Black Reparations

First published Tue Dec 14, 2010

Countries have long made claims at the end of wars for war reparations. But today many other kinds of claims for reparation are being made. For example indigenous peoples like the Aborigines of Australia, the Maori of New Zealand, and the Native Americans of North America demand the return of tribal lands as reparation. People in Eastern Europe who were dispossessed as a result of the attempts to establish socialism there are demanding the return of their property as reparation. And African Americans are claiming reparations for the injuries of slavery and its aftermath. Our subject is the last of these demands for reparation.

1. History

Oddly, Thomas Jefferson was one of the first to suggest making reparations to black slaves. The occasion was his infamous proposal to emancipate the slaves and then deport them from the country. Many students of Jefferson and slavery will probably be reluctant to see any suggestion for reparation in that proposal. But they should notice that Jefferson was not proposing to simply drive the freedmen out of the country. He was proposing to set them up as a “free and independent people.” His proposal therefore rests on the idea that the black slaves were a people or a nation. Since nations are entitled to a “separate & equal station” among the other powers of the earth, and must have a territory, and since Jefferson believed that the freedmen to be a people or nation, it follows that he believed that they were entitled to a “separate & equal station” among the other powers of the earth, and had a right to a territory where they could satisfy their justified desire to govern themselves without interference. Since the United States was enslaving them and thus unjustly denying them such a territory, justice demanded that it make reparation to them by perhaps among other things providing them with such a territory.

We cannot be certain of Jefferson's sincerity in this matter, but Jefferson's motives are not at issue here. It is the logic of proposal that is important. It demonstrates that the form reparation takes may depend on how the individuals it is extended to are related to each other and to others. If they are a people and have been wrongly denied self-government, then as reparation their transgressors should provide them with a territory on which to stand and to take control of their collective destiny and govern themselves.

A curiously similar case is provided by the example of the American Colonization Society founded in Richmond Virginia in 1817. Like Jefferson's proposal this society might have had at least two very different, perhaps even opposing objects. This would not be surprising given that it was founded by certain Quakers and powerful American slaveholders, for example, Henry Clay. According to the Quakers the society's object was to provide financial support to African Americans who wanted to leave America where they were subjected to crippling racial discrimination, and to go to Liberia to get a fresh start in a country free of such discrimination. Although the Quakers made no explicit appeal to the idea that African Americans were a people, they did clearly suggest that African American emigrants to Liberia would govern themselves there. Otherwise their emigration there would do them little good especially if it turned out that Liberia was controlled by white slaveholders. The Quakers' scheme was therefore dealt a deadly blow when the black nationalists, who following the logic of the idea of nationhood prized self-government above all else, were able to declare in the words of Martin Delany that Liberia was “not an independent nation at all; but a poor miserable mockery—a burlesque of a government—a pitiful dependency on the American Colonizationists” and its “principle man, called President in Liberia” was a “mere parrot” of these individuals. Consequently although Delany and the black nationalists continued to seek a territory where they could live together and govern themselves, they refused to take such a territory when it was offered to them as reparation by the people who put them in need of it. On their account, the American Colonization Society was not meant to make reparation to African Americans at all. Its object was to serve the interests of slaveholders who believed that removing free blacks from America would make their hold over their slaves more secure.

The offers of reparation made by Jefferson and the American Colonization Society help to explain why the victims of wrongdoing are often wary when the wrongdoers who harmed them offer reparations for the harms that they caused, and take the lead in discussing the forms in which their reparations should be made. Naturally people do not like to give up their advantages and tend to minimize what just reparation may demand that they part with. Sometimes indeed their offers of reparation are only subtle schemes to serve their own interests rather than to make reparation. Their victims are just as naturally aware of this and consequently would like to have their say in the nature and extent of the reparations they are going to receive.

Issues of compensation related to slavery frequently came up during the Civil War, but not in the way present day Americans would expect. The concern was not to compensate the slaves for the injuries of slavery, but to compensate the slaveholders for the anticipated loss of their slaves. One would expect these concerns to be voiced in the South when slaveholders faced the prospect of having to free their slaves, but they were also voiced in the North, and from the highest sources. President Abraham Lincoln for example repeatedly urged compensated emancipation, which meant paying the slaveholders for the loss of their slaves who would then be deported from America. Indeed at one time he appeared to be ready to propose paying the South $400,000,000, for the loss of their slaves. As W.E.B. DuBois observed drily “Lincoln was impressed by the loss of capital invested in slaves, but curiously never seemed seriously to consider the correlative loss of wage and opportunity of slave workers, the tangible results of whose exploitation had gone into the planters' pockets for two centuries.” And Lincoln did not even sugar coat his deportation proposal with the claim that the freedmen were a nation and would need a separate territory on which to govern themselves.

Proposals for Black reparations after Jefferson and the American Colonization Society were made after the war ended by Thaddeus Stevens, congressman from Pennsylvania and Charles Summer, senator from Massachusetts. Stevens took the lead. He insisted that it was not enough merely to free the slaves. Nor would it be enough, even to give the slaves the right of suffrage. In addition justice demanded that they be granted an economic foundation. But how could this economic foundation justly be obtained? Reasoning logically Stevens concluded that it should best come from the wrongdoers who had harmed the slaves through their wrongdoing and proposed accordingly that the government confiscate land from the rebels and distribute it to the slaves, each freedman getting forty acres.

Significantly unlike Lincoln he understood that justice could not countenance compensating the slaveholders for the loss of what they never could have had a right to in the first place. At first Sumner had refused to follow Stevens claiming that he was more hopeful and confident of liberation than of confiscation. Later he came to agree with Stevens that the government must see to it that the freedmen become proprietors. Somewhat surprisingly the radical ex-slave Frederick Douglass was wary of going as far as Stevens and proposed instead a more moderate scheme of a federal corporation that would purchase tracts of land and then resell or lease them on favorable terms to the freedmen. In an excellent discussion Peter C. Myers speculates that Douglass's “moderation” at this point was a “reflection of what was politically possible.” But Myers also suggests that Douglass preferred his own scheme to that of Stevens because he believed that his scheme was “more fully consistent with the principle of self-reliance” and would give “greater societal recognition of the freed people's virtue in providing for themselves.” Douglass he goes on to explain was worried that benevolent missions organized by whites might endanger the development and exercise of the freed people's virtue and foster a condition of dependence in them. And he concludes by noting that Douglass was following Jefferson in emphasizing the corrupting effects of dependence. If so, Stevens had understood Jefferson better than Douglass had, and had followed Jefferson more closely. Jefferson had indeed designated dependence as a crucial vice. It “begets subservience and venality, suffocates virtue, and prepares fit tools for the designs of ambition” he claimed. But he also claimed that the small yeoman farmer tilling his own soil was the least likely to suffer from dependence. The “small landholders” he declared “are the most precious part of the state”, and to ensure their persistence he urged that “legislators cannot invent too many devices for subdividing property.” Stevens's scheme proposed to do for the freed people exactly what Jefferson proposed doing for poor whites. And Stevens defended his scheme for the same reasons that Jefferson had defended his. He pointed out that giving the freed people land they could cultivate for themselves would make them independent of their former masters, and echoing Jefferson he declared that nothing engenders virtue and independence in citizens better than making them freeholders. Years later Douglass evidently saw the error of his moderation. Myers cites his comment in 1880 that had the counsels of Thaddeus Stevens, Charles Sumner, and “leading stalwart Republicans” prevailed, “the terrible evils from which we now suffer would have been averted,” and “the Negro today,” would be “tilling his soil in comparative independence.”

Perhaps the most noteworthy demand for Black Reparations after the Civil War occurred in 1969 when James Foreman a member of the Student Nonviolent Coordinating Committee (SNCC), read his “Black Manifesto” at the National Black Economic Development Conference, in Detroit, and later on in Riverside Church. The “Manifesto” demanded $500,000,000, in reparations from Christian white churches and Jewish synagogues, or as the “Manifesto” put it, “15 dollars per nigger.” This demand for reparation the Manifesto argued was justified because over three and a half centuries, whites with the assistance and collaboration of their churches and synagogues had unjustly, through slavery and discrimination, wrested enormous economic advantages from blacks. Although this argument relied on widely accepted moral intuitions, for example, that wrongdoers and those complicit in wrongdoing ought to make reparation to those they harmed through their wrongdoing, and on widely accepted factual claims, for example that blacks have been wrongly harmed by slavery and discrimination, the Manifesto received little popular support. It did however provoke discussion in newspapers and news magazines as well as some scholarly discussion. Boris Bittker included it as an appendix in his book The Case for Black Reparations (Bittker 1973); Hugo Bedau provided and extended analysis in his “Compensatory Justice and the Black Manifesto” (Bedau 1972); Michael Harrington and Arnold Kaufman debated its merits in “Black Reparations—Two Views” (Harrington 1969, Kaufman 1969); and a number of philosophers wrote essays inspired by its argument.

Although interest in the topic remained high among African American philosophers, until recently the wider philosophical community preoccupied with ideal theory ignored or abandoned it. Broad and very vigorous interest has only recently been rekindled. Perhaps the causes lie outside of academia; in 1988 Congress passed the Civil Liberties Act which authorized payment of reparations to Japanese American citizens who had been imprisoned during World War 11; John Conyers has in each session of Congress since 1989 introduced a bill to create a commission to study reparations for slavery and segregation; in 2000 Randall Robinson published his book The Debt: What America Owes to Blacks (Robinson 2000); and in 2003, David Horowitz published his Uncivil Wars (Horowitz 2003).

2. Reparation in general

In a famous sentence Locke declared that “Where there is no property there is no injustice,” (Locke 1690, book 4, chapter 3, section 18), suggesting perhaps that justice pertained only to rights to property in physical objects. But he did not believe that justice was concerned with only these rights for he immediately went on to say that the “idea of property” is a “right to any thing” and in the Second Treatise claimed specifically that “every Man has a Property in his own Person. This no Body has any Right to but himself. The Labour of his Body, and the Work of his Hands, we may say, are properly his” (Locke 1689, book 2, chapter 5, section 27, pp. 287–8). This suggests that for Locke justice requires the protection of individuals' rights and that the state secures distributive justice by protecting its citizens' rights.

According to Locke these rights stem ultimately from Natural Law (or the Rule of Reason) which gives every person rights to his life, body, talents, liberty, as well as a right to acquire property by mixing his labor with parts of the world that are not already owned, (if certain other conditions are satisfied). In this sense everyone starts off equal to everyone else and remains equal to everyone else—with an exception to be noted immediately. But Locke did not think that people remain equal to each other in every respect. First by committing serious crimes people can forfeit and so lose their rights to liberty and even to life. On the other hand by agreement with others or by their free consent people can acquire rights beyond those already noted. Further even if everyone remains equal in the sense of having rights to acquire property, some acquire more property than others by working harder, by gift or free exchange with others, by being more talented, and more generally by simply being luckier. Consequently if the state secures distributive justice among its members by protecting their rights, it must secure equality in one sense and may have to secure inequality in another sense. On the one hand it must secure equality in the sense that in must protect the rights that its citizens get directly from Natural Law supposing that they have not forfeited them away. On the other hand it must secure inequality in the sense that it must protect the rights that its citizens have acquired even if some have acquired more of such rights than others; and it must protect its citizens' property even if some have much more of it than others, at least if they acquired it fairly. Since the state may itself violate its citizens' rights we can say in sum that a state secures distributive justice if it governs with their consent, respects their rights, compels them to respect each others' rights, and compels outsiders to respect their rights.

Naturally Locke expected that given human nature people would sometimes wrongfully injure each other. To deal with or rectify such injuries he therefore gave some principles that we might consider together as his principles of “corrective justice”. He proposed two principles “Reparation and Restraint” which together he put under the heading of “punishment,” (though in the succeeding discussion he uses “punishment” to refer specifically to the means to secure restraint). They have a common object which is to secure individuals' rights. Punishment does so by restraining their violation; when restraint fails, reparation secures individuals' rights by repairing the damage their violation causes. To secure “restraint” punishment must be administered “with so much Severity as will suffice to make it an ill bargain to the Offender, give him cause to repent, and terrifie others from doing the like” (Locke 1689, book 2, chapter 8, section 12, p. 275). To repair the damage of wrongful injury reparation must give the “satisfaction due to any private Man, for the damage he has received.”

Locke qualifies these statements with the warning that punishment and reparation must be “proportionate to his Transgression,” and are the “only reasons why one man may do harm to another.” The greater the transgression, the greater will be the injury it causes, the harder it will be to make reparation for that injury, and consequently the more it must be restrained. Since Locke evidently believed that the more severe the punishment the more it restrains, greater transgressions deserve severer punishments. At the limit where reparation for the wrongful injury is impossible punishment must be especially severe. Locke makes the point with the example of murder. In the state of nature, he wrote, everyone has “the Power to kill a Murderer,” clearly implying that the severity of the punishment, is justified because “no Reparation can compensate” a murdered person (ibid).

Further important details of Locke's account of reparation are in the following passage: “Besides the Crime, …there is commonly injury done to some Person or other, and some other Man receives damage by his Transgression, in which Case he who hath received any damage, has besides the right of punishment common to him with other Men, a particular Right to seek Reparation from him that has done it.” This right of reparation, Locke continues in the next section, “belongs only to the injured party,” so that while the Magistrate who has “the common right of punishing put into his hands, can often, where the publick good demands not the execution of the Law, remit the punishment of Criminal Offences by his own Authority, but yet cannot remit the satisfaction due to any private Man, for the damage he has received. That, he who has suffered the damage has a Right to demand in his own name, and he alone can remit: the damnified Person has this Power of appropriating to himself, Goods or Service of the Offender, by Right of Self-Preservation” (Locke 1689, chapter 2, sections 10–11, pp. 273–4).

Let us note some especially important points. First, supposing that “commonly” implies “often but not necessarily” the claim that besides the crime there is “commonly” injury done to some person or other suggests that Locke admits the possibility of crimes that do not injure or harm. If crime is injustice and injustice must involve the violation of right, it follows that for Locke the violation of right need not involve injury. Though such crimes would not require reparation Locke gives no reason to suppose that they might not need to be punished. A second interesting and crucial point in Locke's comments on reparation is that a person damaged as a result of wrong doing has a “right” to seek reparation only from “him that has done it,” namely the wrongdoer. Third on the other hand Locke's claim that when a crime is committed injury is commonly done to “some person or other” suggests that a person injured as a result of a wrongful action may have a right to seek reparation from the wrong doer even if he was not the wrong doer's direct victim. If Jack kills Bill and Bill's children are injured as a result, they may be entitled to seek reparation from Jack. Naturally a lot more has to be said on this point for injuries can be too indirectly the result of wrong doing to be the basis of a right to reparation. The following points seem clearly implied although they are not stated explicitly. Fourth profiting from crime has little if anything to do with reparation. A criminal may have to make reparation even if he does not profit from his crime. Fifth even if the crime in question was theft, reparation does not necessarily imply return of the very thing that was stolen. The injured person has a right to demand satisfaction, but satisfaction may not involve the return of a thing. Sixth Locke says nothing to suggest that he believed that excusable violations of right do not generate rights for compensation. The man lost in the wilderness who has to use another's property to save his life in Feinberg's example may have to compensate the property owner (Feinberg 1978). Finally since the injured person is owed satisfaction for his injury reparation may include apology or a plea for forgiveness.

3. Reparation and Compensation

The words “reparation” and “compensation” will appear often in this discussion. They are related in meaning but not synonymous. Compensation is the broader term. As suggested in Locke's discussion reparation along with punishment are parts of corrective as opposed to distributive justice. Logically, if someone deserves reparation then necessarily someone has acted wrongly and harmed or injured him as a result. To deserve reparation one must have suffered some harm or loss as a result of someone's wrongful act. Compensation means making up for or counteracting some loss or lack of something useful or valuable. The loss of lack may not be due to any wrong doing. Thus though suffering some loss or harm does not necessarily make one deserving of reparation it may make one deserving of compensation. And a person need not owe others reparation even if his actions caused them to be harmed; to owe them reparation his actions that caused them harm must also have been wrongful.

Thus harmed persons may deserve to be compensated even if they do not deserve reparation. Sometimes people are compensated for harms, as for example, when they are compensated for harms suffered as a result of a hurricane. In such cases, though we may identify the party we think should compensate the harmed people we do not imply that it caused their harms or indeed that anyone caused their harms. If we say that the government should compensate the victims of a hurricane we do not necessarily imply that the government or anyone else caused their injuries; and it follows that we also do not necessarily imply that the government or anyone else wrongfully caused their harms. Sometimes a party, like a government or an insurance company, ought to compensate people for harms it did not cause them and so did not wrongfully cause them. On the other hand, sometimes governments wrongfully cause people to be harmed because it failed to do its job of protecting them, for example by not building sea walls strong enough to prevent hurricanes of foreseeable strength from causing disastrous floods. Wrongful action is being used here to include culpably negligent action. A government need not intend to harm the citizens of a city by failing to build adequate sea walls, but if it failed to build adequate sea walls from negligence, then it acted wrongly, and if a hurricane breached the walls and harmed citizens their government wrongfully though not intentionally harmed them. But the victims of a hurricane may deserve compensation for their losses even if the government did not act negligently. Compensation is such cases may be something that citizens are owed by their governments. In sum logically the appropriateness of compensation does not imply wrongdoing or even harm. To say that people deserve compensation is not to say or imply they have been harmed, and is certainly not to say or imply that they have been harmed as a result of anyone's wrongful actions.

Reparation is always backward looking in the sense that to say that someone who is harmed deserves reparation is necessarily to imply that a search into the causes of his harm will show that his harms were caused by some other party's wrongful action. Compensation is not backward looking in this sense. A person may be appropriately compensated simply because in his present condition he cannot function or act satisfactorily. A lame person may be compensated for his disability with a wheel chair even if no one caused his disability. Often an individual can help to compensate for his own disabilities. A blind man who compensates for his blindness by developing his sense of hearing provides an example. People do not similarly help in their own reparation though of course they can help to compensate for the harms for which they deserve reparation. A person who is viciously or negligently blinded by another can compensate for his disability in the ways noted above, but in doing so he is not making reparation to himself.

Finally reparation and compensation have different objects. Reparation's object is to make the harmed person whole again, or to bring her to the condition she would have been in had she not been wrongly harmed, though of course naturally this object often cannot be completely secured. In making her whole again special consideration must be given to the fact that she was wronged and not merely harmed. Thus apology and concession of wrong doing is essential to reparation for it is essential to the object of reparation which is to return the injured person to the position of respect he had before he was wrongly injured. Compensation has a different object. It must because unlike reparation it does not imply that anyone has been wronged. The object of compensation is to enable someone who suffers from some loss or lack or harm to function at a level above what she would function given her loss or lack or harm. Naturally a person may get little compensation or complete compensation. What she should get will depend on many things. Suppose she has insured herself against the loss she has suffered. In that case how much compensation she should get will depend on how much of her losses the insurance company has pledged itself to compensate. If it has pledged itself to compensate her in full, its responsibilities will be very much like that of someone who must make reparation to those he wrongfully harmed, though of course even in such cases the insurance company cannot be said to be making reparation to her since it has not wrongfully harmed her. If she is uninsured she may receive little compensation. How much compensation she deserves will depend on the obligations the community has to its members who are harmed or suffer from some lack.

4. Reparations for slavery

Given our earlier sketch of the essentials of reparation, Thaddeus Stevens's proposal for slave reparations is easily stated and apparently ironclad. The slave holders had committed serious transgressions that harmed the slaves. Consequently they were obligated to make reparation to their slaves and confiscating their land and distributing it to the slaves would plausibly contribute to or constitute that reparation.

But the argument for black reparations today is not the argument that the slaves deserved reparation for the harms that slavery caused them. No one questions that argument. The argument for black reparations today, the argument that many question, is that present, living African Americans deserve reparation from the American people or the American government for reasons that stem somehow from the enslavement of their ancestors three hundred years by the American people with the permission and blessing of the American government. It seems to get no support from the almost universally acknowledged claim that the slaves themselves deserved reparations from the slave holders or the government. No one can demand reparation for another's harm, even if the other is his ancestor.

But several arguments have been urged to circumvent this difficulty. They may turn out to be based on poor or at least unsound arguments. And if sound they may turn out to justify demands that are exorbitant and politically impossible to satisfy. But our business is to see what they are, and to judge their soundness. If they are sound we should see where they lead even if they lead to demands that are not politically feasible. Later we can see what can be done to make their demands feasible.

5. Reparation and Affirmative Action

As we have suggested reparation can take many forms depending on the harm it is meant to repair and what is necessary to repair that harm. As we saw earlier it can take the form of according territory to a people or nation that has wrongly lost its territory. In the case of slavery as Thaddeus Stevens urged it could take the form of according the freedmen forty acres and a mule to enable them to become thriving free holders. Conceivably reparation for blacks could take the form of affirmative action. Suppose, to take the most straightforward case, that a firm wronged a black person by denying her on account of her race a well paying position she was most qualified for. And suppose too, as is not unlikely, that she was harmed as a result of that injustice. Plausibly the firm would owe her reparation for wrongly harming her, and that reparation, also plausibly could appropriately take the form of hiring her affirmatively, that is, in preference over better qualified candidates for the same position if it became available. In fact when affirmative action was introduced some years ago its fiercest and most effective critics usually claimed that they would support it if it involved reparation of the sort just described. The problem as they saw it was that most of the affirmative action that was practiced was not of that sort. As they were fond of pointing out, most of affirmative action's beneficiaries were young well qualified men and women who were entering the job market for the first time and were therefore not victims of racial discrimination in employment. It was conceded that their parents and grandparents had probably suffered from such discrimination, and could therefore perhaps demand preferential treatment, though this concession was always accompanied by the warning that in order to actually get preferential treatment these older victims of discrimination would have to prove make their case in court—a requirement which of course was almost impossible to satisfy.

The defenders of affirmative action tried to meet the critics' objections in various ways, for example, by pointing out that if the youngsters' parents and grandparents had suffered from unjust racial discrimination, then the youngsters too had probably suffered from such discrimination even if indirectly and even if they were entering the job market for the first time. But this reply had already been anticipated and rebutted by the requirement that the parents and grandparents had to prove that they had suffered from unjust racial discrimination in court. The defenders of affirmative action tried more complicated perhaps more desperate replies, but their attempts to justify affirmative action as reparation did not last long. Perhaps this was because the Supreme Court had offered a far easier and less ostensibly less divisive way to justify affirmative action. In the Bakke decision of 1978 the Court rejected the argument that affirmative action for blacks could be justified as compensation for disadvantages caused by past unjust racial discrimination, but allowed that such affirmative action could be justified to secure “diversity.” Although this new argument is still very controversial, it is far more popular than the older argument that tried to justify affirmative action as reparation. But even if the Court is right and that affirmative action cannot be justified as reparation for past unjust discrimination against blacks, it does not follow that reparation for blacks cannot be justified. Since this essay is about reparation and not specifically about affirmative action it will not attempt to revive the reparations argument for affirmative action.

6. Two arguments for black reparations

There are two main arguments for black reparations. These arguments are the harm argument and the inheritance argument.

The harm argument can be summarized as follows: slavery involved many transgressions against the slaves. The slaves were harmed by these transgressions. These harms initiated an unbroken chain of harms linked as cause and effect that persists to the present day. Since present day African Americans therefore suffer from harms caused by the transgressions of slavery it follows from the principles of reparative justice that they deserve reparation for those harms.
The inheritance argument can be summarized as follows: the slave holders wrongly harmed their slaves and the slaves deserved reparation for those harms; but they were never given that reparation. Consequently, it passes by the right of inheritance to present day African Americans who are the descendents and heirs of the slaves.

Both the harm argument and the inheritance argument connect slavery to the demand for black reparations. But there are important differences between. Although both arguments assume that slavery's transgressions harmed the slaves, only the harm argument maintains that these transgressions have also harmed present day African Americans who therefore deserve reparation for their harms. The inheritance argument does not insist that slavery's transgressions have harmed the present day African Americans. Its crucial premise is that the present black population has inherited a right to the reparation owed to their slave ancestors for the harms they suffered as slaves, but which was never paid.

The harm argument and the inheritance argument would be drawn more closely together if harm is defined so that the bare failure of African Americans to receive their due inheritance necessarily counts as a harm to them. That possibility will not be explored here, but instead take harm to be some damage or loss to one's personal capabilities whether physical or mental like a loss of health or a lack of proper education.

7. The Harm argument

The argument is reproduced here for convenience:

Slavery involved many transgressions against the slaves. The slaves were harmed by these transgressions. These harms initiated an unbroken chain of harms linked as cause and effect that persists to the present day. Since present day African Americans therefore suffer from harms caused by the transgressions of slavery it follows from the principles of reparative justice that they deserve reparation for those harms.

Three main objections have been urged against the harm argument. The first is that although the transgressions of slavery certainly harmed the slaves, even if present day African Americans do suffer from various disadvantages, these disadvantages may not result from the transgressions of slavery; they may result from events that have occurred since slavery was abolished. After all slavery ended one hundred and fifty years ago and vast economic and political changes have occurred since that time. Perhaps some of these changes are the real causes of the harms to the present black population that seem to us to have their source in the transgressions of slavery. George Sher describes the problem as the fact that the present harms even if they do exist are not the “automatic effects of slavery.”( George Sher “Ancient wrongs and modern rights” Philosophy and Public Affairs Volume 10 1981, 3–17.)

The second main objection that has been raised against the harm argument is that the slaveholders whose wrongdoing caused the harms for which reparation is being sought, no longer exist. But only those whose wrong doing causes harm are obligated to make reparation for that harm. So even if present day African Americans have been harmed as a result of the wrong doing of slavery and have rights to reparation for those harms, there is no one who is obligated to make that reparation.

The third main objection to the harm argument is that the argument is incoherent. It claims that African Americans deserve reparation for harms caused by a transgression brought about the conditions for their existence.[1] But if slavery had never occurred most of the ancestors of present day African Americans would have never left Africa, and it is highly unlikely that they would have met and had children with the people they did meet and have children with. In other words if slavery had never occurred, the people who make up the present generation of African Americans would not exist.[2] Consequently, if our identities depend on the identities of our parents, it follows that the people composing the present generation of African Americans would not exist if slavery had never occurred. But how can the present black population seek reparation for harms caused by transgressions if they would not exist if these transgressions not occurred?

The first two of the above objections can be handled by a single if radical change in the harm argument. Instead of saying that the slave holders and the governments of two hundred years ago are still causing harms to present day African Americans, the argument now says that the present government and the present white population are causing harms to present day African Americans. Critics can therefore no longer complain that the harm argument implausibly supposes that slavery's transgressions which happened two hundred years ago continue to harm present day African Americans, and leaves them with no one who can be said to owe them reparation.

But the restated harm argument seems to have nothing to do with slavery. If various governmental and individual policies are now wrongly harming African Americans then these individuals may deserve reparation for these harms, but this claim has nothing to do with slavery. It would stand even if there had never been any slavery. However this problem can be resolved as follows: slavery harmed the slaves and consequently the freed people. But every government and white population since the Civil war have seen to it that the neither the freed people nor their descendants could recover from the harms of slavery. They did this first by never making reparation to the freed people and also by failing to protect their civil and political rights. Perhaps the freed people could have recovered from the injuries of slavery even if they had never received the reparation for those injuries. But there was the additional violation of being left unprotected from the angry and resentful white population which violated their civil and political rights, denied them education, jobs, freedom of movement, and kept in a state of fear. Together the two violations proved overwhelming and prevented the freed people and their descendants from properly protecting and nurturing their children. As a result the harms originally inflicted during slavery persisted even after slavery was ended and were passed on to the descendants of the freed people.

Considered in this light the idea that the present black population is entitled to seek reparation for the harms that slavery caused it is a misleading way of understanding the harm argument. The harm argument demands reparation for the present black population for harms recently caused by the white generations and governments since the Civil war. But the these harms remain connected to slavery. They would not be the harms they are had slavery not existed two hundred years ago, but they are caused by recent transgression because they would not exist had those transgressions not occurred.

If this is correct every government since the Civil war has unjustly injured its black population and consequently has been obligated to make appropriate reparation to that population. The first of these governments failed to protect the rights of the freed people and to fulfill its obligation to make appropriate reparation to them. These failures harmed the freed people's children and the succeeding government, the government of those children, was obligated to make reparation to them for their harms, but of course failed to fulfill that obligation as well as its obligation to protect their rights. These failures in turn harmed the next generation and so the chain of harms has persisted to the present day.

If the nation had followed Thaddeus Stevens's proposal to confiscate the slaveholders' lands and distribute them to the freed people, the freed people and their descendants, with land to feed and clothe themselves and a little left over to buy arms to defend themselves would have been able to do what the federal government could not do by itself, namely, protect their civil and political rights. On this account Stevens' scheme would secure several ends: it would reduce the vast inequality in wealth and power in the slaveholding society which always spells trouble for a republic; it would give the freed people the basis for their independence; and perhaps most importantly it would satisfy to some extent the requirement of justice that reparation be made to those harmed as a result of transgression. Had it been adopted only then would it have been possible for the government to protect the civil and political rights of the freed people, and only then would it have been even reasonable to suggest that the descendants of the freed people could have had a fighting chance to recover from the harms inflicted originally in slavery. That reparation might have given them the economic basis they needed for their independence and for the secure enjoyment of their civil and political rights. Of course the case for such reparation and the case for an economic basis necessary for independence are conceptually different things. The first is backward looking based on the right to self-preservation, while the second is forward looking and based on the idea that economic independence is necessary if rights are going to be reliably secured. In other words the case for distributing land to the freed people is over determined and justified by several different conceptions and consideration of justice some backward looking and some forward looking.

Two prominent theorists Fullinwider and Bittker have versions of the reformulated harm argument. Fullinwider's goes as follows: the government after 1865 failed “to vindicate the rights to full and equal citizenship the Civil War Amendments extended to blacks;” but, had that government “vigorously” protected those rights, “the legacy of slavery would have faded considerably if not wholly by now through the industry of blacks themselves” (Fullinwider 2004, p. 148). Consequently if present day African Americans do suffer from various aspects of the legacy of slavery, the real cause of those harms is not slavery, but the governments after 1865, for if those governments had vigorously protected the rights of the freed people and their descendants, the legacy of slavery would have faded and present day African Americans would not be disadvantaged by it.

Boris Bittker made a similar suggestion in 1973 in his book The Case for Black Reparations. His main argument is that had the goals of Reconstruction not been foiled by the “political settlement of 1877” and the network of Jim Crow laws not been introduced and finally fully authorized by Plessy v. Ferguson in 1896 the “only identifiable residue of slavery today would have been cultural,” and the descendants of slaves and the descendants of slaveholders would lead the same lives (Bittker 2003, pp. 12–3). In other words though Bittker seems to go a little further than Fullinwider, suggesting that the legacy of slavery would have disappeared completely if the nation had protected the rights of the freedpeople and their descendants, he too concludes that any responsibility for the legacy of slavery that persists today must be attributed to post Civil War governments.

It might seem that the arguments of Fullinwider and Bittker are the same as the restatement of the harm argument given earlier. In fact their arguments elide an important consideration carefully emphasized in that earlier argument. They seem to assume that post Civil war governments committed only one transgression against their black populations, namely they failed to protect the civil rights of these populations. In the restatement of the harm argument given earlier it was emphasized that the governments committed another distinct transgression against their black populations by failing to make reparation to them. These two transgressions cannot be collapsed into one. The duty of government to protect its citizens' civil and political rights is not the same thing as its duty to make reparation to them if it has wrongly injured them.

But Fullinwider and Bittker may remind us that the issue is not whether the post Civil war government transgressed against and harmed the freed people in two ways rather than in one, but whether both these transgressions and harms have anything to do with the alleged harms that present day African Americans suffer from. Fullinwider's claim that “Had the federal government done nothing after 1865 except vigorously protect the civil and voting rights of blacks, the legacy of slavery would have faded considerably if not wholly by now through the industry of blacks themselves” suggests that only one of these transgression has done any damage to the present black population, namely, the governments' failure to protect the civil and political rights of the freed people and their descendants. But an obvious difficulty with this view is that large economic inequalities make it practically impossible for the government to protect the rights of the poor. In other words the government in 1865 could not have protected the rights of the freed people if it made no reparation to them and thus allowed them to remain as destitute as they were when they were released from slavery.

That problem aside, Fullinwider and Bittker give no argument to support their view that the freed peoples' descendants would have recovered from the harms of slavery without the help of reparation if only government had protected their civil and political rights. Fullinwider's confidence in it seems to rest on his view that the freed people were very much like the white immigrant groups arriving from Europe. According to Fullinwider the failure of government to vigorously protect the civil and voting rights of the freed people and their descendants “prevented African Americans from successfully following the immigrant model”. (The Case for Reparations, p. 147) By the “immigrant model” he means the path to success taken by the millions of Europeans immigrants who came to America after the Civil War, and with “little to offer but their physical labor,” and “by dint of hard work” eventually “blended into the larger American fabric.” If the freed people were indeed very much like the immigrant groups then perhaps they too by dint of hard work would have blended into the larger American fabric if only government had protected their civil and political rights as well as it protected the civil and political rights of the immigrants.

But the freed people and their descendants were not very much like the white immigrants arriving from Europe. Although the immigrants had had a rough time in Europe—that is why they flocked to America—they were better prepared to take advantage of the opportunities available than the slaves. Most of the slaves were illiterate. More generally slavery is very bad for people. It prevents slaves from developing the useful dispositions and skills that people tend to develop in freedom, suggesting that the immigrants would keep well ahead of the freed people and their descendants even if the civil and political rights of each group were equally protected.

Further as the economist Glenn Loury has shown advancement depends also on informal contacts that are beyond reach of the enforcement of political and civil rights. This refers not only to the “old boys” network that alert the better off to opportunities that others equally talented and hard working never hear of. It refers as well,to the sharing and transfer of genuinely useful information and skills that goes on between people who enjoy what used to be called “social equality.” But social equality cannot be secured by even the most rigorous protection of the civil and political rights of the freed people. On the contrary such protection can help to guarantee the continuation of social inequality since civil rights entitle individuals to choose their friends and associates even if their choice is determined by color prejudice. Since color prejudice was, of course, rampant after (and before the Civil war), the immigrants being white would more readily become the social equals of more prosperous and industrious native white classes than the freed people and the useful things they would learn from this equality would enable them to keep well ahead of the freed people. Further since social equals tend to marry each other rather than their inferiors, and since immigrant whites were more likely than the freed people and their descendants to become the social equals of prosperous native whites, immigrant whites were also more likely to marry and thus to gain access to the wealth of native whites (much of this inherited from the spoils of slavery). In other words even if immigrants whites landed here penniless they could marry into money more easily than the freed people and their descendants and this would keep them ahead of these dark rivals.

These considerations suggest that Fullinwider and Bittker are probably too optimistic when they suppose that the descendants of the freed people would have achieved parity with the descendants of the immigrants. But suppose they are right. Perhaps seeing that government was not going to make reparation to them, the freed people and their descendants “girded their loins,” and managed as a result to recover from the legacy of slavery without any reparation. But now Fullinwider and Bittker face a different problem. If the descendants of the freed people would have reached parity with the descendants of the immigrants if only their civil and political rights had been protected, then surely given the same protection they would have surpassed the descendants of the white immigrant groups if their ancestors, the freed people, had received reparation for the injuries they had sustained as slaves.

Since the freedpeople never received such reparation they and their descendants have been wrongfully harmed and deserve reparation for what they would have achieved had they not been thus harmed.

Obviously this argument faces many challenges. For example it relies on the counterfactual claim that had reparation been made to the freed people they would have used their improved condition to better prepare their children for life. Jeremy Waldron has frequently challenged such counterfactuals. He insists that we cannot confidently say what people would have done had they been in conditions that were different from those that in fact they were in. More generally he denies that we can ever know enough about people so as to enable us to confidently predict what they will choose to do. To illustrate his point he cites the surprise and disappointment of a person whose aged aunt left her fortune to a home for stray dogs though he had confidently expected, on what he believed were solid grounds, that she would leave her fortune to him. (Waldron 1992, p. 10) Waldron applies this consideration to demands for the return of tribal lands to present day Aborigines. Many of these demands are based on the counterfactual claim that these Aborigines would now be in possession of those lands had they not been unjustly taken from their ancestors. Waldron counters that we really cannot know what the ancestors would have done with the lands had the lands been left in their possession. They might have sold them and the new owners might have sold them again or lost them in a poker game. Applied to the case under consideration the implication is that we cannot rely on the counterfactual claim that had reparation been made to the freed people they would have used their improved circumstances to better prepare their children for live.

This argument is not persuasive. Although our predictions of what a specific individual will do are often wrong, we can often accurately predict general trends. For example Kant made the point in Universal History and it is the principle on which insurance companies operate. So although we should place little confidence in our expectations about what any particular aunt will do with her money when she dies, we may be justified in being confident about what aunts in general will do with their money when they die; probably Waldron's friend was surprised by his aunt's choice precisely because most of aunts without their own children give their money to their nieces and nephews. But the case at hand concerns whole populations of freed people. And we also know that although some people with means neglect their children most do not. That is why we think that parents should have considerable control over their children's education and upbringing. In other words while we should expect that a few freed people would waste their reparation, we should also expect that most would use it wisely to better prepare their children to do well.

A second perhaps more interesting objection to the argument under consideration is that if the freed people and their descendants would have achieved parity with the descendants of immigrants if only government had protected their civil and political rights, even if it never made them reparation, then present day African Americans do not deserve reparation for losses resulting from government's failure to make reparation to their ancestors. Having achieved parity with the descendants of the immigrants, what would they deserve reparation for?

One worry here is the facile assumption that the reparation owed to blacks is to be made equal to whites. This assumption is not obviously true. Certainly reparation is not defined as making the wrongly harmed equal to others. On the face of it, equality seems really to have little to do with reparation. People deserve reparation when they have been harmed by transgression and it is not necessary that in being thus harmed they are also made worse off than others. A person may be harmed and disadvantaged as a result of transgression and may therefore deserve reparation and yet be better off than others. Similarly a person may be worse off than others without having suffered from any harm or disadvantage for which he deserves reparation. The point of reparation is not to make people equal to others. It is as far as possible to put people in the condition they would have been in had they not been wrongly injured. This may make them equal to others, but it may not. It can leave them worse off than others and it can also very easily make them better off than others. Perhaps the assumption that the reparation owed to black is to be made equal to whites relies on the further assumption that equality is the ideal requirement of distributive justice, while corrective justice is designed to return us to that ideal when we happen to stray from it, and consequently is superseded by the demands of distributive justice.

But this view gets little support from the history of corrective and distributive justice. Few theories of distributive justice claim that the just distribution is an equal distribution. Aristotle introduced and discussed the ideas of distributive and corrective justice in Chapters 2, 3 and 4 in Book V of the Nicomachean Ethics (pp. 111–116). Distributive justice governed the distribution by the state of things of value like “honour or money,” “among those who have a share in the constitution.” According to Aristotle everyone agrees that the distribution should be based on merit “in some sense, though they do not all specify the same sort of merit.” Consequently depending on the sort of merit specified, the resulting distribution may result in equal or unequal shares.

Aristotle describes corrective justice as playing a “rectifying part in transactions between man and man.” Since corrective justice is required only where individuals have wrongly harmed or injured each other, its function is not to correct departures from the just distribution of things of value secured by the state, although, of course such departures can occur even if individuals have not wrongly harmed or injured each other. Presumably Aristotle would assign the job of correcting these departures to the state, so that correcting distributions strictly speaking does not fall only to corrective justice. Second, Aristotle insists that the judge rectifying transactions between individuals must ignore the merits of the wrong doer and his victim and focus on the fact that someone has acted wrongly and in so doing has harmed someone else. As he put it, “it makes no difference whether a good man has defrauded a bad man or a bad man a good one, nor whether it is a good or a bad man that has committed adultery; the law looks only to the distinctive character of the injury, and treats the parties as equal,…” His job, Aristotle says, is to “equalize things by means of the penalty, taking away from the gain of the assailant. For the term ‘gain’ is applied generally to such cases—even if it be not a term appropriate to certain cases, e.g. to the person who inflicts a wound…; it is as though there were a line divided into unequal parts, and he took away that by which the greater segment exceeds the half, and added it to the smaller segment.”

Aristotle's views on corrective and distributive justice suggest that they can conflict. For suppose that distributive justice depends on a sort of merit that allows for inequalities of merit. In that case distributive justice would demand that the more meritorious have more things of value that the less meritorious. But since corrective justice may demand that we take from the more meritorious and give to the less meritorious, it follows that securing corrective justice may upset the state's establishment of distributive justice and consequently that the demands of corrective justice may conflict with and presumably supersede the demands of distributive justice.

But it is now time to consider the third main objection to the harm argument. This objection let us recall is that making reparation to the present black population for the harms that slavery caused it is impossible because if slavery had never occurred the present black population would not exist. This difficulty seems to reappear in the case for black reparations just developed. Although this case does not call for compensating the present black population for the harms of that slavery caused it, it may seem to call for compensating the present black population for harms caused by policies enacted and enforced before it was conceived. If the enactment and enforcement of these policies affected who was conceived in succeeding black populations, had they not occurred the present black population would not exist.

But the counterfactual argument now under defense does not call for compensating the present black population for harms caused by transgressions that occurred before its members were conceived. To see how it works, let us imagine two slaves, Tom and Beulah released from slavery. The government owed them compensation for having helped enslave them, and also for the discriminatory laws it enacted after they were released from slavery and that prevented them from recovering from slavery. At every point of their lives, they were entitled to seek reparation from the government harms these injustices caused them, including the point just after the conception of their daughter, Eulah. At that point and every succeeding point, it did not pay them what it owed them. This was a grave injustice to Tom and Beulah, but what is equally important here is that it certainly also harmed their daughter. As a direct result of it their daughter probably grew up in ignorance and straitened conditions, and in general with all the disadvantages of having a father and mother who had been enslaved and then prevented from recovering from the harms and disabilities of the experience, and never compensated for either injustice. More particularly, she probably acquired from them, by imitation and necessity, many of the habits and qualities they had acquired under slavery which the government's policies had prevented them from shaking off. Supposing that she was harmed as a result, and by a governmental injustice, it follows that she had a right to compensation from the government for the harm its injustice to her parents caused her. That is, she has a right against the government that it bring her to the level of well being she would have enjoyed had her parent been compensated for being enslaved, and for being prevented from recovering from the injuries of slavery.

Several steps of this argument are worth stressing. First, the argument is not that Eulah has a claim to the compensation her parents Tom and Beulah's were owed and never paid. If that were the argument we would have an inheritance argument, not a counterfactual argument. Eulah's claim for compensation is for harms she herself suffered, though she would not have suffered these harms had her parents been compensated for their injuries or allowed to recover from them.

Second, the amount of the compensation she is owed does not depend on the amount of compensation they were owed. It depends on the harms she suffered, and though she suffered those harms because they were not compensated, repairing them may be much more, (or much less), than the compensation they were owed.

Third, in addition to her own claim for compensation she may have an inheritance based claim to their compensation as well. She has a claim to be compensated for her harms, and they have a claim to be compensated for their harms, and neither claim is canceled because the other is met. Consequently, the fact that she was harmed because they were not compensated and can claim compensation for that harm does not mean that they lose their claim to be compensated for their harms, or that she loses her right to inherit that compensation from her parents. In other words, the counterfactual argument under discussion is compatible with the inheritance based argument.

Fourth, though her claim for compensation was for the harms she herself suffered from, some of them had their origin in slavery for she suffered them because her parents were harmed as a result of slavery, prevented from recovering from these harms, and never compensated.

Fifth, her claim for compensation is not confounded by the argument that she would not exist had the injustice that caused her harm not occurred. That injustice was not slavery, which occurred before she was conceived, and indeed was one of the causes of her being conceived. Neither was it any of the various injustices the government and society committed against her parents before she was conceived. These injustices did not cause her harms because had they not occurred she would not have existed. The injustice or injustices that caused her harms was the government's failure to compensate her parents after her conception, as well as the unjust policies it enacted and enforced to prevent them from recovering from the effects of slavery. Had those injustices not occurred, had her parents been compensated, and allowed to recover from the effects of slavery, she would have lived in less straitened conditions, and would have been less constrained to imitate and duplicate her parents slave induced qualities and habits. In general, she would not suffer from the injuries she does suffer from. On the other hand, it would be false to claim that she would not exist had the government not enacted and enforced its unjust policies. These policies and their enactment occurred after her conception, and had they never occurred, her existence would have been unaffected because she would already have been conceived.

There is no reason why the argument cannot be repeated for Eulah's children, that is, Tom and Beulah's grandchildren. The government did not compensate their mother; this injustice harmed them; and they therefore had a claim for compensation against the government for the harm its injustice of failing to compensate their mother caused them. Their claim for compensation is not a claim to inherit the compensation she was owed for her harms, but a claim for compensation for their own harms. The amount of their compensation does not depend on the amount of her compensation, but on how much the failure to compensate her harmed them. One might suspect that it will be greater than her compensation, given that there are many of them and one of her. In addition to their claim for compensation for their injuries, they may also have an inheritance based claim for the compensation she was owed but never paid. Their claims for compensation are for harms they themselves suffered from, but some of these harms would have their origin in slavery since they suffered them because their mother lived in straitened conditions, and she lived in straitened conditions because her parents, Tom and Beulah were harmed by slavery, prevented from recovering from these harms and never compensated. And again, there is no danger that their grandchildren would fail to exist had the injustice that caused their harms not occurred, for that injustice was not slavery or the failure to compensate their grand parents which occurred long before they were conceived and were probably among the conditions for their conception, but the failure to compensate their mother, which we can suppose occurred after they were conceived. Proceeding in this way we can arrive at the present generation of African Americans. They are entitled to seek reparation from the government for the harms it caused them by failing to compensate their parents.[3]

8. The Inheritance Argument

Let us turn now to the second main argument for black reparation, which we have called the inheritance argument. It does not say that African Americans have a claim for reparation just because their ancestors were enslaved. And it does not say that paying present black population the reparation that was owed to their ancestors will make reparation to their ancestors; their ancestors are dead, and nothing paid to their descendents can make reparation to them. It says that the freed people had rights to reparation for their injuries; that they held these rights against the slave holders and also against the state and federal government for failing in its duty to protect them from the slave holders; these rights were never honored; and finally that they pass by the right of inheritance to present day African Americans who are their descendants and heirs.

This argument is not implausible. When people die their rights to their property are normally passed on to their heirs.[4] The reparation owed to the freed people was their property; they had rights to it. It was never in their physical possession of course but it was nevertheless their property. Neither did they abandon it. It was forcefully kept from them. Consequently it should pass, by right of inheritance, to their descendants, the present black population.

The inheritance argument seems to be an elegant and stream lined argument for the conclusion that African Americans have claims against they governments based on the enslavement of their ancestors. It avoids the objection that had slavery never happened the individuals comprising the present black population would not exist. As Thompson puts it “The claims of descendants depend on them being the heirs of their forebears—not on their being the particular individuals they are. The fact that they might not have existed if that injustice had not been done does not undermine their claim.”108

But it is open to several important objections. First it relies on the counterfactual claim that the freed people and their descendants would have held on to their reparation had they received it; as Waldron suggests they might have spent it frivolously, lost it, or given it away. This is a version of his objection to counterfactual reasoning that we have already discussed; there is no need to rebut this objection once again.

A second objection is that it seems to demand that people innocent of any involvement in slavery pay the cost of making reparation for the injuries it caused. Let us begin with that objection. Certainly the slaves had rights to reparation against their state and federal governments. These governments were deeply complicit in slavery and in the injuries it caused. And arguably African Americans have inherited these rights. The problem is that it does not seem to follow that present day African Americans can press these inherited rights against their state and federal governments. Demands for reparation can be pressed only against the parties who committed the wrong that caused the harm for which reparation is sought. But the present federal and state governments are not the same governments that were complicit in slavery two hundred years ago.

Perhaps we can handle this problem as Fullinwider suggests by insisting that it is simply a basic fact of social ontology that governments and nations may continue to exist for many centuries. But the crucial problem remains. Even if the governments of today are the same governments that were complicit in the crime of slavery the fact remains that the inheritance argument demands that present day Americans who could not possibly have been complicit in the crime of slavery must pay the cost of making reparation for it. Many people have found this argument deeply repugnant.

The case of the U.S. reparations to the Japanese and the German reparation to the Jews do not raise this problem at least as acutely. They do not involve making people pay reparations for crimes committed one hundred and fifty years before they were born, and many of those required to pay the costs of reparation were complicit in the injustice that justified reparation. It may be argued that firms and corporations are often held accountable for debts incurred before any of the present members of the firm were alive. But the analogy between a firm or corporation and the state is problematic. People are not born into firms or corporations, and they can easily join or leave firms or corporations. No one has to belong to a firm or corporation. Further, when people join a corporation they understand that they are joining something that may have liabilities that they may be assuming when they join. But people are born into states, and must belong to some state or other.

Locke's discussion of a lawful conqueror's rights to reparation suggests how this problem can possibly be handled. “The right of Conquest,” Locke claims, “extends only to the Lives of those who joyn'd in the War, not to their Estates, but only in order to make reparation for the damages received, and the Charges of the War, and that too with reservation of the right of the innocent Wife and Children” (Second Treatise of Civil Government, chapter 16, section 180). Though the language is convoluted Locke clearly says here that the lawful conqueror has rights to reparation from the estates of those who unjustly waged war against him. And he also clearly implies that these rights extend to property that the wife and children would have inherited had their husband and father not unjustly waged war against the conqueror. This emphatically does not mean that the children are making reparation for the harms that their father's transgressions caused. Locke would be guilty of self-contradiction if he held such a view because he insisted that only the transgressor can make reparation for the harms his transgressions caused. His view was that when people unjustly harm others, a portion of their estates may be used to make reparation to the people they harmed, and as a necessary result their children cannot inherit that portion of their estates.

Using Locke's argument as a model we can construct the following argument: the slave holders harmed the slaves. Consequently the slaves had rights to reparation against the estates of the slave holders despite the fact that by exercising these rights they would reduce perhaps drastically the estates that the slave holders' children would otherwise inherit. Since those rights were never honored, and the present day African Americans are their heirs, presumably present day African Americans have inherited these rights. This argument parallels Locke's, at least in its essentials, but it does not prove much. The slave holders' heirs are by now few and far between,identifying them will be difficult, and in any case their collective assets are too small to make claims against them for black reparation worth the trouble.

But the argument can be broadened to include not just the slave holders' heirs, but the whole white population. Locke did not believe that citizens consent to their government's injustice simply because the government is legitimate and legitimate government is government by consent. If he did he would not have said in section 179 and 180 of the Second Treatise of Civil Government, that the lawful conqueror had titles to reparation from the estates of those who “assisted, concurred, or consented,” to the unjust war against him. Thus the argument is not that every white citizen was complicit in the crime of slavery just because he was a citizen. Following Locke, a citizen must do something more than be a citizen to make himself complicit in its crimes. A reasonable suggestion is that he must fail to express dissent from his government's unjust acts if he knows about these acts and if signs of dissent are relatively easy to make and not too costly. Now the nation knew that the government permitted and supported slavery and it also knew that slavery was a crime. The South certainly tried to conceal the full horrors of the slave system, but the evidence suggests that these efforts were not successful. And the government did not punish dissent though it did not sufficiently protect dissenters from supporters of slavery. Consequently, since there was little dissent from the government's complicity in the crime of slavery it seems fair to conclude that most whites consented to their government's injustice to the slaves. In Locke's language they “assisted, concurred, or consented” to the government's injustice therefore making themselves obligated to make reparation for the damages its injustice caused. Since the slaves had titles to reparation against the estates of those who assisted, concurred or consented to their enslaved, they had titles to reparation against practically the entire white population, not just against the estates of the slave holders. This reparation was never paid. Instead from the first each white generation passed on its entire assets to the next white generation for each generation of whites specified that only whites of the succeeding generation were permitted to own, or compete for, or be educated by, the assets it was leaving behind. Since the slaves had titles to reparation against these assets, and the present generation of African Americans is the slaves' heir, the present generation of African Americans has inherited titles to a portion of the assets held by the present white population. This includes the white immigrants who arrived in the U.S. after the abolition of slavery. They came to take advantage of opportunities, funded by assets the slaves had titles to, or for the education the slaves and descendants were prevented from getting, or to take natural assets including land that the slaves also had titles to. The fact that they competed for these opportunities and worked hard misses the point. A considerable part of their earnings depends on the education they acquired that the slaves and their descendents were prevented from acquiring, even though much of the money that paid for that education belonged to them.

This argument obviously raises many difficulties. For example Waldron worries that it relies on an understanding of the rights of reparation that tends to justify dangerous and unjust inequalities.[5] He has in mind arguments that Europeans must return Australia to the Aborigines, New Zealand to the Maori, and Canada and the U.S. to the Native Americans because their ancestors stole those territories from the native populations, whose descendants and heirs are the present Aborigines, Maori, and Native Americans. His objection to these arguments is that circumstances have changed; Europeans in the territories in question now number in the millions and they have nowhere to go if they return the territories they now occupy to the descendants of their original owners; and consequently that they are justified in not returning the territories. In this way he says certain historic wrongs may be “superseded” (Waldron 1992, p. 24)

But his argument also raises serious problems. In the end it seems reasonable that the rights to reparation can be limited so that honoring them fully does not lead to inequalities that make it impossible for government to adequately protect the civil and political rights of its citizens. For similar reasons the rights of the present generation of African Americans to inherit the reparation owed to their ancestors may be limited if honoring them would make it impossible to adequately protect the rights of present citizens of all races. Of course what these rights are and how much they should limit the rights of present African Americans to inherit the reparation owed to their ancestors is a question for further study.


  • Aristotle, The Nicomachean Ethics of Aristotle, translated and with an introduction by Sir D. Ross, London: Oxford University Press, 1966.
  • Bedau, H., 1972. “Compensatory Justice and the Black Manifesto”, The Monist, 56: 20–42.
  • Bittker, B., 1973. The Case For Black Reparations, New York: Vintage Books; reprinted Boston: Beacon Press, 2003.
  • –––, 2003, The Case For Black Reparations, Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Boxill, B., 1972. “The Morality of Reparation”, Social Theory and Practice, 2: 113–123.
  • –––, 2003. “The Morality of Reparation II”, in A Companion to African American Philosophy, Tommy Lott and John Pittman (eds.), Malden: Blackwell Publishing Company, 134–147.
  • –––, 2003. “A Lockean Argument for Black Reparations”, Journal of Ethics, 7: 63–91.
  • Brooks, R., 1999. “The Age of Apology”, in R. Brooks (ed.), When Sorry Isn't Enough: The Controversy over Apology and Reparation for Human Injustice, New York: New York University Press, 3–11.
  • Browne, R., 1993. “The Economic Basis for Reparations to Black Americans”, Review of Black Political Economy, 21: 99–110.
  • Cohen, A., 2009. “Compensating Historic Injustices: Completing the Boxill Sher Argument”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 37: 81–102.
  • Corlett, J. A., 2000. “Reparations to Native Americans?”, in War Crimes and Collective Wrongdoing, Alexander Jokic (ed.), London: Blackwell, 236–269.
  • Corlett, J. A., 2003. Race, Racism, and Reparations, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Davis, A., 2001. “The Case for United States Reparations to African Americans”, Transforming Anthropology, 10 (1): 39–43.
  • Feinberg, J., 1978. “Voluntary Euthanasia and the Inalienable Right to Life”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 7: 93–123.
  • Fullinwider, R. K. “The Case for Reparations”, in R. P. Salzberger (ed.), Reparations for Slavery: A Reader, pp. 141–150, Lantham: Roman and Littlefield, 2004.
  • Harrington, M., 1969, “Black Reparations—Two Views”, Dissent, 16 (July/August): 31–320.
  • Horowitz, D., 2003, Uncivil Wars, San Francisco: Encounter Books.
  • Kaufman, A., 1969, “Black Reparations—Two Views”, Dissent, 16 (July/August): 31–320.
  • Kershnar, S., 1999. “Are the Descendants of Slaves Owed Compensation for Slavery?”, Journal of Applied Philosophy, 16: 95–101.
  • –––, 2001. “The Case Against Reparations”, Philosophy in the Contemporary World, 8: 41–46.
  • –––, 2002. “The Inheritance Based Claim to Reparations”, Legal Theory, 8: 243–267.
  • Levin, M., 1980, “Reverse Discrimination, Shackled Runners, and Personal Identity”, Philosophical Studies 37: 137–149.
  • Locke, J. 1689/1988, Two Treatises of Government, P. Laslett (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Locke, J., 1690/1970, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lyons, D., 1977. “The New Indian Land Claims and the original right to land”, Social Theory and Practice, 4: 249–272.
  • –––, 2000. “Making the Case for Racial Reparations: Does America Owe a Debt to the Descendants of its Slaves?”, Harpers Magazine, 11: 37–41.
  • McGary, H., 1977. “Justice and Reparations”, Philosophical Forum, 9: 256–263.
  • –––, 1999. Race and Social Justice, London: Blackwell.
  • McGary, H. and Lawson, B., 1992. Between Slavery and Freedom, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Morris, C., 1984, “Existential Limits to the Rectification of Past Wrongs”, American Philosophical Quarterly 21: 175–182
  • Nozick, R., 1974, Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York: Basic Books.
  • Roberts, R., 2003. “The Morality of a Statute of Limitations on Injustice”, Journal of Ethics, 7: 115–138.
  • –––, 2001. “Why Have the Injustices Perpetrated Against Blacks in America not been Rectified”, Journal of Social Philosophy, 32: 357–373.
  • Robinson, R., 2000, The Debt: What America Owes to Blacks, New York: Penguin.
  • Schedler, G., 2002. “Principles for Measuring the Damages of American Slavery”, Public Affairs Quarterly, 16: 377–404.
  • Sher, G., 1979, “Compensation and Transworld Personal Identity”, The Monist 62: 378–391.
  • –––, 1997. Approximate Justice: Studies in Non-Ideal Theory, Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • –––, 2005. “Transgenerational Compensation”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 33: 181–200.
  • Simmons, A. J., 1995. “Historical Rights and Fair Shares”, Law and Philosophy, 14: 149–184.
  • Thompson, J., 2002. Taking Responsibility for the Past, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Waldron, J., 1992. “Superseding Historic Injustice”, Ethics, 103: 4–28.
  • –––, 2002. “Redressing Historic Injustice”, University of Toronto Law Review, 52: 135–160.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
sep man icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
sep man icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

affirmative action | justice: intergenerational | Locke, John: political philosophy | responsibility: collective

Copyright © 2010 by
Bernard Boxill <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free