bell (1964) gives a pioneering proof of the theorem that bears his
name, by first making explicit a conceptual framework within which
expectation values can be calculated for the spin components of a pair
of spin-half particles, then showing that, regardless of the choices
that are made for certain unspecified functions that occur in the
framework, the expectation values obey a certain inequality which has
come to be called “Bell's Inequality.” That term is now
commonly used to denote collectively a family of Inequalities derived
in conceptual frameworks similar to but more general than the original
one of Bell. Sometimes these Inequalities are referred to as
“Inequalities of Bell's type.” Each of these conceptual
frameworks incorporates some type of hidden variables theory and obeys
a locality assumption. The name “Local Realistic Theory” is
also appropriate and will be used throughout this article because of
its generality. Bell calculates the expectation values for certain
products of the form
(σ_{1}·â)(σ_{2}·ê),
where σ_{1} is the vectorial Pauli spin operator for
particle 1 and σ_{2} is the vectorial Pauli spin operator
for particle 2 ( both particles having spin ½), and â and
ê are unit vectors in three-space, and then shows that these
Quantum Mechanical expectation values violate Bell's Inequality. This
violation constitutes a special case of Bell's Theorem, stated in
generic form in
Section 1,
for it shows that no Local
Realistic Theory subsumed under the framework of Bell's 1964 paper can
agree with all of the statistical predictions of quantum theory.

In the present section the pattern of Bell's 1964 paper will be
followed: formulation of a framework, derivation of an Inequality,
demonstration of a discrepancy between certain quantum mechanical
expectation values and this Inequality. However, a more general
conceptual framework than his will be assumed and a somewhat more
general Inequality will be derived, thus yielding a more general
theorem than the one derived by Bell in 1964, but with the same
strategy and in the same spirit. Papers which took the steps from
Bell's 1964 demonstration to the one given here are Clauser et al.
(1969), Bell (1971), Clauser and Horne (1974), Aspect (1983) and Mermin
(1986).^{[2]}
Other strategies for deriving Bell-type theorems will be mentioned in
Section 6,
but with less emphasis because they have, at least so far, been less
important for experimental tests.

The conceptual framework in which a Bell-type Inequality will be
demonstrated first of all postulates an ensemble of pairs of systems,
the individual systems in each pair being labeled as 1 and 2. Each pair
of systems is characterized by a “complete state”
*m* which contains the entirety of the properties of the pair at
the moment of generation. The complete state *m* may differ from
pair to pair, but the mode of generation of the pairs establishes a
probability distribution ρ which is independent of the adventures
of each of the two systems after they separate. Different experiments
can be performed on each system, those on 1 designated by *a*,
*a*′, etc. and those on 2 by *b*,
*b*′, etc. One can in principle let *a*,
*a*′, etc. also include characteristics of the apparatus
used for the measurement, but since the dependence of the result upon
the microscopic features of the apparatus is not determinable
experimentally, only the macroscopic features of the apparatus (such as
orientations of the polarization analyzers) in their incompletely
controllable environment need be admitted in practice in the
descriptions *a*, *a*′, etc. , and likewise for
*b*, *b*′, etc. The remarkably good agreement
— which will be presented in
Section 3
—
between the experimental measurements of correlations in Bell-type
experiments and the quantum mechanical predictions of these
correlations justifies restricting attention in practice to macroscopic
features of the apparatus. The result of an experiment on 1 is labeled
by *s*, which can take on any of a discrete set of real numbers
in the interval [−1, 1]. Likewise the result of an experiment on
2 is labeled by *t*, which can take on any of a discrete set of
real numbers in [−1, 1]. (Bell's own version of his theorem
assumed that *s* and *t* are both bivalent, either
−1 or 1, but other ranges are assumed in other variants of the
theorem.)

The following probabilities are assumed to be well defined:

(5)

p^{1}_{m}(s|a,b,t) = the probability that the outcome of the measurement performed on 1 isswhenmis the complete state, the measurements performed on 1 and 2 respectively areaandb, and the result of the experiment on 2 ist;(6)

p^{2}_{m}(t|a,b,s) = the probability that the outcome of the measurement performed on 2 istwhen the complete state ism, the measurements performed on 1 and 2 are respectivelyaandb, and the result of the measurementaiss.(7)

p_{m}(s,t|a,b) = the probability that the results of the joint measurementsaandb, when the complete state ism, are respectivelysandt.

The probability function *p* will be assumed to be
non-negative and to sum to unity when the summation is taken over all
allowed values of *s* and *t*. (Note that the hidden
variables theories considered in
Section 1
can be
subsumed under this conceptual framework by restricting the values of
the probability function *p* to 1 and 0, the former being
identified with the truth value “true” and the latter to
the truth value “false”. )

A further feature of the conceptual framework is *locality*,
which is understood as the conjunction of the following
*Independence Conditions*:

Remote Outcome Independence(this name is a neologism, but an appropriate one, for what is commonly calledoutcome independence)(8a)

p^{1}_{m}(s|a,b,t) ≡p^{1}_{m}(s|a,b) is independent oft,(8b)

p^{2}_{m}(t|a,b,s) ≡p^{2}_{m}(t|a,b) is independent ofs;(Note that Eqs. (8a) and (8b) do not preclude correlations of the results of the experiment

aon 1 and the experimentbon 2; they say rather that if the complete statemis given, the outcomesof the experiment on 1 provides no additional information regarding the outcome of the experiment on 2, and conversely.)

Remote Context Independence(this also is a neologism, but an appropriate one, for what is commonly calledparameter independence):(9a)

p^{1}_{m}(s|a,b) ≡p^{1}_{m}(s|a) is independent ofb,(9b)

p^{2}_{m}(t|a,b) ≡p^{2}_{m}(t|b) is independent ofa.

Jarrett (1984) and Bell (1990) demonstrated the equivalence of the conjunction of (8a,b) and (9a,b) to the factorization condition:

(10)p_{m}(s,t|a,b) =p^{1}_{m}(s|a)p^{2}_{m}(t|b),

and likewise for (*a*, *b*′),
(*a*′, *b* ) , and
(*a*′,*b*′) substituted for (*a*,
*b* ).

The factorizability condition Eq. (10) is also often referred to as
*Bell locality*. It should be emphasized that at the present
stage of exposition, however, Bell locality is merely a mathematical
condition within a conceptual framework, to which no physical
significance has been attached — in particular no connection to
the locality of Special Relativity Theory, although such a connection
will be made later when experimental applications of Bell's theorem
will be discussed.

Bell's Inequality is derivable from his locality condition by means of a simple lemma:

(11) If

q,q′,r,r′ all belong to the closed interval [−1,1], thenS≡qr+qr′ +q′r−q′r′ belongs to the closed interval [−2,2].Proof: Since

Sis linear in all four variablesq,q′,r,r′ it must take on its maximum and minimum values at the corners of the domain of this quadruple of variables, that is, where each ofq,q′,r,r′ is +1 or −1. Hence at these cornersScan only be an integer between −4 and +4. ButScan be rewritten as (q+q′)(r+r′) – 2q′r′, and the two quantities in parentheses can only be 0, 2, or −2, while the last term can only be −2 or +2, so thatScannot equal ±3, +3, −4, or +4 at the corners. Q.E.D.

Now define the expectation value of the product *s**t*
of outcomes:

(12)E_{m}(a,b) ≡ Σ_{s}Σ_{t}p_{m}(s,t|a,b)(st), the summation being taken over all the allowed values ofsandt.

and likewise with (*a*, *b*′).
(*a*′, *b* ). and (*a*′,
*b*′) substituted for (*a*, *b* ).
Also take the quantities *q*, *q*′, *r*,
*r*′ of the above lemma (11) to be the single expectation
values:

(13a)q= Σ_{s}sp^{1}_{m}(s|a),(13b)

q′ = Σ_{s}sp^{1}_{m}(s|a′),(13c)

r= Σ_{t}tp^{2}_{m}(t|b),(13d)

r′ = Σ_{t}tp^{2}_{m}(t|b′).

Then the lemma, together with Eq. (12), factorization condition Eq.
(10), and the bounds on *s* and *t* stated prior to Eq.
(5), implies:

(14) −2 ≤E_{m}(a,b) +E_{m}(a,b′) +E_{m}(a′,b) −E_{m}(a′,b′) ≤ 2.

Finally, return to the fact that the ensemble of interest consists
of pairs of systems, each of which is governed by a mapping *m*,
but *m* is chosen stochastically from a space *M* of
mappings governed by a standard probability function ρ — that
is, for every Borel subset *B* of *M*,
ρ(*B* ) is a non-negative real number,
ρ(*M* ) = 1, and
ρ(*U*_{j} *B*_{j})
= Σ_{j} ρ(*B*_{j})
where the *B*_{j}'s are disjoint Borel subsets of
*M* and *U*_{j}
*B*_{j} is the set-theoretical union of the
*B*_{j}'s. If we define

(15a)

p_{ρ}(s,t|a,b) ≡ ∫_{M}p_{m}(s,t|a,b)dρ(15b)

E_{ρ}(a,b) ≡ ∫_{M}E_{m}(a,b)dρ = Σ_{s}Σ_{t}∫_{M}p_{m}(s,t|a,b)(st)dρ

and likewise when (*a*, *b*′),
(*a*′, *b* ), and (*a*′,
*b*′) are substituted for (*a*,
*b* ), then (14), (15a,b), and the properties of ρ
imply

(16) −2 ≤E_{ρ}(a,b) +E_{ρ}(a,b′) +E_{ρ}(a′,b) −E_{ρ}(a′,b′) ≤ 2.

Ineq. (16) is an Inequality of Bell's type, henceforth called the “Bell-Clauser-Horne-Shimony-Holt (BCHSH) Inequality.”

The third step in the derivation of a theorem of Bell's type is to
exhibit a system, a quantum mechanical state, and a set of quantities
for which the statistical predictions violate Inequality (16). Let the
system consist of a pair of photons 1 and 2 propagating in
the *z*-direction. The two kets
|*x*>_{j} and
|*y*>_{j} constitute a polarization basis
for photon *j* (*j* =1, 2), the former representing (in
Dirac's notation) a state in which the photon 1 is linearly polarized
in the *x*-direction and the latter a state in which it is
linearly polarized in the *y*-direction. For the two-photon
system the four product kets |*x*>_{1}
|*x*>_{2}, |*x*>_{1}
|*y*>_{2}, |*y*>_{1}
|*x*>_{2}, and |*y*>_{1}
|*y*>_{2} constitute a polarization basis. Each
two-photon polarization state can be expressed as a linear combination
of these four basis states with complex coefficients. Of particular
interest are the *entangled* quantum states, which in no way
can be expressed as |φ>_{1}|ξ>_{2,} with
|φ> and |ξ> single-photon states, an example being

(17) | Φ > = (1/√2)[ |x>_{1}|x>_{2}+ |y>_{1}|y>_{2}],

which has the useful property of being invariant under rotation of
the *x* and *y* axes in the plane perpendicular to
*z*. The total quantum state of the pair of photons 1 and 2 is
invariant under the exchange of the two photons, as required by the
fact that photons are integral spin particles. Neither photon 1 nor
photon 2 is in a definite polarization state when the pair is in the
state |ψ>, but their potentialities (in the terminology of
Heisenberg 1958) are correlated: if by measurement or some other
process the potentiality of photon 1 to be polarized along
the *x*-direction or along the
*y*-direction is actualized, then the same will be true of
photon 2, and conversely. Suppose now that photons 1 and 2 impinge
respectively on the faces of birefringent crystal polarization
analyzers I and II, with the entrance face of each analyzer
perpendicular to *z*. Each analyzer has the property of
separating light incident upon its face into two outgoing non-parallel
rays, the *ordinary ray* and the *extraordinary ray*. The
transmission axis of the analyzer is a direction with the property that
a photon polarized along it will emerge in the ordinary ray (with
certainty if the crystals are assumed to be ideal), while a photon
polarized in a direction perpendicular to *z* and to the
transmission axis will emerge in the extraordinary ray. See Figure
1:

Figure 1

(reprinted with permission)

Photon pairs are emitted from the source, each pair quantum
mechanically described by |Φ> of Eq. (17), and by a complete
state *m* if a Local Realistic Theory is assumed. I and II are
polarization analyzers, with outcome *s*=1 and *t*=1
designating emergence in the ordinary ray, while *s* = −1
and *t* = −1 designate emergence in the extraordinary
ray.

The crystals are also idealized by assuming that no incident photon
is absorbed, but each emerges in either the ordinary or the
extraordinary ray. Quantum mechanics provides an algorithm for
computing the probabilities that photons 1 and 2 will emerge from these
idealized analyzers in specified rays, as functions of the orientations
*a* and *b* of the analyzers, *a* being the angle
between the transmission axis of analyzer I and an arbitrary fixed
direction in the *x*-*y* plane, and *b* having the
analogous meaning for analyzer II:

(18a) prob_{Φ}(s,t|a,b) =|<Φ|θ_{s}>_{1}|φ_{t}>_{2}|^{2}.

Here *s* is a quantum number associated with the ray into
which photon 1 emerges, +1 indicating emergence in the ordinary ray and
−1 emergence in the extraordinary ray when *a* is given,
while *t* is the analogous quantum number for photon 2 when
*b* is given; and |θ_{s}
>_{1} |φ_{t} >_{2} is the
ket representing the quantum state of photons 1 and 2 with the
respective quantum numbers *s* and *t*. Calculation of
the probabilities of interest from Eq. (18a) can be simplified by
using the invariance noted after Eq. (17) and rewriting |Φ >
as

(19) |Φ> = (1/√2)[ |θ_{1}>_{1}|θ_{1}>_{2}+ |θ_{−1}>_{1}|θ_{−1}>_{2}].

Eq. (19) results from Eq. (17) by substituting the transmission axis
of analyzer I for *x* and the direction perpendicular to both
*z* and this transmission axis for *y*.

Since |θ_{−1}>_{1} is orthogonal to
|θ_{1}>_{1}, only the first term of Eq. (19)
contributes to the inner product in Eq. (18a) if
*s*=*t*=1; and since the inner product of |
θ_{1} >_{1} with itself is unity because of
normalization, Eq. (18a) reduces for *s* = *t* = 1 to

(18b) prob_{Φ}(1,1|a,b) = (½)|_{2}<θ_{1}|φ_{1}>_{2}|^{2}.

Finally, the expression on the right hand side of Eq. (18b) is
evaluated by using the law of Malus, which is preserved in the quantum
mechanical treatment of polarization states: that the probability for a
photon polarized in a direction *n* to pass through an ideal
polarization analyzer with axis of transmission *n*′
equals the squared cosine of the angle between *n* and
*n*′. Hence

(20a) prob_{Φ}(1,1|a,b) = (½)cos^{2}σ,

where σ is *b*−*a*. Likewise,

(20b) prob

_{Φ}(−1,−1|a,b) = (½) cos^{2}σ, and(20c) prob

_{Φ}(1,−1|a,b) = prob_{Φ}(−1,1|a,b) = (½)sin^{2}σ.

The expectation value of the product of the results *s* and
*t* of the polarization analyses of photons 1 and 2 by their
respective analyzers is

(21)E_{Φ}(a,b) = prob_{Φ}(1,1|a,b) + prob_{Φ}(−1,−1|a,b) − prob_{Φ}(1,−1|a,b) − prob_{Φ}(−1,1|a,b) = cos^{2}σ − sin^{2}σ = cos2σ.

Now choose as the orientation angles of the transmission axes

(22)a= π/4,a′ = 0,b= π/8,b′ = 3 π/8 .

Then

(23a)

E_{Φ}(a,b) = cos2(-π/8) = 0.707,(23b)

E_{Φ}(a,b′) = cos2(π/8) = 0.707,(23c)

E_{Φ}(α′,b) = cos2(π/8) = 0.707,(23d)

E_{Φ}(a′,b′) = cos2(3π/8) = −0.707.

Therefore

(24)S_{Φ}≡E_{Φ}(a,b) +E_{Φ}(a,b′) +E_{Φ}(a′,b) −E_{Φ}(a′,b′) = 2.828.

Eq. (24) shows that there are situations where the Quantum Mechanical calculations violate the BCHSH Inequality, thereby completing the proof of a version of Bell's Theorem. It is important to note, however, that all entangled quantum states yield predictions in violation of Ineq. (16), as Gisin (1991) and Popescu and Rohrlich (1992) have independently demonstrated. Popescu and Rohrlich (1992) also show that the maximum amount of violation is achieved with a quantum state of maximum degree of entanglement, exemplified by |Φ > of Eq. (17).

In
Section 3
experimental tests of Bell's
Inequality and their implications will be discussed. At this point,
however, it is important to discuss the significance of Bell's Theorem
from a purely theoretical standpoint. What Bell's Theorem shows is that
Quantum Mechanics has a structure that is incompatible with the
conceptual framework within which Bell's Inequality was demonstrated: a
framework in which a composite system with two subsystems 1 and 2 is
described by a complete state assigning a probability to each of the
possible results of every joint experiment on 1 and 2, with the
probability functions satisfying the two Independence Conditions (8a,b)
and (9a,b), and furthermore allowing mixtures governed by arbitrary
probability functions on the space of complete states. An
‘experiment’ on a system can be understood to include the
*context* within which a physical property of the system is
measured, but the two Independence Conditions require the context to be
local – that is, if a property of 1 is measured only properties
of 1 co-measurable with it can be part of its context, and similarly
for a property of 2. Therefore the incompatibility of Quantum Mechanics
with this conceptual framework does not preclude the contextual hidden
variables models proposed by Bell in (1966), an example of which is the
de Broglie-Bohm model, but it does preclude models in which the
contexts are required to be local. The most striking implication of
Bell's Theorem is the light that it throws upon the EPR argument. That
argument examines an entangled quantum state and shows that a necessary
condition for avoiding action-at-a-distance between measurement
outcomes of correlated properties of the two subsystems — e.g.,
position in both or linear momentum in both — is the ascription
of “elements of physical reality” corresponding to the
correlated properties to each subsystem without reference to the other.
Bell's Theorem shows that such an ascription will have statistical
implications in disagreement with those of quantum mechanics. A
penetrating feature of Bell's analysis, when compared with that of EPR,
is his examination of *different* properties in the two
subsystems, such as linear polarizations along different directions in
1 and 2, rather than restricting his attention to correlations of
identical properties in the two subsystems.

## 3. Experimental Tests of Bell's Inequalities

When Bell published his pioneering paper in 1964 he did not urge an experimental resolution of the conflict between Quantum Mechanics and Local Realistic Theories, probably because the former had been confirmed often and precisely in many branches of physics.

It was doubtful, however, that any of these many confirmations
occurred in situations of conflict between Quantum Mechanics and Local
Realistic Theories, and therefore a reliable experimental adjudication
was desirable. A proposal to this effect was made by Clauser, Horne,
Shimony, and Holt (1969), henceforth CHSH, who suggested that the pairs
1 and 2 be the photons produced in an atomic cascade from an initial
atomic state with total angular momentum J = 0 to an intermediate
atomic state with J = 1 to a final atomic state J = 0, as in an
experiment performed with calcium vapor for other purposes by Kocher
and Commins (1967). This arrangement has several advantages: first, by
conservation of angular momentum the photon pair emitted in the cascade
has total angular momentum 0, and if the photons are collected in cones
of small aperture along the *z*-direction the
total orbital angular momentum is small, with the consequence that the
total spin (or polarization) angular momentum is close to 0 and
therefore the polarizations of the two photons are tightly correlated;
second, the photons are in the visible frequency range and hence
susceptible to quite accurate polarization analysis with standard
polarization analyzers; and third, the stochastic interval between the
time of emission of the first photon and the time of emission of the
second is in the range of 10 nsec., which is small compared to the
average time between two productions of pairs, and therefore the
associated photons 1 and 2 of a pair are almost unequivocally matched.
A disadvantage of this arrangement, however, is that photo-detectors in
the relevant frequency range are not very efficient — less than
20% efficiency for single photons and hence less that 4% efficient for
detection of a pair — and therefore an auxiliary assumption is
needed in order to make inferences from the statistics of the
subensemble of the pairs that is counted to the entire ensemble of
pairs emitted during the period of observation. (This disadvantage
causes a “detection loophole” which prevents the
experiment, and others like it, from being decisive, but procedures for
blocking this loophole are at present being investigated actively and
will be discussed in
Section 4).

In the experiment proposed by CHSH the measurements are polarization
analyses with the transmission axis of analyzer I oriented at angles
*a* and *a*′, and the transmission axis of analyzer
II oriented at angles *b* and *b*′. The results
*s* = 1 and *s* = −1 respectively designate passage
and non-passage of photon 1 through analyzer I, and *t* = 1 and
*t* = −1 respectively designate passage and non-passage of
photon 2 through analyzer II. Non-passage through the analyzer is thus
substituted for passage into the extraordinary ray. This simplification
of the apparatus causes an obvious problem: that it is impossible to
discriminate directly between a photon that fails to pass through the
analyzer and one which does pass through the analyzer but is not
detected because of the inefficiency of the photo-detectors. CHSH dealt
with this problem in two steps. First, they expressed the probabilities
*p*_{ρ}(*s*,*t* |*a*,*b* ),
where either *s* or *t* (or both) is
−1 as follows:

(25a)p_{ρ}(1,−1|a,b) =p_{ρ}(1,1|a,∞) −p_{ρ}(1,1|a,b),

where ∞ replacing *b* designates the removal of the
analyzer from the path of 2. Likewise

(25b)p_{ρ}(−1,1|a,b) =p_{ρ}(1,1|∞,b) −p_{ρ}(1,1|a,b),

where analyzer II is oriented at angle *b* and ∞
replacing *a* designates removal of the analyzer I from the path
of photon 1; and finally

(25c)p_{ρ}(−1,−1|a,b) = 1 −p_{ρ}(1,1|a,b) −p_{ρ}(1,−1|a,b) −p_{ρ}(−1,1|a,b) = 1 −p_{ρ}(1,1|a, ∞) −p_{ρ}(1,1| ∞,b) +p_{ρ}(1,1|a,b),

Their second step is to make the “fair sampling
assumption”: *given that a pair of photons enters the pair of
rays associated with passage through the polarization analyzers, the
probability of their joint detection is independent of the orientation
of the analyzers (including the quasi-orientation* ∞
*which designates removal).* With this assumption, together with
the assumptions that the local realistic expressions
*p*_{ρ}(*s*,*t* |*a*,*b* )
correctly evaluate the probabilities of the results of
polarization analyses of the photon pair (1,2), we can express these
probabilities in terms of detection rates:

(26a)p_{ρ}(1,1|a,b) =D(a,b)/D_{0}

where *D*(*a*,*b* ) is the counting rate
of pairs when the transmission axes of analyzers I and II are oriented
respectively at angles *a* and *b*, and
*D*_{0} is the detection rate when both analyzers are
removed from the paths of photons 1 and 2;

(26b)p_{ρ}(1,1|a,∞) =D^{1}(a,∞)/D_{0},

where *D*^{1}(*a*,∞) is the counting
rate of pairs when analyzer I is oriented at angle *a* while
analyzer II is removed; and

(26c)p_{ρ}(1,1|∞,b) =D^{2}(∞,b)/D_{0},

where *D*^{2}(∞,*b* ) is the
counting rate when analyzer II is oriented at angle *b* while
analyzer I is removed. When Ineq. (16) is combined with Eq. (15b) and
with Eqs (26a,b,c) relating probabilities to detection rates, the
result is an inequality governing detection rates,

(27) −1 ≤D(a,b)/D_{0}+D(a,b′)/D_{0}+D(a′,b)/D_{0}−D(a′,b′)/D_{0}− [D^{1}(a)/D_{0}+D^{2}(b)/D_{0}] ≤ 0.

(In (27), *D*^{1}(*a*) is an abbreviation for
*D*(*a*,∞), and *D*^{2}(*b*)
is an abbreviation for *D*(∞,*b*).)

If the following symmetry conditions are satisfied by the experiment:

(28)

D(a,b) =D(|b−a|),(29)

D^{1}(a) =D^{1}, independent ofa;(30)

D^{2}(b) =D^{2}, independent ofb,

one can rewrite Ineq. (27) as

(31) −1 ≤D(|b−a|)/D_{0}+D(|b′−a|)/D_{0}+D(|b−a′|)/D_{0}−D(|b′−a′|)/D_{0}− [D^{1}/D_{0}+D^{2}/D_{0}] ≤ 0.

The first experimental test of Bell's Inequality, performed by
Freedman and Clauser (1972), proceeded by making two applications of
Ineq. (31), one to the angles *a* = π/4, *a*′ =
0, *b* = π/8, *b*′ = 3π/8, yielding

(32a) −1 ≤ [3D(π/8)/D_{0}−D(3π/8)/D_{0}] −D^{1}/D_{0}−D^{2}/D_{0}≤ 0,

and another to the angles *a* = 3π/4, *a*′ =
0, *b* = 3π/8, *b*′ = 9π/8, yielding

(32b) −1 ≤ [3D(3π/8)/D_{0}−D(π/8)/D_{0}] −D^{1}/D_{0}−D^{2}/D_{0}≤ 0.

Combining Ineq. (32a) and Ineq. (32b) yields

(33) −(¼) ≤ [D(π/8 )/D_{0}−D(3π/8)/D_{0}] ≤ ¼ .

The Quantum Mechanical prediction for this arrangement, taking into account the uncertainties about the polarization analyzers and the angle from the source subtended by the analyzers, is

(34) [D(π/8)/D_{0}−D(3π/8)/D_{0}]_{QM}= (0.401+/-0.005) − (0.100+/-0.005) = 0.301+/-0.007,

The experimental result obtained by Freedman and Clauser was

(35) [D(π/8)/D_{0}−D(3π/8)/D_{0}]_{expt}= 0.300 +/- 0.008,

which is 6.5 sd from the limit allowed by Ineq. (33) but in good agreement with the quantum mechanical prediction Eq. (34). This was a difficult experiment, requiring 200 hours of running time, much longer than in most later tests of Bell's Inequality, which were able to use lasers for exciting the sources of photon pairs.

Several dozen experiments have been performed to test Bell's Inequalities. References will now be given to some of the most noteworthy of these, along with references to survey articles which provide information about others. A discussion of those actual or proposed experiments which were designed to close two serious loopholes in the early Bell experiments, the “detection loophole” and the “communication loophole”, will be reserved for Section 4 and Section 5.

Holt and Pipkin completed in 1973 (Holt 1973) an experiment very much
like that of Freedman and Clauser, but examining photon pairs produced
in the 9^{1}*P*_{1}
→7^{3}*S*_{1}→6^{3}*P*_{
0} cascade in the zero nuclear-spin isotope of mercury-198 after
using electron bombardment to pump the atoms to the first state in
this cascade. The result of Holt and Pipkin was in fairly good
agreement with Ineq. (33), which is a consequence of the BCHSH
Inequality, and in disagreement with the quantum mechanical prediction
by nearly 4 sd — contrary to the results of Freedman and
Clauser. Because of the discrepancy between these two early
experiments Clauser (1976) repeated the Holt-Pipkin experiment, using
the same cascade and excitation method but a different spin-0 isotope
of mercury, and his results agreed well with the quantum mechanical
predictions but violated the consequence of Bell's Inequality. Clauser
also suggested a possible explanation for the anomalous result of
Holt-Pipkin: that the glass of the Pyrex bulb containing the mercury
vapor was under stress and hence was optically active, thereby giving
rise to erroneous determinations of the polarizations of the cascade
photons.

Fry and Thompson (1976) also performed a variant of the Holt-Pipkin experiment, using a different isotope of mercury and a different cascade and exciting the atoms by radiation from a narrow-bandwidth tunable dye laser. Their results also agreed well with the quantum mechanical predictions and disagreed sharply with Bell's Inequality. They gathered data in only 80 minutes, as a result of the high excitation rate achieved by the laser.

Four experiments in the 1970s — by Kasday-Ullman-Wu, Faraci-Gutkowski-Notarigo-Pennisi, Wilson-Lowe-Butt, and Bruno-d’Agostino-Maroni used photon pairs produced in positronium annihilation instead of cascade photons. Of these, all but that of Faraci et al. gave results in good agreement with the quantum mechanical predictions and in disagreement with Bell's Inequalities. A discussion of these experiments is given in the review article by Clauser and Shimony (1978), who regard them as less convincing than those using cascade photons, because they rely upon stronger auxiliary assumptions.

The first experiment using polarization analyzers with two exit channels, thus realizing the theoretical scheme in the third step of the argument for Bell's Theorem in Section 2, was performed in the early 1980s with cascade photons from laser-excited calcium atoms by Aspect, Grangier, and Roger (1982). The outcome confirmed the predictions of quantum mechanics over those of local realistic theories more dramatically than any of its predecessors — with the experimental result deviating from the upper limit in a Bell's Inequality by 40 sd. An experiment soon afterwards by Aspect, Dalibard, and Roger (1982), which aimed at closing the communication loophole, will be discussed in Section 5. The historical article by Aspect (1992) reviews these experiments and also surveys experiments performed by Shih and Alley, by Ou and Mandel, by Rarity and Tapster, and by others, using photon pairs with correlated linear momenta produced by down-conversion in non-linear crystals. Some even more recent Bell tests are reported in an article on experiments and the foundations of quantum physics by Zeilinger (1999).

Pairs of photons have been the most common physical systems in Bell tests because they are relatively easy to produce and analyze, but there have been experiments using other systems. Lamehi-Rachti and Mittig (1976) measured spin correlations in proton pairs prepared by low-energy scattering. Their results agreed well with the quantum mechanical prediction and violated Bell's Inequality, but strong auxiliary assumptions had to be made like those in the positronium annihilation experiments. In 2003 a Bell test was performed at CERN by A. Go (Go 2003) with B-mesons, and again the results favored the quantum mechanical predictions.

The outcomes of the Bell tests provide dramatic confirmations of the prima facie entanglement of many quantum states of systems consisting of 2 or more constituents, and hence of the existence of holism in physics at a fundamental level. Actually, the first confirmation of entanglement and holism antedated Bell's work, since Bohm and Aharonov (1957) demonstrated that the results of Wu and Shaknov (1950), Compton scattering of the photon pairs produced in positronium annihilation, already showed the entanglement of the photon pairs.

## 4. The Detection Loophole and its Remedy

The summary in Section 3 of the pioneering experiment by Freedman and Clauser noted that their symmetry assumptions, Eqs. (28), (29), and (30), are susceptible to experimental check, and furthermore could have been dispensed with by measuring the detection rates with additional orientations of the analyzers. The fair sampling assumption, on the other hand, is essential in all the optical Bell tests performed so far for linking the results of polarization or direction analysis, which are not directly observable, with detection rates, which are observable. The absence of an experimental confirmation of the fair sampling assumption, together with the difficulty of testing Bell's Inequality without this assumption or another one equally remote from confirmation is known as the “detection loophole” in the refutation of Local Realistic Theories, and is the source of skepticism about the definitiveness of the experiments.

The seriousness of the detection loophole was increased by a model of Clauser and Horne (CH) (1974), in which the rates at which the photon pairs pass through the polarization analyzers with various orientations are consistent with an Inequality of Bell's type, but the hidden variables provide instructions to the photons and the apparatus not only regarding passage through the analyzers but also regarding detection, thereby violating the fair sampling assumption. Detection or non-detection is selective in the model in such a way that the detection rates violate the Bell-type Inequality and agree with the quantum mechanical predictions. Other models were constructed later by Fine (1982a) and corrected by Maudlin (1994) (the “Prism Model”) and by C.H.Thompson (1996) (the “Chaotic Ball model”). Although all these models are ad hoc and lack physical plausibility, they constitute existence proofs that Local Realistic Theories can be consistent with the quantum mechanical predictions provided that the detectors are properly selective. The detection loophole could in principle be blocked by a test of the BCHSH Inequality provided that the detectors for the 1 and 2 particles were sufficiently efficient and that there were a reliable way of determining how many pairs impinge upon the analyzer-detector assemblies. The first of these conditions can very likely be fulfilled if atoms from the dissociation of dimers are used as the particle pairs, as in the proposed experiment of Fry and Walther (Fry & Walther 1997, 2002, Walther & Fry 1997), to be discussed below, but the second condition does not at present seem feasible. Consequently a different strategy is needed.

Tools which are promising for blocking the detection loophole are two Inequalities derived by CH (Clauser & Horne 1974), henceforth called BCH Inequalities. Both differ from the BCHSH Inequality of Section 2 by involving ratios of probabilities. The two BCH Inequalities differ from each other in two respects: the first involves not only the probabilities of coincident counting of the 1 and 2 systems but also probabilities of single counting of 1 and 2 without reference to the other, and it makes no auxiliary assumption regarding the dependence of detection upon the placement of the analyzer; the second involves only probabilities of coincident detection and uses a weak, but still non-trivial, auxiliary assumption called “no enhancement.”

The experiment proposed by Fry and Walther intends to make use of the first BCH Inequality, dispensing with auxiliary assumptions, but the second BCH Inequality will also be reviewed here, because of its indispensability in case the optimism of Fry and Walther regarding the achievability of certain desirable experimental conditions turns out to be disappointed.

The conceptual framework of both BCH Inequalities takes an
analyzer/detector assembly as a unit, instead of considering the
separate operation of two parts, and it places only one
analyzer/detector assembly in the 1 arm and one in the 2 arm of the
experiment; in other words, for both analyzers I and II the two exit
channels are detection and non-detection. Let *N* be the number
of pairs of systems impinging on the two analyzer/detector assemblies,
*N*^{1}(a) the number detected by 1's analyzer/detector
assembly, *N*^{2}(b) the number detected by 2's
analyzer/detector assembly, and
*N*_{12}(*a*,*b* ) the number of
pairs detected by both, where *a* and *b* are the
respective settings of the analyzers. Let *N*^{1}
(*m*,*a* ),
*N*^{2}(*m*,*b* ), and
*N*_{12}(*m*,*a*,*b* ) be
the corresponding quantities predicted by the Local Realistic Theory
with complete state *m*. Then the respective probabilities of
detection by the analyzer/detector assemblies for 1 and 2 separately
and by both together predicted by the local realistic theory with
complete state *m* are

(36a)

p^{1}(m,a) =N^{1}(m,a)/N,(36b)

p^{2}(m,b) =N^{2}(m,b)/N(36c)

p(m,a,b) =N_{12}(m,a,b)/N.

Note that the total number *N* of pairs appears in the
denominators on the right hand side, but the difficulty of determining
this quantity experimentally is circumvented by CH, who derive an
inequality concerning the ratios of the probabilities in Eqs.
(36a,b,c), so that the denominator *N* cancels. The analogues of
the Independence Conditions of (8a,b) and (9a,b) are taken as part of
the conceptual framework of a Local Realistic Theory, which implies the
factorization of
*p*(*m*,*a*,*b* ):

(37)p(m,a,b) =p^{1}(m,a)p^{2}(m,b).

CH then prove a lemma similar to the lemma in
Section 2
: if *q*,*q*′ are real numbers such that
*q* and *q*′ fall in the closed interval
[0,*X*], and *r*,*r*′,are real numbers such
that *r* and *r*′ fall in the closed interval
[0,*Y*], then

(38) −1 ≤qr+qr′ +q′r−q′r′ −qY−rX≤ 0.

Then making the substitution

(39)q=p^{1}(m,a),q′ =p^{1}(m,a′),r=p^{2}(m,b),r′ =p^{2}(m,b′),

and using Eq. (37) we have

(40) −1 ≤p(m,a,b) +p(m,a,b′) +p(m,a′,b) −p(m,a′,b′) −p^{1}(m,a)Y−p^{2}(m,b)X≤ 0.

When the Local Realistic Theory describes an ensemble of pairs by a
probability distribution ρ over the space of complete states
*M* then the probabilities corresponding to those of (36a,b,c)
are

(41a)p_{ρ}^{1}(a) = ∫_{M}p^{1}(m,a)dρ,

(41b)p_{ρ}^{2}(b) = ∫_{M}p^{2}(m,b)dρ,

(41c)p_{ρ}(a,b) = ∫_{M}p(m,a,b)dρ,

and when *X* and *Y* are taken to be 1, as they
certainly can be from general properties of probability distributions,
then

(42) −1 ≤p_{ρ}(a,b) +p_{ρ}(a,b′) +p_{ρ}(a′,b) −p_{ρ}(a′,b′) −p_{ρ}^{1}(a) −p_{ρ}^{2}(b) ≤ 0 ,

Since CH are seeking an Inequality involving only the ratios of probabilities they disregard the lower limit and rewrite the right hand Inequality as

(43) [p_{ρ}(a,b) +p_{ρ}(a,b′) +p_{ρ}(a′,b) −p_{ρ}(a′,b′)]/[p_{ ρ}^{1}(a) +p_{ρ}^{2}(b)] ≤ 1.

This is the first BCH Inequality. In principle this Inequality could
be used to adjudicate between the family of Local Realistic Theories
and Quantum Mechanics, provided that the detectors are sufficiently
efficient and also provided that the single detection counts are not
spoiled by counting systems that do not belong to the pairs in the
ensemble of interest. In experiments using photon pairs from a cascade,
as most of the early Bell tests were, it can happen that the second
transition occurs without the first step in the cascade, thus producing
a single photon without a partner. To cope with this difficulty CH make
the “no enhancement assumption”, which is considerably
weaker than the “fair sampling” assumption used in
Section 3:
*that if an analyzer is removed from the
path of either 1 or 2 — an operation designated symbolically by
letting ∞ replace the parameter a or b of the respective analyzer
— the resulting probability of detection is at least as great as
when a finite parameter is used, i.e.*,

(44a)

p^{1}(m,a) ≤p^{1}(m,∞),(44b)

p^{2}(m,b) ≤p^{2}(m,∞)

Now let the right hand side of (44a) be *X* and the right
hand side of (44b) be *Y* and insert these values into
Inequality (40), and furthermore use Eq. (37) twice to obtain

(45) −1 ≤p(m,a,b) +p(m,a,b′) +p(m,a′,b) −p(m,a′,b′) −p^{1}(m,a,∞) −p^{2}(m,∞,b) ≤ 0.

Integrate Inequality (45) using the distribution ρ and then retain only the right hand Inequality in order to obtain an expression involving ratios only of probabilities of joint detections:

(46) [p_{ρ}(a,b) +p_{ρ}(a,b′) +p_{ρ}(a′,b) −p_{ρ}(a′,b′)] / [p_{ρ}(a,∞) +p_{ρ}(∞,b)] ≤ 1

This is the second BCH Inequality.

In the experiment initiated by Fry and Walther (1997), but not yet
complete, dimers of ^{199}Hg are generated in a supersonic jet
expansion and then photo-dissociated by two photons from appropriate
laser beams. Each ^{199}Hg atom has nuclear spin ½, and
the total spin *F* (electronic plus nuclear) of the dimer is 0
because of the symmetry rules for the total wave function of a
homonuclear diatomic molecule consisting of two fermions. (The argument
for this conclusion is fairly intricate but well presented in Walther
and Fry 1997). Because the dissociation is a two-body process, momentum
conservation guarantees that the directions of the two atoms after
dissociation are strictly correlated, so that when the two
analyzer/detector assemblies are optimally placed the entrance of one
^{199}Hg atom into its analyzer/detector will almost certainly
be accompanied by the entrance of the other atom into its assembly; the
primary reason for the occasional failure of this coordination is the
non-zero volume of the region in which the dissociation occurs. Since
each of the ^{199}Hg atoms (with 80 electrons) is in the
electronic ground state it will have zero electronic spin, and
therefore the total spin *F* of each atom (which then equals its
nuclear spin ½) will be *F* = ½. Given any choice
of an axis, the only possible values of the magnetic quantum number
*F*_{M} relative to this axis are
*F*_{M}=½ and −½. The directions
of this axis, θ_{1} for atom 1 and θ_{2}
for atom 2, are the quantities to be used for the parameters *a*
and *b* in the BCH Inequalities. The angles θ_{1}
and θ_{2} are physically fixed by the directions of two
left-circularly polarized 253.7 nm laser beams propagating in parallel
planes each perpendicular to the plane in which the atoms 1 and 2
travel from the dissociation region. See Figure 2:

Figure 2

(reprinted with permission)

This is a schematic of the experiment showing the direction of the mercury dimer beam, together with a pair of the dissociated atoms and their respective detection planes. The relative directions of the various laser beams are also shown.

The left-circular polarization ensures that if a photon is absorbed
by atom 1 then *F*_{M} of atom 1 will decrease
by one, which is possible only if *F*_{M} is
initially ½, and likewise for absorption by atom 2. Thus each
laser beam is selective and acts as an analyzer by taking only an
*F*_{M}=½ atom, 1 or 2 as the case may
be, into a specific excited state. Detection is achieved in several
steps. The first step is the impingement on atom 1 of a 197.3 nm laser
beam, timed to arrive within the lifetime of the excited state produced
by the 253.7 nm laser beam; absorption of a photon from this beam by 1
will cause ionization (and likewise an excited 2 is ionized). The
second step is the detection of either the resulting ion or the
associated photoelectron or both — the detection being a highly
efficient process, since both of these products of ionization are
charged. The first BCH Inequality predicts that the coincident
detection rates and the single detection rates in this experiment
satisfy

(47) [D(θ_{1}, θ_{2}) +D(θ_{1}, θ′_{2}) +D(θ′_{1}, θ_{2}) −D(θ′_{1}, θ′_{2})] / [D^{1}(θ_{1}) +D^{2}(θ_{2})] ≤ 1.

Fry and Walther calculate that with proper choices of the four
angles, large enough values of detector efficiencies, large enough
probability of 1 entering the region of analysis, large enough
probability of 2 entering its region of analysis conditional upon 1
doing so, and small enough probability of mistaken analysis (e.g.,
mistaking an *F*_{M} = −½ for an
*F*_{M} = ½ because of rare processes)
the quantum mechanical predictions will violate (47). If these
predictions are fulfilled, no auxiliary assumption like “no
enhancement” will be needed to disprove Inequality (43)
experimentally. The detection loophole in the refutation of the family
of Local Realistic Theories will thereby be closed. Fry and Walther
express some warning, however, against excessive optimism about
detecting a sufficiently large percentage of the ions and the electrons
produced by the ionization of the Hg atoms, together with a low rate of
errors due to background or noise counts: “the Hg partial
pressure, as well as the partial pressure of all other residual gases,
must be kept as low as possible. An ultra high vacuum of better than
10^{-9} Torr is required and the detector must be cooled to
liquid nitrogen temperatures to freeze out background Hg atoms…
Equally important is the suppression of photoelectrons produced by
scattered photons.” (Fry & Walther 1997, p. 67). If these
desiderata are not achieved, it would be necessary to resort to BCH's
second Inequality, which required the ”no enhancement”
assumption.

## 5. The Communication Loophole and its Remedy

The derivations of all the variants of Bell's Inequality depend upon the two Independence Conditions (8a,b) and (9a,b). Experimental data that disagree with a Bell's Inequality are not a refutation unless these Conditions are satisfied by the experimental arrangement. In the early tests of Bell's Inequalities it was plausible that these Conditions were satisfied just because the 1 and the 2 arms of experiment were spatially well separated in the laboratory frame of reference. This satisfaction, however, is a mere contingency not guaranteed by any law of physics, and hence it is physically possible that the setting of the analyzer of 1 and its detection or non-detection could influence the outcome of analysis and the detection or non-detection of 2, and conversely. This is the “communication loophole” in the early Bell tests. If the process of analysis and detection of 1 were an event with space-like separation from the event consisting of the analysis and detection of 2 then the satisfaction of the Independence Conditions would be a consequence of the Special Theory of Relativity, according to which no causal influences can propagate with a velocity greater than the velocity of light in vacuo. Several experiments of increasing sophistication between 1982 and the present have attempted to block the Communication Loophole in this way.

Aspect, Dalibard, and Roger (1982) published the results of an
experiment in which the choices of the orientations of the analyzers of
photons 1 and 2 were performed so rapidly that they were events with
space-like separation. No physical modification was made of the
analyzers themselves. Instead, switches consisting of vials of water in
which standing waves were excited ultrasonically were placed in the
paths of the photons 1 and 2. When the wave is switched off, the photon
propagates in the zeroth order of diffraction to polarization analyzers
respectively oriented at angles *a* and *b*, and when it
is switched on the photons propagate in the first order of diffraction
to polarization analyzers respectively oriented at angles
*a*′ and *b*′. The complete choices of
orientation require time intervals 6.7 ns and 13.37 ns respectively,
much smaller than the 43 ns required for a signal to travel between the
switches in obedience to Special Relativity Theory. Prima facie it is
reasonable that the Independence Conditions are satisfied, and
therefore that the coincidence counting rates agreeing with the quantum
mechanical predictions constitute a refutation of Bell's Inequality and
hence of the family of Local Realistic Theories. There are, however,
several imperfections in the experiment. First of all, the choices of
orientations of the analyzers are not random, but are governed by
quasiperiodic establishment and removal of the standing acoustical
waves in each switch. A scenario can be invented according to which the
clever hidden variables of each analyzer can inductively infer the
choice made by the switch controlling the other analyzer and adjust
accordingly its decision to transmit or to block an incident photon.
Also coincident count technology is employed for detecting joint
transmission of 1 and 2 through their respective analyzers, and this
technology establishes an electronic link which could influence
detection rates. And because of the finite size of the apertures of the
switches there is a spread of the angles of incidence about the Bragg
angles, resulting in a loss of control of the directions of a
non-negligible percentage of the outgoing photons.

The experiment of Tittel, Brendel, Zbinden, and Gisin (1998) did not directly address the communication loophole but threw some light indirectly on this question and also provided the most dramatic evidence so far concerning the maintenance of entanglement between particles of a pair that are well separated. Pairs of photons were generated in Geneva and transmitted via cables with very small probability per unit length of losing the photons to two analyzing stations in suburbs of Geneva, located 10.9 kilometers apart on a great circle. The counting rates agreed well with the predictions of Quantum Mechanics and violated one of Bell's Inequalities. No precautions were taken to ensure that the choices of orientations of the two analyzers were events with space-like separation. The great distance between the two analyzing stations makes it difficult to conceive a plausible scenario for a conspiracy that would violate Bell's Independence Conditions. Furthermore — and this is the feature which seems most to have captured the imagination of physicists — this experiment achieved much greater separation of the analyzers than ever before, thereby providing the best reply to date to a conjecture by Schrödinger (1935) that entanglement is a property that may dwindle with spatial separation.

The experiment that comes closest so far to closing the Communication Loophole is that of Weihs, Jennenwein, Simon, Weinfurter, and Zeilinger (1998). The pairs of systems used to test a Bell's Inequality are photon pairs in the entangled polarization state

(48) |Ψ> = 1/√2 (|H>_{1}|V>_{2}− |V>_{1}|H>_{2}),

where the ket |*H*> represents horizontal polarization and
|*V*> represents vertical polarization. Each photon pair is
produced from a photon of a laser beam by the down-conversion process
in a nonlinear crystal. The momenta, and therefore the directions, of
the daughter photons are strictly correlated, which ensures that a
non-negligible proportion of the pairs jointly enter the apertures
(very small) of two optical fibers, as was also achieved in the
experiment of Tittel et al. The two stations to which the photon pairs
are delivered are 400 m apart, a distance which light in vacuo
traverses in 1.3 μs. Each photon emerging from an optical fiber
enters a fixed two-channel polarizer (i.e., its exit channels are the
ordinary ray and the extraordinary ray). Upstream from each polarizer
is an electro-optic modulator, which causes a rotation of the
polarization of a traversing photon by an angle proportional to the
voltage applied to the modulator. Each modulator is controlled by
amplification from a very rapid generator, which randomly causes one
of two rotations of the polarization of the traversing photon. An
essential feature of the experimental arrangement is that the
generators applied to photons 1 and 2 are electronically independent.
The rotations of the polarizations of 1 and 2 are effectively the same
as randomly and rapidly rotating the polarizer entered by 1 between
two possible orientations *a* and *a*′ and the
polarizer entered by 2 between two possible orientations *b*
and *b*′. The output from each of the two exit channels
of each polarizer goes to a separate detector, and a “time
tag” is attached to each detected photon by means of an atomic
clock. Coincidence counting is done after all the detections are
collected by comparing the time tags and retaining for the
experimental statistics only those pairs whose tags are sufficiently
close to each other to indicate a common origin in a single
down-conversion process. Accidental coincidences will also enter, but
these are calculated to be relatively infrequent. This procedure of
coincidence counting eliminates the electronic connection between the
detector of 1 and the detector of 2 while detection is taking place,
which conceivably could cause an error-generating transfer of
information between the two stations. The total time for all the
electronic and optical processes in the path of each photon, including
the random generator, the electro-optic modulator, and the detector,
is conservatively calculated to be smaller than 100 ns, which is much
less than the 1.3 μs required for a light signal between the two
stations. With the choice made in Eq. (22) of the
angles *a*, *a*′,
*b*, and *b*′ and with imperfections in the
detectors taken into account, the Quantum Mechanical prediction is

(49)S_{ψ}≡E_{ψ}(a,b) +E_{ψ}(a,b′) +E_{ψ}(a′,b) −E_{ψ}(a′,b′) = 2.82,

which is 0.82 greater than the upper limit allowed by the BCHSH Ineq. (16). The experimental result in the experiment of Weihs et al. is 2.73 +/- 0.02, in good agreement with the Quantum Mechanical prediction of Eq. (49), and it is 30 sd away from the upper limit of Ineq. (16). Aspect, who designed the first experimental test of a Bell Inequality with rapidly switched analyzers (Aspect, Dalibard, Roger 1982) appreciatively summarized the import of this result:

I suggest we take the point of view of an external observer, who collects the data from the two distant stations at the end of the experiment, and compares the two series of results. This is what the Innsbruck team has done. Looking at the data a posteriori, they found that the correlation immediately changed as soon as one of the polarizers was switched, without any delay allowing for signal propagation: this reflects quantum non-separability. (Aspect 1999)

The experiment of Weihs et al. does not completely block the detection loophole, and even if the experiment proposed by Fry and Walther is successfully completed, it will still be the case that the detection loophole and the communication loophole will have been blocked in two different experiments. It is therefore conceivable — though with difficulty, in the subjective judgment of the present writer — that both experiments are erroneous, because Nature took advantage of a separate loophole in each case. For this reason Fry and Walther suggest that their experiment using dissociated mercury dimers can in principle be refined by using electro-optic modulators (EOM), so as to block both loopholes: “Specifically, the EOM together with a beam splitting polarizer can, in a couple of nanoseconds, change the propagation direction of the excitation laser beam and hence the component of nuclear spin angular momentum being observed. A separation between our detectors of approximately 12 m will be necessary in order to close the locality loophole” (Fry & Walther 2002) [See Fig. 2 and also note that “locality loophole” is their term for the communication loophole.]

In the face of the spectacular experimental achievement of Weihs et al. and the anticipated result of the experiment of Fry and Walther there is little that a determined advocate of local realistic theories can say except that, despite the spacelike separation of the analysis-detection events involving particles 1 and 2, the backward light-cones of these two events overlap, and it is conceivable that some controlling factor in the overlap region is responsible for a conspiracy affecting their outcomes. There is so little physical detail in this supposition that a discussion of it is best delayed until a methodological discussion in Section 7.

## 6. Some Variants of Bell's Theorem

This section will discuss in some detail two variants of Bell's
Theorem which depart in some respect from the conceptual framework
presented in
Section 2.
Both are less general than the
version in
Section 2,
because they apply only to a
deterministic local realistic theory — that is a theory in which
a complete state *m* assigns only probabilities 1 or 0
(‘yes’ or ‘no’) to the outcomes of the
experimental tests performed on the systems of interest. By contrast,
the Local Realistic Theories studied in
Section 2
are
allowed to be stochastic, in the sense that a complete state can assign
other probabilities between 0 and 1 to the possible outcomes. At the
end of the section two other variants will be mentioned briefly but not
summarized in detail.

The first variant is due independently to Kochen and Specker (1967), Heywood and Redhead (1983), and Stairs (1983). Its ensemble of interest consists pairs of spin-1 particles in the entangled state

(50) |Φ> = 1/√3 [ |z,1>_{1}|z,−1>_{2}− |z,0>_{1}|z,0>_{2}+ |z,−1>_{1}|z,1>_{2}],

where |*z*,*i*>_{1}, with *i* =
−1 or 0 or 1 is the spin state of particle 1 with component of
spin *i* along the axis *z*, and
|*z*,*i*>_{2} has an analogous meaning for
particle 2. If *x*,*y*,*z* is a triple of
orthogonal axes in 3-space then the components
*s*_{x}, *s*_{y},
*s*_{z} of the spin operator along these axes
do not pairwise commute; but it is a peculiarity of the spin-1 system
that the squares of these operators —
*s*_{x}^{2},
*s*_{y}^{2},
*s*_{z}^{2} — do commute, and
therefore, in view of the considerations of
Section 1,
any two of them can constitute a context in the measurement of the
third. If the operator of interest is
*s*_{z}^{2}, the axes *x* and
*y* can be any pair of orthogonal axes in the plane
perpendicular to *z*, thus offering an infinite family of
contexts for the measurement of
*s*_{z}^{2}. As noted in
Section 1
Bell exhibited the possibility of a
*contextual* hidden variables theory for a quantum system whose
Hilbert space has dimension 3 or greater even though the
Bell-Kochen-Specker theorem showed the impossibility of a
*non-contextual* hidden variables theory for such a system. The
strategy of Kochen and of Heywood-Redhead is to use the entangled state
of Eq. (50) to predict the outcome of measuring
*s*_{z}^{2} for particle 2 (for any
choice of *z* ) by measuring its counterpart on particle
1. A specific complete state *m* would determine whether
*s*_{z}^{2} of 1, measured together
with a context in 1, is 0 or 1. Agreement with the quantum mechanical
prediction of the entangled state of Eq. (50) implies that
*s*_{z}^{2} of 2 has the same value 0
or 1. But if the Locality Conditions (8a,b) and (9a,b) are assumed,
then the result of measuring
*s*_{z}^{2} on 2 must be independent of
the remote context, that is, independent of the choice of
*s*_{x}^{2} and
*s*_{y}^{2} of 1, hence of 2 because of
correlation, for any pair of orthogonal directions *x* and
*y* in the plane perpendicular to *z*. It follows that
the Local Realistic Theory which supplies the complete state *m*
is not contextual after all, but maps the set of operators
*s*_{z}^{2} of 2, for any direction
*z*, *noncontextually* into the pair of values (0, 1).
But that is impossible in view of the Bell-Kochen-Specker theorem. The
conclusion is that no deterministic Local Realistic Theory is
consistent with the Quantum Mechanical predictions of the entangled
state (50). An alternative proof is thus provided for an important
special case of Bell's theorem, which was the case dealt with in Bell's
pioneering paper of 1964: that no deterministic local realistic theory
can agree with all the predictions of quantum mechanics. An objection
may be raised that *s*_{z}^{2} of 1 is
in fact measured together with only a single context — e.g.,
*s*_{x}^{2} and
*s*_{y}^{2} — while other
contexts are not measured, and “unperformed experiments have no
results” (a famous remark of Peres 1978). It may be that this
remark is a correct epitome of the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum
mechanics, but it certainly is not a valid statement in a deterministic
version of a Local Realistic interpretation of Quantum Mechanics,
because a deterministic complete state is just what is needed as the
ground for a valid counterfactual conditional. We have good evidence to
this effect in classical physics: for example, the charge of a
particle, which is a quantity inferred from the actual acceleration of
the particle when it is subjected to an actual electric field, provides
in conjunction with a well-confirmed force law the basis for a
counterfactual proposition about the acceleration of the particle if it
were subjected to an electric field different from the actual one.

A simpler proof of Bell's Theorem, also relying upon counterfactual
reasoning and based upon a deterministic local realistic theory, is
that of Hardy (1993), here presented in Laloë's (2001)
formulation. Consider an ensemble of pairs 1 and 2 of spin-½
particles, the spin of 1 measured along directions in the
*xz*-plane making angles *a*=θ/2 and
*a*′=0 with the *z*-axis, and angles *b* and
*b*′ having analogous significance for 2. The quantum
states for particle 1 with spins +½ and −½
relative to direction *a*′ are respectively
|*a*′,+>_{1} and
|*a*′,−>_{1}, and relative to direction
*a* are respectively

(51a) |a,+>_{1}= cosθ|a′,+>_{1}+ sinθ|a′,−>_{1}

and

(51b) |a,−>_{1}= -sinθ|a′,+>_{1}+ cosθ|a′,−>_{1};

the spin states for 2 are analogous. The ensemble of interest is prepared in the entangled quantum state

(52) |Ψ> = -cosθ|a′,+>_{1}|b′,−>_{2}− cosθ|a′,−>_{1}|b′,+>_{2}+ sinθ|a′,+>_{1}|b′,+>_{2}

(unnormalized, because normalization is not needed for the following
argument). Then for the specified *a*, *a*′,
*b*, and *b*′ the following quantum mechanical
predictions hold:

(53) <Ψ|a,+>_{1}|b′,+>_{2}= 0;

(54) <Ψ|a′,+>_{1}|b,+>_{2}= 0 ;

(55) <Ψ|a′,−>_{1}|b′,−>_{2}= 0;

and for almost all values of the θ of Eq. (52)

(56) <Ψ|a,+>_{1}|b,+>_{2}≠ 0 ,

with the maximum occurring around θ = 9^{o}.
Inequality (56) asserts that for the specified angles there is a
non-empty subensemble E′ of pairs for which the results for a
spin measurement along *a* for 1 and along *b* for 2 are
both +. Eq. (53) implies the counterfactual proposition that if the
spin of a 2 in E′ had been measured along *b*′ then
with certainty the result would have been −; and likewise Eq. (54)
implies the counterfactual proposition that if the spin of a 1 in
E′ had been measured along *a*′ then with certainty
the result would have been −. It is in this step that counterfactual
reasoning is used in the argument, and, as in the argument of
Kochen-Heywood-Redhead-Stairs in the previous paragraph, the reasoning
is based upon the deterministic Local Realistic Theory. Since the
subensemble E′ is non-empty, we have reached a contradiction with
Eq. (55), which asserts that if the spin of 1 is measured along
*a*′ and that of 2 is measured along *b*′
then it is impossible that both results are −. The
incompatibility of a deterministic Local Realistic Theory with Quantum
Mechanics is thereby demonstrated.

An attempt was made by Stapp (1997) to demonstrate a strengthened version of Bell's theorem which dispenses with the conceptual framework of a Local Realistic Theory and to use instead the logic of counterfactual conditionals. His intricate argument has been the subject of a criticism by Shimony and Stein (2001, 2003), who are critical of certain counterfactual conditionals that are asserted by Stapp by means of a “possible worlds” analysis without a grounding on a deterministic Local Realistic Theory, and a response by Stapp (2001) himself, who defends his argument with some modifications.

The three variants of Bell's Theorem considered so far in this
section concern ensembles of pairs of particles. An entirely new domain
of variants is opened by studying ensembles of *n*-tuples of
particles with *n*≥3. The prototype of this kind of theorem
was demonstrated by Greenberger, Horne, and Zeilinger (1989) (GHZ) for
*n*=4 and modified to *n*=3 by Mermin (1990) and by
Greenberger, Horne, Shimony, and Zeilinger (1990) (GHSZ). In the
theorem of GHZ an entangled quantum state was written for four spin
½ particles and the expectation value of the product of certain
binary measurements performed on the individual particles was
calculated. They then showed that the attempt to duplicate this
expectation value subject to the constraints of a Local Realistic
Theory produces a contradiction. A similar result was obtained by
Mermin for a state of 3 spin-½ particles and by GHSZ for a state
of 3 photons entangled in direction. Because of the length of these
arguments and limitations of space in the present article the details
will not be summarized here. Furthermore, for the philosophically
crucial purpose of demonstrating experimentally the validity of Quantum
Mechanical predictions and the violation of the corresponding
predictions of Local Realistic Theories the examples using pairs of
particles in
Section 3
are more promising than
*n*-tuple experiments with *n*≥3. In particular, it is
evident that the detection loophole is more difficult to block in an
experiment performed with *n*-tuples of particles,
*n*≥3 , than in an experiment using pairs, because the net
efficiency of detecting *n*-tuples is proportional to the
product of the efficiencies of the detectors of the individual
particles.

## 7. Philosophical Comments

Two different classes of philosophical questions are raised by reflection upon the theoretical and experimental investigations concerning Bell's Theorem. Questions of one class are logical and methodological: whether one can legitimately infer from these investigations that quantum mechanics is non-local, and whether the experimental data definitively prove that Bell's Inequalities are violated. Questions of the other class are metaphysical: upon assumption that the logical and methodological questions are answered positively, what conclusions can be drawn about the structure and constitution of the physical world, in particular is nature non-local despite the remarkable success of relativity theory?

A logical question has been raised by Fine. In a paper (Fine 1999), which analyzes the construction of Hardy discussed in Section 6, Fine concludes with a philosophical thesis: “That means that the Hardy theorem, like other variants on Bell, is not a ‘proof of nonlocality’. It is a proof that locality cannot be married to the assignment of determinate values in the recommended way. That is interesting and significant. It is not, however, a demonstration that quantum mechanics is nonlocal, much less (as some proclaim) that nature is.” Fine's analysis of Hardy's construction relies upon his earlier paper (Fine 1982b) which contains the following theorem (which is a combination of his Theorem 4, p. 1309, and footnote 5 on p. 1310):

For a correlation experiment with observablesA_{1},A_{2},B_{1},B_{2}and with exactly the four pairsA,_{i}B(_{j}i= 1,2;j= 1,2) commuting, the following statements are equivalent: (I) the Bell/CH inequalities hold for the single and double probabilities of the experiment; (II) there is a joint distributionP(A_{1},A_{2},B_{ 1},B_{2}) compatible with the observed single and double distributions; (III) there is a deterministic hidden variables theory forA_{1},A_{2},B_{1},B_{2}returning the observed single and double distributions; (IV) there is a well-defined joint distribution (for the noncommuting pairsB_{1},B_{2}) and joint distributionsP(A_{1},B_{1},B_{ 2}),each of the latter compatible withB_{1},B_{2}and with the observed single and double distributions; (V) there exists a factorizable (so-called “local”) stochastic hidden variables theory forA_{1},A_{2},B_{1},B_{2}returning the observed single and double distributions.^{[3]}

Proposition (I) is the one of the five propositions in this theorem
which is amenable to direct experimental confirmation or
disconfirmation. I shall accept for the present the experimental
disconfirmation of some of these Inequalities, leaving a consideration
of methodological doubts about this disconfirmation for discussion
below. With this proviso it follows that each of the propositions (II),
(III), (IV), and (V) is disconfirmed by modus tollens. The
disconfirmation of (V) logically implies the falsity of the conjunction
of all the premisses from which the Bell/CH (called “BCH”
in
Section 4)
Inequalities are inferred: namely, the
assumptions (5), (6), and (7) in
Section 2
about the
existence of well-defined single and double probabilities, and the
Independence Conditions (8a,b) and (9a,b), respectively called
“Remote Outcome Independence” and “Remote Context
Independence.” Usually the assumptions (5), (6), and (7) are not
doubted, for two reasons: first, they are implicit in the pervasive
assumption in hidden-variables investigations that the phenomenological
assertions of quantum mechanics are correct — an assumption which
even permits us to use the concept of a “complete state”,
denoted by *m*, which is the quantum state itself if there are
no hidden variables, or the complete specification of the hidden
variables if such entities exist; second, there is overwhelming
experimental confirmation of these assumptions by the practical success
of quantum mechanics, not just in experimentation regarding
hidden-variables hypotheses. (In spite of these weighty considerations
there is one important program which attempts to weaken or replace
assumptions (5), (6), and (7), namely that of Stapp, briefly discussed
in
Section 6.)
Consequently, the falsity of the
conjunction of the premisses from which the BCH Inequality is derived
implies the falsity of one or both of the Independence Conditions
(8a,b) and (9a,b). Since the failure of either of these Conditions is
prima facie in contradiction with relativistic locality, it is not
important for the present concern to investigate which of the two
Independence Conditions is weaker — a question that will be taken
up later in
Section 7.
The conclusion at this stage in
the argument, when propositions (II), (III), and (IV) of Fine's theorem
have been neglected, is that the experimental disconfirmation of the
BCH Inequalities does imply the occurrence of non-locality in natural
phenomena and since the quantum mechanical analysis of pairs of systems
in entangled states anticipates non-local phenomena, quantum mechanics
itself is a a non-local theory. This pair of conclusions is what Fine
claims, in the passage from (Fine 1999) quoted above, has not been
demonstrated. What he allows, in virtue of his theorem is the weaker
conclusion that “locality cannot be married to the assignment of
determinate values in the recommended way.”

But is this retrenchment to a weaker conclusion logically justified? The strong conclusion that quantum mechanics and nature are non-local has been derived from one part of the theorem — that (V) implies (I) — together with some auxiliary analysis of premisses (5), (6), and (7). The other parts of the theorem — the equivalences of (II), (III), (IV) to each other and to (I) and (V) — provide information supplementary to that provided by the equivalence of (I) and (V), but as a matter of logic do not diminish the information given by the last equivalence.

The last resort of a dedicated adherent of local realistic theories,
influenced perhaps by Einstein's advocacy of this point of view, is to
conjecture that apparent violations of locality are the result of
conspiracy plotted in the overlap of the backward light cones of the
analysis-detection events in the 1 and 2 arms of the experiment. These
backward light cones always do overlap in the Einstein-Minkowski
space-time of Special Relativity Theory (SRT) — a framework which
can accommodate infinitely many processes besides the standard ones of
relativistic field theory. Elimination of any finite set of concrete
scenarios to account for the conspiracy leaves infinitely many more as
unexamined and indeed unarticulated possibilities. What attitude should
a reasonable scientist take towards these infinite riches of possible
scenarios? We should certainly be warned by the power of Hume's
skepticism concerning induction not to expect a solution that would be
as convincing as a deductive demonstration and not to expect that the
inductive support of induction itself can fill the gap formed by the
shortcoming of a deductive justification of induction (Hume 1748, Sect.
4). One solution to this problem is a Bayesian strategy that attempts
to navigate between dogmatism and excessive skepticism (Shimony 1993,
Shimony 1994). To avoid the latter one should keep the mind open to a
concrete and testable proposal regarding the mechanism of the suspected
conspiracy in the overlap of the backward light cones, giving such a
proposal a high enough prior probability to allow the possibility that
its posterior probability after testing will warrant acceptance. To
avoid the former one should not give the broad and unspecific proposal
that a conspiracy exists such high prior probability that the concrete
hypothesis of the correctness of Quantum Mechanics is debarred
effectively from acquiring a sufficiently high posterior probability to
warrant acceptance. This strategy actually is implicit in ordinary
scientific method. It does not guarantee that in any investigation the
scientific method is sure to find a good approximation to the truth,
but it is a procedure for following the great methodological maxim:
“Do not block the way of inquiry” (Peirce
1931).^{[4]}

A second solution, which can be used in tandem with the first, is to pursue theoretical understanding of a baffling conceptual problem that at present confronts us: that the prima facie nonlocality of Quantum Mechanics will remain a permanent part of our physical world view, in spite of its apparent tension with Relativistic locality. This solution opens the second type of philosophical questions mentioned in the initial paragraph of the present section, that is, metaphysical questions about the structure and constitution of the physical world. Among the proposals for a solution of the second kind are the following.

- The tension between Quantum Mechanical nonlocality and Relativistic
locality is not serious, and there is indeed a kind of “peaceful
coexistence” (if one philosophically modifies a famous political maxim of
Khrushchev) between the two branches of physics. It is indeed true that
the measurements in regions of space-like separation of correlated
quantities in two systems that are Quantum Mechanically entangled have
correlated outcomes that cannot be accounted for by hidden variables,
and such correlations are a kind of causality, unprecedented in
pre-quantum physics. And yet it has been shown by several investigators
(Eberhard 1978, Ghirardi, Rimini & Weber 1980, Page 1982) that this
kind of causality cannot be used to send messages superluminally
between the stations of the two measurements, which is the principal
prohibition of Relativistic locality. Bohm's nonlocal model peacefully
coexists with relativistic locality for another reason: that the width
of the effective wave function which is employed in the guidance
equation is not sufficiently controllable to ensure a desired result of
measurement of the quantity required to transmit a message. The
proposal of “peaceful coexistence” was in fact espoused at
one time by the present author (Shimony 1978, Section V), but he was
dissuaded from it by a powerful anti-anthropocentric argument of John
Bell:
Do we then have to fall back on ‘no signaling faster than light’ as the expression of the fundamental causal structure of contemporary theoretical physics? That is hard for me to accept. For one thing we have lost the idea that correlations can be explained, or at least this idea awaits reformulation. More importantly, the ‘no signaling …’ notion rests on concepts that are desperately vague, or vaguely applicable. The assertion that ‘we cannot signal faster than light’ immediately provokes the question:

Who do we think

*we*are?*We*who make ‘measurements,’*we*who can manipulate ‘external fields,’*we*who can ‘signal’ at all, even if not faster than light. Do*we*include chemists, or only physicists, plants, or only animals, pocket calculators, or only mainframe computers? (Bell 1990, Sec. 6.12) -
There may indeed be “peaceful coexistence” between Quantum nonlocality and Relativistic locality, but it may have less to do with signaling than with the ontology of the quantum state. Heisenberg's view of the mode of reality of the quantum state was briefly mentioned in Section 2 — that it is

*potentiality*as contrasted with*actuality*. This distinction is successful in making a number of features of quantum mechanics intuitively plausible — indefiniteness of properties, complementarity, indeterminacy of measurement outcomes, and objective probability. But now something can be added, at least as a conjecture: that the domain governed by Relativistic locality is the domain of actuality, while potentialities have*careers*in space-time (if that word is appropriate) which modify and even violate the restrictions that space-time structure imposes upon actual events. The peculiar kind of causality exhibited when measurements at stations with space-like separation are correlated is a symptom of the slipperiness of the space-time behavior of potentialities. This is the point of view tentatively espoused by the present writer, but admittedly without full understanding. What is crucially missing is a rational account of the relation between potentialities and actualities — just how the wave function probabilistically controls the occurrence of outcomes. In other words, a real understanding of the position tentatively espoused depends upon a solution to another great problem in the foundations of quantum mechanics − the problem of reduction of the wave packet. - Yes,
*something*is communicated superluminally when measurements are made upon systems characterized by an entangled state, but that something is*information*, and there is no Relativistic locality principle which constrains its velocity. There are many expressions of this point of view, an eloquent one being the following by Zeilinger:The quantum state is exactly that representation of our knowledge of the complete situation which enables the maximal set of (probabilistic) predictions of any possible future observation. What comes new in quantum mechanics is that, instead of just listing the various experimental possibilities with the individual probabilities, we have to represent our knowledge of the situation by the quantum state using complex amplitudes. If we accept that the quantum state is no more than a representation of the information we have, then the spontaneous change of the state upon observation, the so-called collapse or reduction of the wave packet, is just a very natural consequence of the fact that, upon observation, our information changes and therefore we have to change our representation of the information, that is, the quantum state. (1999, p. S291).

This point of view is very successful at accounting for the arbitrarily fast connection between the outcomes of correlated measurements, but it scants the objective features of the quantum state. Especially it scants the fact that

*the quantum state probabilistically controls the occurrence of actual events.* - A radical idea concerning the structure and constitution of the
physical world, which would throw new light upon quantum nonlocality,
is the conjecture of Heller and Sasin (1999) about the nature of
space-time in the very small, specifically at distances below the
Planck length (about 10
^{-33}cm). Quantum uncertainties in this domain have the consequence of making ill-defined the metric structure of General Relativity Theory. As a result, according to them, basic geometric concepts like point and neighborhood are ill-defined, and non-locality is pervasive rather than exceptional as in atomic, nuclear, and elementary particle physics. Our ordinary physics, at the level of elementary particles and above, is (in principle, though the details are obscure) recoverable as the correspondence limit of the physics below the Planck length. What is most relevant to Bell's Theorem is that the non-locality which it makes explicit in Quantum Mechanics is a small indication of pervasive ultramicroscopic nonlocality. If this conjecture is taken seriously, then the baffling tension between Quantum nonlocality and Relativistic locality is a clue to physics in the small. Regrettably we not longer have John Bell, with his incomparable analytic powers, to comment on this radical proposal.

## Appendix

Although the main result of Bell [1964] is his theorem
demonstrating the impossibility of recovering the statistical
predictions of quantum mechanics with a local realistic theory,
Section 3 of this paper concludes with the construction of a nonlocal
model — violating Remote Context Independence but not Remote
Outcome Independence-- which does recover the statistical predictions
of a particular entangled quantum state. Recently several
investigators have investigated the resources of nonlocal realistic
theories and have demonstrated that certain important subclasses of
nonlocal theories are also incompatible with certain statistical
predictions of quantum mechanics. Particularly interesting are Leggett
[2003], Groeblacher *et al*. [2007], and Branciard *et
al*. [2008]. A conceptually important open problem is to
demonstrate necessary and sufficient conditions for a specified class
of nonlocal realistic theories to recover the statistical predictions
of an arbitrary quantum mechanical entangled state by an appropriate
choice of the space of hidden variables and of the probability
distribution over this space.

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### Acknowledgments

Valuable conversations with John Clauser and Edward Fry are gratefully
acknowledged. Springer Verlag and Alain Aspect have kindly given
permission to reproduce Figure 9.1 on p. 121 of Aspect's article,
“Bell's Theorem: the Naïve View of an
Experimentalist,” pp. 119–153 in *Quantum
[Un]speakables*, R.A. Bertlmann and A. Zeilinger (eds.),
Berlin-Heidelberg-New York: Springer Verlag, 2002; this Figure was
used as Figure 1 in the present article. Kluwer Academic Publishers
and Edward Fry have kindly given permission to reproduce Figure 2 on
p. 66 of E.S. Fry's and T. Walther's article “A Bell Inequality
Experiment Based on Molecular Dissociation — Extension of the
Lo-Shimony Proposal to ^{199}Hg (Nuclear Spin ½)
Dimers,” pp. 61–71 in *Experimental Metaphysics*,
R.S. Cohen, M. Horne, and J. Stachel (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1997;
this Figure was used as Figure 2 in the present article. Dr. Caroline
Thompson has kindly brought to my attention errors in
Eqs. (13a,b,c,d), (43), and (46).