Bolzano's Logic

First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Mon Nov 14, 2011

Bernard Bolzano (1781–1848), of Italian-German origin, was born and died in Prague. He spent his entire life in Bohemia (today part of the Czech Republic), which remained part of the Austrian Empire until 1918. He studied philosophy, mathematics and theology and became a Catholic priest and professor of the science of religion at the University of Prague. He devoted his life to the reform of the backward semi-feudal Austrian society and of the a priori sciences: logic, mathematics and theology. Because of his unorthodox views on the constitution and the government, he was removed in 1819 from the University and spent the rest of his life in retirement writing treatises on the theory of science (1837), mathematics (Grössenlehre, manuscript not yet completely published), Science of Religion (1834), a utopia On the Best State (published only in 1932) and the posthumous Paradoxes of the infinite (1851).

Bolzano's presentation of logic is embedded in the vast Theory of Science (henceforth TS). His logic is based on the abstract concepts of propositions and ideas in themselves (an sich), which are independent of thought and language. His logic of ideas contains a new treatment of their content and extension and, among other things, provides an analysis of ideas without objects. A purely logical definition of intuitions as simple singular ideas allowed Bolzano to distinguish them from concepts and to characterize the traditional epistemological distinction between a priori and a posteriori in terms of the logical distinction between conceptual and empirical propositions (and sciences). The main innovations of Bolzano's logic consist in the definitions of validity, analyticity and logical truth, and the creation of a complete system of extensional relations between propositions, the most important of these being compatibility, deducibility (= consequence), and equivalence. Bolzano discovered the link between deducibility and conditional probability, according to which deducibility and incompatibility appear as two limit cases of conditional probability (this idea was taken over or reinvented by Wittgenstein in the Tractatus). Deductive logic is thus extended to inductive logic based on probability. Bolzano's theory of the grounding relation (Abfolge) leading to a hierarchical order of theorems is the first modern study of axiomatic systems. Morover, the thorough discussions of concepts of logic and many other insights contribute to make the TS one of the classical works in logic and epistemology, on a par with those of Aristotle, Leibniz, and Frege. The extensive historical notes contained in it are a unique source for the history of logic. Although written in natural language, Bolzano's logic represents a decisive breakthrough in the development of modern logic.

1. Towards a new logic

In 1810, Bolzano published a booklet entitled Contributions to a better founded presentation of mathematics (Beyträge…, Russ 2004) where he developed his views about the unsatisfactory state of the mathematics of his time and the need for its reform. He proposed a new definition of mathematics as “the science which deals with the general laws (forms) to which things must conform in their existence” (Bolzano 1810, I, § 8; Russ 2004, 94), a new division of mathematics into universal mathematics (arithmetic, algebra, analysis and elements of his future theory of collections) and particular mathematical disciplines (mathematical theory of time, geometry and mechanics), and also put forth some considerations on logic. As with Leibniz, logic is again seen as closely connected with mathematics.

The logical theory of the Contributions is still fairly traditional, sometimes Kantian in spite of Bolzano's criticisms, but it contains some important innovations. Following Aristotle, Bolzano distinguished two sorts of proofs: those which show that something is the case and those which also show why it is so. He called the former “certifications” (Russ 2004, 254: “confirmations”) [Gewissmachungen], the latter “groundings” [Begründungen]. The concept of grounding reflects the “objective dependence among truths” [objektiver Zusammenhang der Wahrheiten]. It would later become the fundamental concept in Bolzano's treatment of axiomatic theories in the TS. Another innovation consisted in the criteria for the correctness of proofs and in the treatment of simple, undefinable concepts. On one hand, already in the Betrachtungen Bolzano pointed out that he “could never be satisfied with a completely strict proof if it were not derived from the same concepts which the thesis to be proved contained” (Russ 2004, 32). On the other hand, “[…] in any correct proof of [the] proposition all characteristics of the subject must be used, i.e., they must be applied in the derivation of the predicate” (Bolzano 1810, II, § 28; Russ 2004, 122–123). With Aristotle, Bolzano prohibits crossing from one genus to another in demonstrations. Proofs of theorems of mathematical analysis such as his proof of the intermediate value theorem (Bolzano 1817) must not contain concepts alien to the domain of investigation; in the case of this theorem, one must not introduce geometrical or kinematic considerations to prove a theorem of universal (pure) mathematics.

According to Bolzano, a mathematical theory should be presented in the form of an axiomatic theory, whose propositions are deduced from previous propositions according to their objective dependence and eventually from the axioms. Axioms are not necessarily evident truths and intuition has no place either in the proofs or the axioms. An axiom is simply an indemonstrable proposition from which other propositions may be deduced. A science thus becomes an autonomous, ordered system of propositions, independent of the human mind; the goal of foundational research is to discover and to reproduce this objective order.

A further important innovation consists in the treatment of simple, undefinable concepts. How do we understand them? Our understanding

is brought about by mentioning several sentences, in which the concept in question, designated by its own word, appears in various combinations. From the comparison of these sentences, the reader is able to abstract which determinate concept the word designates. […] This means is well known as that by which each of us learned the first meanings of words in our mother tongue (Bolzano 1910, II, § 8; Russ 2004, 107; here Rusnock's 2000 translation).

Bolzano called such circumlocutions “paraphrases” or “circumscriptions” [Umschreibungen]. His method points to a solution of the paradox of definition according to which all concepts are ultimately defined in terms of simple concepts, but these remain undefined and thus devoid of meaning.

2. Logic as Theory of Science

Bolzano's new logic responded to the needs of both mathematics and the “science of religion” which Bolzano taught from 1805 to 1819. In 1812, profoundly dissatisfied with the state of logic, Bolzano conceived the project of a new logic which would lead to a “total transformation of the a priori sciences”. The idea of the “objective connection of truths”, based on the grounding relation of consequence [Abfolge] was the core of the project. The Theory of Science, published in 1837, marks the realization of the project, enlarged in the broader context of general epistemology and methodology of science.

Bolzano defined the theory of science by its ultimate goal, which is the division of human knowledge into disciplines and the composition of scientific treatises. According to the definition, the theory of science is “the aggregate of all rules which we must follow when we divide the total domain of truths into individual sciences, and represent them in their respective treatises” (Bolzano 1973, 2–3). Bolzano calls this last part of the TS the Theory of Science Proper.

This definition presupposes a whole sequence of disciplines involved in the construction of a science, each of which is founded on the preceding. The ultimate discipline in this sequence deals with the classification of sciences and the principles of style of scientific writing that should lead to the composition of a series of scientific treatises forming an encyclopedia. Bolzano hoped that, following the Great Encyclopedia of Diderot and D'Alembert, the ideal of the Enlightenment, the effort to spread scientifically organized useful knowledge would again find its finest expression in the completion of an encyclopedia. In this way, the TS, “in accordance with the laws of morality” (Bolzano 1972, 3), would contribute to the general well-being.

In order to divide truths into different disciplines and present them in particular treatises, we first have to discover them. Such is the goal of the art of discovery [Erfindungskunst] or heuristics, which yields the rules for finding new truths. Heuristics presupposes the possibility of recognizing truths, which is the object of the theory of knowledge [Erkenntnislehre]. Now, the decisive step in the exploration of the layers of science leads to the most important part of the TS, the theory of elements, which analyses the objective conditions of the subjective activity of knowing, namely the theory of ideas, propositions and deduction, in short: formal logic. The Theory of Fundamentals shows that these elements are propositions in themselves and ideas in themselves, that there are infinitely many truths in themselves and that we can know at least some of them. Taking all the disciplines of the TS in the due order, we obtain the following structure:

  • Theory of fundamentals (Fundamentallehre, vol. I),
  • Theory of elements (Elementarlehre), i.e., formal logic (vol. I-II),
  • Theory of knowledge (Erkenntnislehre, vol. III),
  • Heuristics (Erfindungskunst oder Heuristik, vol. III),
  • Theory of science proper (eigentliche Wissenschaftslehre), i.e., the theory of the division of the truths into particular sciences and the principles of composition for scientific treatises (vol. IV).

3. Some fundamental concepts

Bolzano's terminology often differs from current logical usage. For a proper understanding of Bolzano's logic, it is thus necessary to keep in mind Bolzano's fundamental distinctions and definitions. This is why the presentation of Bolzano's logic must begin with the examination of several preliminary concepts.

The expression “in itself” [an sich] is applied only to propositions and ideas, never to things or metaphysical objects such as the soul or God. Only logical objects are “in themselves”. The determination “in itself” or “as such” (a translation proposed recently by Jan Berg) with its synonym “objective” means that we take an object without any other qualification, independently of its being thought or expressed linguistically. Bolzano's term for ideas in themselves is ‘representations in themselves’ [Vorstellungen an sich], and he even speaks of intuitions in themselves; he is aware of the incongruity of such a designation, but he has no other term to propose.

For what we call – after Tarski – logical consequence, Bolzano uses the word deducibility (Ableitbarkeit, literally derivability, but it is a sort of semantical relation). He calls consequence or entailment [Abfolge] the ground-consequence relation [Grund und Folge]; with Rusnock (Bolzano 2004), I translate Abfolge by grounding. In English, the same word grounding is also used for Begründung which is the objective proof, objektiver Beweis, carried out by means of the grounding relation [Abfolge]. Thus, grounding translates both the Abfolge relation between the ground and the consequence, and Begründung, the complete objective proof.

Bolzano has two words to designate properties: Beschaffenheit and Eigenschaft. In translation, the difference often disappears, but it is possible to capture it by translating Beschaffenheit by “attribute”. An Eigenschaft is a property in the strict sense; “attribute” is the general term for both properties and relations, and also covers the states and structure of an object. The ‘Beschaffenheit’ of a thing means how it is beschaffen, made, organized, arranged, structured, constituted. Nevertheless, often Beschaffenheit simply designates an Eigenschaft, a property.

There are two fundamental kinds of objects in Bolzano's ontology: the real ones, localized in space and time and subject to causality, and the non-real, logical and mathematical objects. Real objects are further divided into external and internal, subjective (mental events). Thus, we have the first world of external, material things, the second world of subjective states (mental events) and the third realm of abstract meanings and mathematical objects; nevertheless, the ultimate ontological division is between the real world containing substances, their collections, states and properties, and the abstract realm of logical and mathematical objects.

One can only say of real objects that they exist or have being in the proper sense [Existenz, Dasein, Sein]. Bolzano marks the difference in the modes of being of real and non-real objects by saying that “there are [es gibt] non-real objects”, although they do not exist. With Bergmann 1970 and other critics who stress that we do not have different concepts of existence according to the nature of the objects, I shall in both cases use the word “exist”.

Both kinds of being, real and non real, can nevertheless be expressed by means of an important second-level concept: objectuality [Gegenständlichkeit], a property of ideas expressing existential quantification, the property of having an object. The idea of a function is just as objectual as the idea of a horse, but in the case of the idea of a horse, one may add that it is an idea of a real being. The idea of a round square is objectless, without object, not instantiated, because the existence of round squares implies a contradiction. The idea of a golden mountain is objectless for empirical reasons.

Surprisingly, Bolzano lacks a theory of quantification. He knows better than other mathematicians of his time how to treat quantifiers in his mathematical work (he was, for example, the first to give a viable definition of continutity, and to formulate the Bolzano-Cauchy criterion for the convergence of infinite series) but he gives no theoretical treatment of quantifiers in his logic. He considers that it is not necessary to prefix a universal quantifier to universal propositions. “Man is mortal” differs from “All men are mortal” only in grammatical expression; both sentences express the same proposition. Existential quantification is reduced to objectuality, a property of second order. “There are inhabitants on other planets” becomes “The idea of an inhabitant on other planets is objectual”.

4. Propositions and truths in themselves

Bolzano's first important innovation in the TS, which is at the same time the most controversial, aims at the transformation of the domain of logic. According to him, logic is not a theory of ideas and judgments in our mind, it is not an art de pensée in the sense of Arnauld's and Nicole's Logic of Port-Royal or an exposition of the laws of thought. Logic is the theory of formal relations between propositions in themselves (Sätze an sich; Bolzano also uses as a synonym “objective propositions”; here I shall simply use the term “proposition”). Bolzano does not succeed in defining what objective propositions are; he can only characterize them by a set of specific properties (see Berg 1962). In contradistinction to judgments, which are mental acts, and to sentences, which are sequences of signs of a language, propositions form the “matter” of a thought or of a judgment as well as the meaning or sense (Sinn) of a sentence. Bolzano points out that ‘to be in itself’ is not a new property of propositions or ideas; it means simply to take a proposition or an idea as it is, independently of its being grasped or expressed by a human being. Conversely, thinking and speaking involve ‘grasping ’ (in the metaphorical sense) the meaning and expressing it.

One will gather what I mean by proposition as soon as I remark that I do not call a proposition in itself or an objective proposition that which the grammarians call a proposition, namely, the linguistic expression, but rather simply the meaning of this expression, which must be exactly one of the two, true or false; and that accordingly I attribute existence to the grasping of a proposition, to thought propositions as well as to the judgments made in the mind of a thinking being (existence, namely, in the mind of the one who thinks this proposition and who makes the judgment); but the mere proposition in itself (or the objective proposition) I count among the kinds of things that do not have any existence whatsoever, and never can attain existence (Bolzano 2004, 40–41).

Like mathematical objects, propositions are non-mental and non-linguistic intensional entities; they do not belong to the real world, but rather, as Bolzano puts it, to “the realm of those things which make no claim to reality” (Russ 2004, 607). Contrary to other intensional objects, each proposition has a truth value, true or false. The best approach to Bolzano's concept of proposition (and of idea in itself) is to consider them as forming the universal realm of abstract meanings, from which each language selects specific meanings and associates signs with them.

Against psychologism, especially that of Kant, Herbart, and others, Bolzano propounded the concept of a proposition in order to prevent the interpretation of logical objects as mental entities. Bolzano's arguments in favor of the existence of propositions invoke the existence of unknown truths or of truths that nobody except God will ever know (a truth is simply a true proposition). Such is, for instance, the truth that a certain tree had determinate number of flowers last spring. But God's knowledge of that number does not mean that propositions depend on his mind: propositions and truths, not being real, are not created by him. “Something is true not because God knows that it is so; on the contrary, God knows that it is so because in fact it is so ” (Bolzano 1837, I, § 25, 113–115). The proposition “God exists” is not true because God thinks it; God thinks this because it is true.

The most plausible argument in favor of the existence of propositions deals with mathematical truths: the Pythagorean theorem, for example, is true independently of the language in which it is formulated, and does not even depend on the existence of thinking beings. According to Morscher (1973), Bolzano wanted to guarantee the objectivity and universality of logic by means of propositions.

Already during his life, Bolzano was obliged to defend his theory of propositions against the attacks of Franz Exner, who wrote to Bolzano: “Every truth exists only in the consciousness of an individual, in an individual understanding, nowhere else and in no other way” (Bolzano 2004, 85). Exner also speaks of the “ghostly being” of propositions. Exner objected that Bolzano's theory of propositions makes it a mystery how human beings, who belong to the real world, grasp immaterial meanings. Bolzano replied that “the word ‘grasp’ as well as all similar words [… ] are only figurative expressions used in the hope that anyone who understands the language can gather from the whole context which simple [or almost simple] concepts” are designated with these words (Bolzano 2004, 162). Against Exner, again and again he puts forward as argument the existence of unknown truths and the existence of meanings independent of any particular language.

Much later, Frege, the early Husserl, Church and Heinrich Scholz advanced ideas similar to those of Bolzano, while Wittgenstein, Schlick, Patočka, Quine and others presented objections based on the analysis of human, subjective representations and the use of language. In his Metaphysics of Meaning, Jerrold Katz exposed an essentially Bolzanian theory showing how to respond to Wittgensteinian and Quinian arguments: the meanings constitute a universal field from which every language selects its own meanings, not necessarily the same for all languages. A balanced position is expressed in Rusnock (2000, 115):

[…] the question may fairly be asked whether Bolzano's view on logical objects can be usefully adapted to the modern setting – that is […] whether the notion of proposition is still useful. […] In my opinion, this question turns mainly on the issue of whether or not formal language theory is judged to have given an exhaustive description of possible forms of meaningfulness. If so, it would seem that propositions as entities over and above formal expressions would yield nothing that one did not already possess in a more precise form. On the other hand, if the question of analysis of possible forms of meaning remains open, then Bolzano's position, suitably adapted, becomes more reasonable. And the latter, it seems to me, is closer to the truth. […] when considerations of tractability, perspicuity, elegance, etc. are introduced, the question becomes once again interestingly open.

Bozano's concept of proposition also includes orders, questions and expressions of desire. A question like “Is Newton's law of universal gravitation an a priori truth?” means “I want to know if Newton's law of universal gravitation is an a priori truth” and it has a truth value. Here and in similar cases, Bolzano confuses the question of truth with the sincerity of the speaker.

What is truth? Truths are true propositions. Bolzano's theory is essentially Aritotelian: true propositions “state things as they are” (Bolzano 1837, I, § 25, 112; 1973, 56). A proposition is true if it says how things are. More precisely,

A proposition is true when it attributes to a subject a predicate that it possesses, or (in other words) when every object that stands under the subject concept of the proposition has an attribute that stands under the predicate concept (Bolzano 2004, 167).

This formulation is linked to the canonical form of all propositions “A has (the attribute) b” (see below). A proposition is true iff the object represented by the subject-idea has an attribute represented by the predicate-idea. Moreover, empirical propositions must contain determinations of space and time. Without these determinations, the sentence “It is snowing” has no truth value, it is just a propositional form which does not correspond to a complete proposition; “in order to be true, [such propositions] require the addition of such specifications as to time (and often place as well), ‘It is snowing today, in this place’” (Bolzano 1973, 57).

There are infinitely many truths in themselves. Bolzano proposed several proofs for this claim, the simplest being the following. Let us take as a first proposition p, e.g., that “there is no truth”. Then if p is true, it is our first truth; if p is false, some other proposition is true, e.g. non-p. Thus there is at least one truth. Now, “ ‘p’ is true” is our second truth, different from the first one, because it has a different subject and different predicate than those of p; ‘ “ ‘p’ is true” is true’ is our third truth, and so on ad infinitum. If p if false, we have the same argument starting with non-p. Other proofs, by complete induction, are more sophisticated, but hardly more convincing.

5. Ideas and relations between ideas

Traditional logic begins with concepts or ideas, moves on to judgments and ends with reasoning (syllogisms, arguments). Bolzano reversed this order with regard to ideas and propositions. Propositions are composed of ideas, but for Bolzano, propositions are primary, undefined objects, and ideas in themselves [Vorstellungen an sich; hereafter just ideas in contradistinction to subjective ideas] are defined as parts of propositions that are not themselves propositions. This is an important innovation, which appears already in Kant (see Coffa 1981 and 1992), because it allows one to grasp the meaning of a term in a sentence from the context of the whole sentence, and authorizes concept formation from sentential forms obtained from propositions by declaring one or several of its components variable.

Ideas do not have truth values. They can nevertheless contain whole propositions as parts, e.g., the idea of “the man who discovered that the planets have elliptic orbits”. They have the same ontological status as propositions: they are the “stuff” of subjective ideas, they do not belong to the real world, they can only be grasped by a mind and thus be thought by means of subjective ideas. “To every subjective idea belongs an objective one” (Bolzano 1837, § 271) which is what is thought by the subjective idea.

5.1 The content of an idea

Ideas can be simple or composed of other ideas. The non-ordered set or the sum of the parts of a complex idea is its content. The parts of an idea form a sum, i.e., according to Bolzano's definition, a collection in which “the parts of a part are parts of the whole”. His definition means that the content of an idea is invariant with respect to substitutions of the system or sequence of simpler parts of a part for that part. Thus, substituting “divisible by 2” for “even” in “even number”, we obtain “number divisible by 2” which has the same content.

On the other hand, two different ideas may have the same content. “The learned son of an unlearned father” and “the unlearned son of a learned father” for instance have the same content. An idea is therefore not determined solely by its content. Its complete determination requires its content and the order of the parts. In their ultimate form, many ideas are systems or sequences of simple ideas which form their content. Nevertheless, in certain ideas having the form “A which has the properties b, b′, b″,…”, no linear ordering is supposed between the parts b, b′, b″,….

All complex ideas can in principle be analyzed into their ultimate parts which are simple. Bolzano does not give a list of simple ideas but occasionally conjectures that a given idea is simple. Among others, the following ideas are claimed to be simple: “something”, “attribute”, “being”, “composition” (Zusammengesetzheit, which is the primitive idea allowing one to define collections and sets as “something which has composition”), “to grasp or apprehend”, “not”, “ought”.

5.2 Definitions

There are a variety of ways of conveying the meaning of expressions. Definitions in a broad sense start with explanations, and explanations are divided into contextual definitions of simple concepts (or of concepts that we are not able to define) and definitions in the strict sense, namely the decompositions of a concept into its parts. Each concept has a unique definition. A given decomposition may or may not attain the ultimate parts, but different partial decompositions and the complete decomposition into ultimate parts define the same concept. As we have seen, already before Gergonne and Jeremy Bentham, Bolzano advanced the idea of contextual definitions in the Contributions (1810): we grasp the meaning of a simple idea “from the use or the context” (Russ 2004, 107; the quotation is from Bolzano 1837, IV, 547). Complete determinations are similar to definitions: they state an exclusive, characteristic property of an object and yield thus a concept equivalent to the defined concept.

Another important division concerns the division of attributes [Beschaffenheiten] into internal properties, expressed by monadic predicates, and external properties, i.e. relations, which in fact correspond to internal properties of the whole composed from the related parts. In the fundamental idiom, which approximates closely the structure of propositions, “A is the father of B” should be translated as “The whole which contains A and B has the following property: the first element is the father of the second”. In fact, Bolzano transfers the weight of the relation to the predicate. Here are two examples of something which looks like a property but is in fact a relation: the attribute of being prime, which is a relation between a prime number and all other natural numbers, and sensible qualities, which are not internal properties but relations between external things and sense organs. Thus, “a is red” becomes “in relation to our sense organ of vision, a is red.”

Two theorems, or rather simply observations, govern Bolzano's theory of ideas. They invalidate theories of some of Bolzano's contemporaries or predecessors by means of counterexamples. 1) The parts of an idea are not necessarily the ideas of the parts of their object. In the example “roof of a house”, the idea “house” is not the idea of a part of the roof of the house. 2) The parts of an idea are not always ideas of the properties of their object. The idea “√2”, for instance has parts such as “root”, “square”, “of” and “2”, but none of the infinity of its properties is represented by any of these parts. In any case, many complex ideas contain also logical particles (e.g. “which”, “of”) that connect their parts and can be neither ideas of the parts nor ideas of the properties of the object. Both observations show that the traditional formation of concepts by mere agglomeration of characters does not exhaust the multiple ways that concepts are formed. Moreover, both refute not only all naive picture theories of knowledge, but also, as Joëlle Proust (1999) has noted, the Leibnizian idea of isomorphism between signs and things. The examples quoted by Bolzano show that there is no direct correspondence between the composition of things and the compositions of the ideas that represent them. Ideas are not images of their objects.

5.3 Ideas and objects

The relation of an idea to its object is primitive, hence indefinable relation. Ideas may have or represent or refer to one or more objects; these are called objectual [gegenständlich]. Others represent no object, they are objectless, empty [gegenstandslos, leer]. Bolzano supposes that for any object there is an idea that represents it uniquely. An idea of an idea is called symbolic.

Examples of the first kind: ideas like “Greek” (each Greek is one of its objects), “black”, “universe”, “prime number”; of the second kind are ideas like “nothing”, “round square”, “regular pentahedron”, “golden mountain” (empirically empty), logical particles such as “has” or “which”, and curiously also ideas of “imaginary” (complex) numbers like √−1. Objects of ideas may be real, e.g. real beings or their properties (“man”, “virtue”), but also not real, as in the case of logical and mathematical objects (“proposition”, “deducibility”, “number”, “function”). Altogether, we have the following relations:

  • subsumption, a primitive relation between an object and an idea (an object is subsumed under an idea if that idea represents it, e.g. Socrates is subsumed under the idea “philosopher”),
  • subordination, a relation between ideas defined in terms of subsumption (an idea is subordinate to another idea if all objects subsumed under the former idea are subsumed under the latter but not conversely, e.g. “Greek” is subordinate to “European”),
  • part relation between ideas, an idea is a part of another idea (e.g. “rational” is a part of the idea “rational animal”),
  • grasping relation, a primitive relation between minds, and ideas and propositions (e.g., Plato grasps the idea of the supreme good, Bolzano grasps the proposition “Some continuous functions are nowhere differentiable”).

Before Frege, Husserl and others, Bolzano carefully distinguished between subsumption (in set-theoretical terminology: to be an element of a set) and subordination (to be a subset).

5.4 Extension

Loosely speaking, the extension of an idea is “the collection of all the objects falling under it” (Bolzano 2004, 46), but strictly speaking, it is “that attribute of an idea by virtue of which it represents just these objects and no others” (Bolzano 1973, 104). That particular internal property mediates the association of a collection (the extension) with an idea. In this manner, Bolzano wants to stress the internal link between ideas and their extensions, and the uniqueness of the extension of each idea (Bolzano 1973, 105).

The fact that the idea of prime number represents all prime numbers is thus an internal property of this idea, that is, it is not a relation (the concept of prime number is a relational one, but its extension is a property). In practice, however, Bolzano takes the extension of an idea to be a collection of all its objects.

Each objectual idea has a unique extension, and only objectual ideas have an extension (in other words, Bolzano does not recognize the empty collection or set).

Objectual ideas are divided into singular (e.g., “God”, “universe”, “Aristotle”, “my actual intuition of the pleasant fragrance of this rose”, “even prime number”) and general (“animal”, “substance”, “quantity”).

Against the law of inverse relation between content and extension of ideas, advocated by logicians since Arnauld and Nicole's Port-Royal Logic, Bolzano invokes the existence of redundant ideas (e.g., “ triangular figure which has angles”) and of contradictory ideas, which have content, but no extension. The following example aroused criticism and even provoked a controversy (see Sebestik 1992, 151–152): the idea “man who knows all living European languages” has at the same time a larger content and a larger extension than the idea “man who knows all European languages”. Rusnock (2000) proposed a less controversial example: the idea “1” has both smaller content and smaller extension than the idea “solution of the equation x2 = 1”. The rule of the inverse relation between content and extension nevertheless holds in the case of concepts formed by the conjunction of characteristics.

5.5 Intuitions and concepts

Bolzano takes over Kant's distinction between two kinds of ideas, intuitions and concepts, but rejects Kant's definitions. For Bolzano, a pure concept is an idea that is not an intuition and does not contain an intuition as a part. To these two kinds, Bolzano adds a third: the mixed ideas, which contain both concepts and intuitions as parts. As pure concepts play an important role in Bolzano's theory of science, mathematics, for example, being a purely conceptual science, everything depends on how intuitions are defined.

Although many subjective intuitions are indirectly produced by the action of an external object that causes a sensation in us, they correspond to ideas in themselves. There are intuitions in themselves because intuitions can be parts of propositions and thus have the same objective status as other ideas. For this reason, Bolzano cannot define them by means of subjective intuitions, which are mental events. He advances a definition in purely objective terms: an intuition is nothing other than a simple singular idea, simple with respect to content, singular with respect to extension.

According to Kant, intuitions are singular (subjective) representations, but according to his definition, even ideas expressed by a proper name like “Alexander the Great” or “Sirius” would be intuitions. Bolzano's subjective intuitions are just ideas of the immediate effect of an external object on our sensibility; they represent the change aroused in ourselves on that occasion. Subjective intuitions are representations of sensations and other mental events, and intuitions in themselves their objective counterparts. The object of an intuition is always real, but one should not confuse it with the external object. The singular idea of a physical object, e.g. the idea “Alexander the Great”, cannot be an intuition, because it contains both intuitions and concepts. In fact, we infer the existence of an external object from the intuitions we receive due to its causal action. “[…] we infer that there is an outer object acting on us only because a certain change in our inner self takes place, a change that we interpret as the object's effect on us.” (Bolzano 2004, 50). Expressed in words, an intuition is the idea of “this, which occurs in me just now, which I just now see or hear or feel” and its object is just “that change that then takes place in us” and nothing else (ibid.). The uniqueness of that change means that its idea is singular.

Despite the fact that verbal expressions of intuitions usually contain several words, intuitions are simple ideas. In fact, the only word that designates an intuition is the demonstrative “this” [dies], the rest of the expression being just a redundancy, because “the object that it represents remains throughout the same single one, whether we think the additions or not” (ibid. 51). Thus, in the idea “this red”, the part “red” does nothing to narrow the extension; the remaining part, “this”, is simple and, being singular, is an intuition.

As a consequence, concepts may be singular, but complex (e.g. “God”, “7”), or simple but either objectless or general (i.e., having no object at all or more than one) (“round square” has no object, “proposition” has infinitely many objects). Proper names, which can be expressed by means of definite descriptions, always designate mixed ideas; the intuitions present in the idea “Socrates”, for example, might represent the sounds of which the name is composed.

Propositions containing only pure concepts are called conceptual propositions; those containing intuitions are called empirical propositions. This classification of propositions, founded only on the structural properties of ideas, is the logical counterpart of Kant's distinction between a priori and a posteriori judgments, which is relative to the origin of the ideas that occur in them and defined in subjective terms (TS, §§ 133, 306).

5.6 Extensional relations between ideas: the logic of classes

Of the two main parts of Bolzano's formal logic, the extensional logic of ideas (the logic of classes) and the extensional logic of propositions, the first part comes from a long tradition beginning with Boethius (and derived from Aristotelian syllogistic) and ending – in Bolzano's times – with Gergonne. Bolzano did not take his logic of ideas from Gergonne or Euler, the most influential authors in their time, but rather from a small booklet (Grundriss der Logik) by a now completely forgotten logician, J.G.E. Maass, published in 1806 (4th ed. 1823).

Bolzano's fundamental schema of extensional relations between ideas can already be found in Maass' Logic. Bolzano made some modifications and generalized it to relations between classes of ideas and also to relations between empty (objectless) ideas. This last generalization is important for Bolzano's propositional logic: the relations between empty ideas are defined by means of the method of variation that appears here for the first time in the TS.

Bolzano defined a system of relations between the extensions of ideas. The first relations he defines are compatibility [Verträglichkeit] and its negation, incompatibility. Two ideas A and B are compatible if they have (represent) at least one object in common, i.e., if at least one object falls under both A and B. In the case in which not only some but all objects represented by A are also represented by B, A is included in B. If this relation is reciprocal, i.e., if A is included in B and B included in A, the ideas A and B are equivalent (coextensive). Further, we have two special cases: proper compatibility, i.e., compatibility where neither A is included in B, nor B in A; this relation is called by Bolzano overlapping or linking [Verschlungenheit oder Verkettung]. Another is subordination [Unterordnung] which is proper inclusion, without reciprocity.

The negative cases give rise to three kinds of incompatibility: exclusion (omnilateral incompatibility), contradiction and contrariety (incompatibility without contradiction). Exclusion [Ausschliessung] differs from incompatibility only in comparing three or more ideas or collections of ideas: the ideas A, B, C, … exclude each other if they are incompatible and if not even two of them are compatible with each other. To define contradiction, Bolzano needs also the universal class which is the extension of the concept “something in general” [Etwas überhaupt].

As all these relations are derived from compatibility and its negation, it is possible to represent both the relations between ideas and those between propositions in the form of a genealogical tree (see Sebestik 1992 and 1992a). Here are only the definitions of the most important of them for pairs of objectual ideas, written in our symbolic language (the objectuality condition excludes the definition of contradiction for ideas having the broadest possible extension).

A is compatible with B  =df  ext A ∩ ext B ≠ ∅
A is incompatible with B  =df  ext A ∩ ext B = ∅
A is included in B  =df  A is compatible with B and ext A ⊂ ext B
A is contradictory with B  =df  A is incompatible with B and ext A ∪ ext B = universal class
A is equivalent to B  =df  A is included in B and B is included in A
A is contrary to B  =df  A and B are incompatible but not contradictory

6. The method of variation

6.1 Propositions and propositional forms

Bolzano's logic of extensional relations between propositions represents a major innovation which has no equivalent in traditional logic. It is based on what is called the method of variation. Its fundamental concepts are defined by means of propositional or rather sentential form.

The method of variation consists in the substitution of appropriate ideas for variables at the places indicated by some sentential form and the examination of the truth values of the resulting propositions. According to Bolzano, logical relations imply some variation in the propositions which they connect. The sentential form [Satzform] is a linguistic expression obtained from a proposition, or rather from a sentence which expresses it, by considering some of its parts variable.

This characteristic Bolzanian concept has, so to speak, two faces. Sometimes, Bolzano expresses it by means of letters: “A has [the property] b” or “A is B”. But very often, he simply writes “Caius has wisdom and in this proposition, the idea Caius is variable”. These two ways of writing correspond to two different levels. On the first, linguistic level, we deal with proper sentential forms, i.e., with expressions containing variables, which become sentences (and express propositions) after appropriate substitutions are made. When we write sentential forms, we do not write incomplete propositions, because there are no such entities. We write only “satzähnliche Verbindungen”, combinations of signs which resemble propositions. The second level is the level of propositions and ideas in themselves, the level of meaning. Here, Bolzano cannot use variables, letters or other indeterminate signs. In the realm of the propositions and ideas in themselves, there are no indeterminate entities that would correspond to sentential forms; there are only propositions, true or false. This might be the reason for Bolzano's cumbersome way of speaking about “the idea Caius considered variable”. For Bolzano, the use of genuine sentential forms is just a convenient linguistic procedure yielding results which can be interpreted in terms of propositions. Speaking of substitutions in sentential forms is then nothing more than a façon de parler about atemporal relations between species of propositions. Bolzano's loose manner of speaking about substitutions of ideas in a sentential form instead of speaking about their linguistic expressions is adopted in what follows. To consider one or several ideas in a given proposition variable means to take the class of all propositions which have the same structure and contain the same ideas except at places occupied by the “variable ideas”. This is the sense of Bolzano's identification of a propositional form with a species or class of propositions, proposed already in the Contributions in 1810, and confirmed by several passages of the TS. A sentential form, or equivalently the corresponding proposition “in which certain ideas are considered variable”, can generate a whole class of propositions if appropriate ideas are substituted for the variable ideas. A proposition which results from such a substitution performed on the given proposition (on the given sentential form) is called a variant. As in the case of mathematical functions, Bolzano insists that speaking about variation is only metaphorical. There is no actual variation, no change in time, only atemporal relations between a proposition, the class of ideas admitted for substitution, and the class of propositions resulting from the successive substitutions. Simultaneous substitutions for several “variable ideas” in the same proposition also have their place in Bolzano's logic.

Which ideas are admitted for variation? Some interpreters (e.g. Siebel 1996, 195) think that a priori, any idea may be considered variable. If, however, we take into account Bolzano's practice, we notice that Bolzano never varies logical and mathematical ideas other than ideas of numbers and quantities, although he never forbids it (one could for instance conceive of the variation of propositional connectives).

Another critical point of Bolzano's theory requires elucidation: the notion of “appropriate” substitution (substitution of appropriate ideas). Bolzano's only explicit criterion is the objectual character of the resulting proposition (i.e., the objectuality of its subject-idea). Some other constraints are needed in his logic of probability: the set of ideas admitted for substitution in a proposition must contain only non-equivalent ideas.

The ideas admitted for substitution cannot transform an objectual proposition into an empty (non-objectual) one. In the proposition “the man Caius is mortal”, I may substitute “Sempronius”, “Titus”, etc. for “Caius” and obtain true propositions. “But if we replace it with another idea, e.g. ‘rose’ or ‘triangle’, then the proposition that emerges not only has no truth, it does not even have objectuality” (Bolzano 1973, 189; I have modified the translation slightly), because their subject-ideas “the man rose” and “the man triangle” are empty. If we begin with the proposition “Caius is mortal”, by contrast, the substitution of “rose” for “Caius” yields an objectual proposition which is moreover true.

Validity and other logical properties and relations are defined only under the assumption of admissible substitutions.

6.2 Validity and analyticity

Two concepts prepare the construction of the logical system: validity and analyticity. When the method of variation is applied to a proposition, three different cases may arise: either the class of propositions obtained by substitution contains only true propositions, or it contains only false propositions, or it contains both true and false propositions. In the first case, the initial proposition is called universally valid (relative to given variables), in the second universally invalid. Bolzano does not give a name to the third case; such propositions could be called neutral. Here are some examples:

The man Caius is mortal

is universally valid relative to the variable idea “Caius” because each appropriate substitution generates a true proposition, or alternatively, because all its objectual variants are true.

The man Caius is omniscient

is universally invalid relative to the same variable idea “Caius”, because all its variants are false.

The same proposition

The man Caius is omniscient

is neutral relative to the variable idea “omniscient”, because some of its variants are true (e.g. the first example quoted) while others are false (the second example).

The degree of validity [Grad der Gültigkeit] of a proposition relative to chosen variables is the ratio of the number of true propositions obtained by variation to the number of all propositions obtained. There may be an infinity of propositions in either case, but here, constraints on the admissible substitutions apply and above all, Bolzano only considers propositions having a finite number of variants. As an example, let us take the proposition “2, which is a number between 1 and 10, is prime” and vary 2: its degree of validity is 2/5. The degree of validity of a proposition is a number from the closed interval [0,1]. It is 1 for valid propositions, 0 for invalid propositions and a proper fraction for other propositions.

Properly speaking, Bolzano's concept of universal validity is not a logical notion. It depends on specifically chosen variables. To obtain what we call a logical truth (Bolzano used the term ‘logically analytic’), he defined another preliminary notion: analyticity. Bolzano's analyticity is not our analyticity, and can be explained as a generalization of his notion of validity (Bolzano's term is “universal validity” [allgemeine Gültigkeit]; as this notion is relative to ideas considered variable, I prefer to use simply the term “validity”). Valid propositions are those whose variants relative to the given variables are all true. Analytic propositions are those which contain at least one variable idea such that the resulting variants are either all true (analytically true propositions) or all false (analytically false propositions). Such a definition implies a very broad conception of analyticity, as is shown by the following example:

A morally evil man enjoys eternal happiness.

It is analytically false, because it contains the idea “man” relative to which all the variants are false.

Beside its own merits (mathematics is full of such propositions), this kind of analyticity is an intermediate step towards logical analyticity. After quoting such examples as “A is A”, “A which is B is A”, “Every object is B or not B”, Bolzano also defines logically analytic propositions. They are propositions whose only invariable parts are logical ideas. The logically analytic true propositions are instances of logical laws.

Bolzano does not give a definition or a list of logical concepts permitting to separate them from non-logical ideas (for a tentative list, see Sebestik 1999, 503–505). He simply says “that nothing is necessary for judging the analytic nature of [the previous examples] besides logical knowledge, because the concepts that make up the invariant part of these propositions all belong to logic” (Bolzano 1973, 193). Nevertheless, he is aware of the difficulty to separate logical and non-logical ideas: the “domain of concepts belonging to logic is not circumscribed to the extent that controversies could not arise at times” (Bolzano 1837, § 148). The main problems arise from the confrontation of Bolzano's definition with his examples. He declares some of them analytic by means of problematic definitions (example: “every effect has a cause”). The examples of § 447 are analytically true: “the soul of Socrates is a simple substance” (the variable idea being “Socrates”), “the angles of an equilateral triangle make altogether two right angles” (analytic with the variable idea “equilateral”), “if a2/2 = b, then a = ± √ 2b” (the variable idea is “2”), but the general truths from which they follow are synthetic: “every soul is a simple substance” (even though a soul is defined as a kind of simple substance), “the angles of each triangle make altogether two right angles”, “if a2/c = b, then a = ± √cb”.

The construction of the system is based on the method of variation: the different logical relations between propositions or classes of propositions are defined by means of relations between classes of their true variants. As in the case of validity, these relations are first defined relative to given variables; afterwards, in some particularly important cases such as deducibility, Bolzano defines them in an absolute way, i.e., relative to all non-logical ideas.

Bolzano's system of extensional propositional logic is closely connected with his extensional logic of ideas. In most cases, the same terminology is used for relations between ideas as for relations between propositions: this is the case for compatibility, subordination, equivalence, exclusion, contradiction, contrariety and others. Moreover, in a crucial passage, Bolzano sets up a correspondence between the truth values of propositions and the objectuality and emptiness of ideas:

With ideas, the crucial question was whether or not a certain object is indeed represented by them; the corresponding question for propositions is whether or not they are true. Just as I have called ideas compatible or incompatible with each other, depending on whether or not they have certain objects in common, so I call propositions compatible or incompatible, depending on whether or not there are certain ideas which make all of them true. (Bolzano 1837, § 154, Rusnock's translation).

How are extensional relations between propositions obtained from those between ideas? In order to transfer the relations between ideas to propositions, Bolzano has to resort to the method of variation: to the referring relation between an idea and its object will then correspond the verifying relation between an idea and a propositional form (or, in the fundamental idiom, between one or more ideas and a proposition in which one or more ideas are considered variable).

Now Bolzano can define compatibility for propositions in complete analogy with compatibility for ideas: The propositions A, B, C, D, … are all mutually compatible with respect to the variable ideas i, j, … common to all of them if there is a sequence of ideas which, substituted for the variables i, j, …, makes all these propositions true (Bolzano 1837, § 154). To the existence (or non-existence) of an object represented by each of the compatible (or incompatible) ideas corresponds the existence (or non-existence) of an idea or a sequence of ideas which make each of the compatible (or incompatible) propositions true.

The examples quoted by Bolzano suggest a simplification of the correspondence between ideas and propositions by applying a concept used by Bolzano on several occasions, though not systematically: the concept of the system of ideas which make given propositions true relative to specified variables (“Inbegriff von Vorstellungen, welche die Sätze A, B, C, D, … wahr machen”; Bolzano 1837, II, § 155, 114, 122 and § 156, 133). More precisely, such a system of verifying ideas VA(i) for the sentential forms A(i) = (A(i, j, …), B(i, j, …), C(i, j, …), …) is the set of the sequences of ideas that make the sentential forms A(i) true (bold letters represent sets or sequences, ordinary letters single predicates or variables). Two examples: the system of verifying ideas for the proposition A “Caesar was a good citizen”, relative to the variable “Caesar”, is VA (Caesar) = {Socrates, Aristeides,. . .}. Such a system for the proposition “Romeo loves Juliet” or, alternatively, for the sentential form “Loves (i, j)” is VL(i, j) = {<Othello, Desdemona>, <Romeo, Juliet>, <Juliet, Romeo>, <Goethe, Lotte>, …}.

Bolzano's examples of compatible propositions are like the following: let A be “a lion is a mammal”, B “a lion has two wings”. Then A and B are compatible with respect to the variable idea “lion”. There is indeed an idea which makes both A and B true; the system of verifying ideas of A and the system of verifying ideas of B contain both the idea “bat”:

VA(lion) = {man, dog, lion, bat, …}, VB(lion) = {swallow, eagle, bat, …}

In this example, the two propositions are compatible because the same idea “bat” makes both true. Bolzano's compatibility is our simultaneous realizability or satisfiability.

Now it is possible to propose the following definition of compatible propositions: Two propositions A and B are compatible if their systems of verifying ideas are compatible in the sense of the logic of classes:

A(i) and B(i) are compatible if VA(i) ∩ VB(i) ≠ ∅.

All extensional logical relations between propositions can now be constructed by means of elementary set-theoretical relations between their systems of verifying ideas. The result is a genealogical tree whose fundamental structure is exactly the same as the structure of the tree representing the relations between ideas. In order to stress the correspondence between ideas and propositions Bolzano uses the same terms (except deducibility) for the relations between ideas and those between propositions. As before, i is the sequence of variable ideas (i, j…); A(i) = (A(i), B(i), C(i), …); M(i) = (M(i), N(i), O(i), …). In the following definitions, variables are omitted; the reader may supply them or may consider the defined relations as logical relations strict sense, all non-logical terms being taken as variables; the systems of verifying ideas have to be adapted accordingly. As in the case of the logic of classes, Bolzano constructed the complete system of extensional relations between propositions; here only the most important ones are given.

A is compatible with M
(VA ∩ VM ≠ ∅)

M is deducible [ableitbar] from A
(the sets of propositions A and M are compatible and VAVM)

A is equivalent to M
(A is deducible from M and M is deducible from A, i.e. VA = VM)

A is incompatible with M
(VAVM = ∅)

A and M are contradictory
A is equivalent to M and A equivalent to ¬M, i.e., VA = V¬M and V¬A = VM)

Bolzano's system of relations between propositions is constructed from the extensional relations between ideas as defined in the Maass-Bolzano logic of classes. The concept of a system of verifying ideas plays a crucial role in the systematic reconstruction of Bolzano's variation logic.

Both the class-logical relations and the relations between propositions are constructed from the initial relation of compatibility by adding specific conditions to previously defined relations. Compatibility is thus the basic relation of Bolzano's extensional logic. It is embedded in the very foundations of his system and all other relations (with the exception of different cases of disjunction, Bolzano 1837, § 160), deducibility included, are special cases of it.

6.3 Deducibility

Bolzano considered the relation of deducibility “the most important concept of logic”. “One especially noteworthy case occurs, however, if not just some, but all of the ideas that, when substituted for i, j, … in A, B, C, … make all these true, also make all of M, N, O, …. true […] with respect to the variable parts i, j, …” (Bolzano 2004, 54). Note that Bolzano's definition, in agreement with Aristotle but contrary to the modern concept of logical consequence, requires compatibility.

For Bolzano, it is impossible to deduce anything from contradictory premises (see Berg 1962 and 1992, 82); in particular, nothing follows from the premise AA.

In the general case, Bolzano's deducibility is a triadic relation between the premises, the conclusion and the variable ideas. Our logic focuses immediately on the variation of all and only non-logical elements, but Bolzano's concept is very useful allowing one to make deductions in a domain whose non-logical concepts are not submitted to variation.

Let us examine some examples:

The relation of deducibility in the general sense holds between the premise:

“Leipzig is north of Dresden (both places being in the northern hemisphere)”,

and the conclusion:

“In winter, the days are shorter in Leipzig than in Dresden”.

Such a deduction works with two variable ideas, “Leipzig” and “Dresden”, and depends also on astronomical knowledge.

The next example shows logical deducibility where the only invariable ideas are logical concepts:

All A are B
It is false that all not-C are not-A
It is false that all C are not-B

(Notice that Bolzano uses the predicate “it is false that” as a synonym for the logical particle “not”. He does not consistently distinguish object- and meta-language).

Bolzano's adherence to Aristotelian tradition has some slight drawbacks. The requirement that the premises be compatible complicates some inferences. Against Herbart and Fries, Bolzano thinks that contraposition requires a supplementary premise: From “all X are Y”, it is possible to deduce “all not-Y are not-X” only if we add as premise “the idea not-Y is not empty”.

6.4 Bolzano's deducibility and Tarski's logical consequence

Tarski's concept of logical consequence is close to Bolzano's logical deducibility. Tarski's first formulation in terms of substitution is even simply a paraphrase of Bolzano's definition. Tarski speaks about the replacement of all non-logical constants by any other constants in the sentences of the class K and in the sentence X, the result of these replacements being K′ and X′, and states that “the sentence X′ must be true provided only that all sentences of the class K′ are true” (Tarski 1983, 415). This preliminary formulation must, however, be abandoned, if “the language we are dealing with does not posses a sufficient stock of extra-logical constants” (ibid.). Bolzano escapes this objection, because his logic deals with ideas in themselves and not with linguistic expressions, and because he assumes that for every object there is an idea that represents it (the difficulties involved with this assumption were discussed in detail by Simons (1987, 42), Siebel (1996, 216–223), and Sebestik (1999, 501, note 34); briefly, the price for this hypothesis seems too high for a contemporary logician). Tarski, who did not make Bolzano's assumption with respect to languages, stated his definitive formulation in terms of models, or the satisfaction of sentential functions by sequences of objects.

There are three main differences between Bolzano's and Tarski's concepts.

  1. Tarski defined logical consequence for formalized languages, while Bolzano's deducibility holds for propositions and ideas in themselves expressed in natural language. According to Berg (1973, 21), “this difference is of vital importance for the study of the relationship between consequence and other logical notions”, which resulted e.g. in the equivalence between logical consequence and syntactic derivability in first order logic and, in general, the separation of syntax and semantics. Nevertheless, fundamentally, Bolzano's deducibility is a semantic notion because it operates with the idea of “making true a propositional form”. Above all, slightly modified, Bolzano's relevant theorems remain true in Tarski's system.
  2. Tarski, as other authors before him, rejected the condition of compatibility of the premises. It is precisely this condition which makes Bolzano's system cumbersome and more complicated than ours. We shall see that this condition was essential for Bolzano's concept of probability and for the link between deductive and inductive logic.
  3. Bolzano's method of variation operates within one universe, while in modern semantics, we generalize both over interpretations and domains (Berg, 1973, 21).

Marc Siebel tried to show that “the resemblances between Bolzanian deducibility and Tarski's logical consequence are quite limited [sehr gering]” (1996, 185–223), considering the distance that separates Bolzano's and Tarski's concepts. I agree with Siebel that it is a question of appraisal [eine Ermessungsfrage]. If we take into account not the initial Bolzanian concept of deducibility relative to given variable ideas, but logical derivability, and either adapt or cancel the requirement of consistency of the premises, the distance seems rather short. For me, the main reasons for thinking the two conceptions to be quite similar are the facts that in all logical literature between Bolzano and Tarski (with the possible exception of Carnap), we cannot find anything else so close to Tarski, and that many of Bolzano's theorems about deducibility may be easily translated into Tarski's idiom and remain true.

6.5 Exact deducibility

Bolzano tried to refine the concept of deducibility by adapting it to the then-current inferential practices in science. The result is the concept of exact or strict, adequate, irredundant deducibility [genaue, genau bemessene Ableitbarkeit] or deducibility in the narrower sense, where there are no idle elements. The proposition M is exactly deducible from the premises A, B, C, … if M is deducible from those premises and “when the same does not hold for any part ot the [set of] propositions A, B, C, …” (Bolzano 2004, 54) “and we are not able to take away a single component [of the premises], much less an entire proposition” (Bolzano 1973, 213). Bolzano proves that the premises of an exact inference are independent and one can prove that in cases of exact deducibility, the premises and the conclusion must share at least one variable (see George, 1983). A deduction which is not exact is called redundant [überfüllt]. In exact deducibility the conclusion cannot be deduced from any proper subset of the premises. The syllogism Barbara (i.e., All A are B, All B are C, so All A are C) is an exact deduction, while the deduction of “Some B are A” from the same two premises is redundant. Exact deducibility requires that all the premises and all the ideas contained in them are necessary to draw the conclusion; this condition is the translation into logical terms of the condition of analytic proofs. Propositions of degree 0 or 1 (e.g., universally invalid or universally valid propositions) are excluded both from the premises and the conclusion. Bolzano's exact deducibility thus anticipates the logic of relevance of Anderson and Belnap (1975) in certain respects.

6.6 Some theorems

  • Deducibility is asymmetrical and transitive, but because of the condition of compatibility of premises, it is reflexive only for compatible propositions;
  • from A, a class of compatible premises, it is possible to deduce ¬M iff A is incompatible with M;
  • if one can deduce M from A, X as well as from A, ¬X, one can deduce M from A alone;
  • contraposition, if the degree of validity of the premise and the conclusion are neither 1 nor 0;
  • if all propositions deducible from the premises A are true, A is true;
  • a case of Gentzen's cut-rule:
    if from A, one can deduce M and from M, R, one can deduce X, then from A, R one can deduce X;
  • deduction theorem (TS II, §224.2, p. 396):
    If the inference:
    A, B, C, E, F, G, …
    M, N, O, …

    is valid, then so is:

    A, B, C, …
    if E, F, G, … are true, then M, N, O, … are also true.

6.7 Deducibility and probability

One of the main reasons why Bolzano's notion of deducibility presupposes the compatibility of the premises is that it renders possible the extension of deductive logic to inductive logic via probability. He defines the conditional probability (or relative validity) of a proposition M(i) with respect to a class of premises or hypotheses A(i) and variables i, as the ratio of the number of cases in which all the propositions of the class as well as M(i) are true to the number of cases in which only the propositions A(i) are all true. In other words, it is the ratio of the number of true variants of A(i) and M(i) to the number of true variants of A(i). (As with the concept of degree of validity, Bolzano's definition applies only if the number of variants is finite.) As a consequence, the probability of M(i) relative to A(i) is a fraction in the closed interval [0,1]. Bolzano's conditional probability is objective, an sich. In probability inferences, only one idea from each collection of equivalent (coextensive) ideas is admitted for substitutions, because if for each variable idea we admit ideas equivalent to it, “the set of true propositions and the set of false propositions produced from the given proposition will both be infinite in every case” (Bolzano 1973, 189), and the probability relation might not be well determined.

One can immediately see why the premises of a probable deduction must be compatible: the probability of M(i) is defined only if the denominator of the fraction is not zero, which means that the premises A(i) are compatible. On the other hand, the number of ideas that make both A(i) and M(i) true cannot be greater than the number of ideas that make true M(i); as a consequence, the conditional probability of M(i) cannot be greater than 1. It is 1 exactly when the number of ideas that make true both A(i) and M(i) is equal to the number of ideas that make true A(i) alone, which means that all substitutions of ideas that make true A(i) also make true M(i), i.e. if M(i) is deducible from A(i). In other words, if M(i) is deducible from A(i), its probability relative to A(i) is equal to 1, which means that the probability equals certainty. The probability is zero if no ideas make both A(i) and M(i) true, i.e. if A(i) and M(i) are incompatible. Incompatibility and certainty are thus two extreme cases of probability with values of 0 and 1.

This is an extraordinary achievement. Bolzano's approach yields the first logical definition of probability. For the first time deductive logic and inductive logic are united in a global theory and the former appears as a limit case of the latter. It is possible that in his Tractatus 5.15, Wittgenstein took over Bolzano's treatment of probability, perhaps through the mediation of the 1st edition of the Philosophical Propedeutic of R. Zimmermann (1853). Carnap's regular confirmation functions, too, are strongly reminiscent of Bolzano's approach.

Bolzano adds proofs of some standard theorems, and also defines subjective probability and different important probabilistic notions such as the degree of confidence, the credibility of a witness, etc. He gives the formula of the degree of credibility of an event reported by independent testimonies as a function of the number of witnesses, of the number of testimonies, and of the number of true and false propositions stated by each witness. All these concepts play an important role in the chapter “on the nature of historical knowledge, particularly concerning miracles” in Bolzano 1834.

7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (Abfolge)

The idea of a reform of logic already appeared in 1810 under the heading “objective connection among truths” in the Contributions. Developed in the TS, it represents the last stage of the development of formal logic in Bolzano and at the same time the first modern study of axiomatic systems. Although the logical relations studied in the previous sections of the TS include relations among collections of truths, they do not take into account the relationship of Abfolge (explained below), which is necessary to transform a simple collection of truths into a theory.

Bolzano's idea of an objective order among truths has its origin in the Aristotelian distinction between proofs of the fact and those that yield the reason of the fact. Bolzano's problem is that of providing precise criteria for distinguishing the two types of proofs. Proofs of facts, which Bolzano considers to be simple subjective proofs or certifications, may, if correct, be used in science, but they are not explanatory, for they do not capture the objective connections among truths. The goal of a science is to order its theorems according their relations of objective dependence, to ground such theorems objectively in previous theorems and eventually in axioms. Objective proofs are assumed to be explanatory and Bolzano calls them grounding proofs [Begründungen].

Are indirect proofs (apagogical, proofs by reduction to absurdity) explanatory? Bolzano definitely preferred direct proofs, because in indirect proofs the “false conclusion could never have been produced if all the premises from which we derive it were true” (Bolzano 2004, 78). Hafner (1999, 387) showed that Bolzano's objections to indirect proofs were not related to the compatibility requirement or the concept of deducibility, but only to the concept of grounding. According to Hafner, Bolzano prefers direct proofs for two reasons: 1) indirect proofs proceed by a detour [Umweg] and contain redundant premises, 2) indirect proofs always contain a false premise which cannot be admitted as the ground of other truths. Bolzano thinks that indirect proofs can be transformed into direct proofs through the simplification of the false propositions contained in them. Nevertheless, for pragmatic reasons, namely the simplicity of expression, in his Theory of Magnitudes [Grössenlehre, see bibliography], he also sometimes accepts “here and there” indirect proofs as (approximate) groundings.

Bolzano calls the ground-consequence relation Abfolge (translated as “consequence” or “entailment”, more recently as grounding; I shall take grounding relation and ground-consequence [Grund und Folge] relation as synonyms: Abfolge = Grund und Folge Verhältnis). It must not be confused with the purely logical relation of deducibility. It has no exact equivalent in our logic because it is a “material” relation in the sense that it depends on the “particular character of ideas” that occur in it (1837, II, 348). The notion of grounding is central to Bolzano's theory; however, Bolzano acknowledges that his analysis of grounding is incomplete and tentative, merely a first attempt to circumscribe the new concept. “Almost everything I advance in this part is tinged with uncertainty, on many topics I have not reached any decision, and at best my inquiries are only fragments and suggestions which will have attained their goal if they provide others with the stimulus to reflect further on these matters.” (Bolzano 1837, II, § 195, 327–8).

According to Bolzano, the ground-consequence relation holds only between truths, not between propositions in general. He has no definite answer as to whether the relation is simple or definable. He tries to characterize it implicitly by its properties expressed in a series of theorems. In order to obtain a general concept valid for all disciplines, he takes examples from various sciences: metaphysics, morals, physics, mathematics, and logic. Despite his initial conjecture that the ground-consequence relation might be simple and thus undefinable, at the end of his investigation, he conjectures that grounding might well be a formal relation definable in terms of deducibility in an axiomatic system.

The grounding relation holds between a set of truths and their immediate consequences. “There is only one [grounding] for each truth, because the objective ground can only be a single ground” (Bolzano 1837, IV, § 528, 266). If a truth is the consequence of several truths, they constitute its total ground while each true premise is a partial ground.

Bolzano begins by comparing the grounding relation to deducibility and causality. Contrary to grounding, deducibility can hold also between false propositions. It can be reciprocal (equivalence) and it is transitive and reflexive for propositions of degree of validity ≠ 0. Moreover, deducibility presupposes the notions of sentential form and of variable. On the other hand, grounding is neither reflexive nor transitive; it is anti-symmetrical and (in some cases at least) connects truths independently of all variation. The two relations are compatible, however: the same proposition may be at the same time deduced from and grounded in its premise. Hence there are two kinds of grounding: formal grounding that is at the same time deducibility and material grounding that holds without deducibility.

Mechanics, particularly the theorem of the composition of forces (see Bolzano 1842), yields a causal model of grounding. It is causality that confers the particular character on the grounding relation but eventually, causality is absorbed by it. Finally, for Bolzano, the proposition “A is the cause of B” means that the proposition “A exists” contains the ground of the proposition “B exists”. As causality holds only between actual things, it is reduced to propositions about the grounding relation between real objects.

Let us take an example. The propositions “it is warmer in summer than in winter” and “the thermometer stands higher in summer than in winter” are equivalent (one is deducible from the other) relative to the variables “summer” and “winter”, but “only the latter can be considered as a consequence of the former” (Bolzano 1973, § 162, 245–246).

The different examples Bolzano considers show the difficulty if not the impossibility of constructing a general concept of grounding which is valid for all disciplines. The situation is different in purely conceptual sciences. If we take the following example:

Socrates was Athenian
Socrates was a philosopher
Socrates was Athenian and a philosopher,

we have a grounding relation, because the premises are simpler than the conclusion. Bolzano invokes the same argument against Euclid's parallel postulate, which is a proposition too complex to merit the title of axiom or ground and should be replaced by the principle of similarity. The Socrates example relates to the simple/complex opposition, but in general, simplicity is not a sufficient condition of the ground. According to the Contributions, all axioms have simple subject- and predicate-concepts, although, conversely, a proposition containing only simple concepts is not necessarily an axiom; no such criterion is present in the TS (perhaps he knew better by then). Thence, simplicity would be the primary but not exclusive principle ordering axiomatic theories. The binomial theorem (1 + x)n with an imaginary or real exponent is more general than with a positive integral exponent, but the former is considerably more complex and cannot be considered an objective ground of the latter which should be demonstrated first. In other examples taken from geometry the general theorem has priority. In his Purely analytical proof (1817), too, Bolzano proves first the general theorem for two continuous functions (Russ 2004, § 15, 274) and only in § 18 (p. 276–7) for one continuous function. In these cases, Bolzano puts forward the argument of the greater generality of the grounds relative to their consequences, even though the consequences are simpler.

The grounding relation in the purely conceptual sciences has the following properties:

  1. Only truths may be related by the ground-consequence relation.
  2. The grounding relation is irreflexive and anti-symmetrical.
  3. The complete ground may consist of one or several truths (each of them is called a partial ground), while the complete consequence contains always several truths (partial consequences).
  4. No conceptual truth can be grounded in an empirical truth, but a conceptual truth may be a partial ground of an empirical one.
  5. The grounds are more general than their consequences, where generality is understood in terms of broader extension of the subject or of the predicate.
  6. Often but not always, the grounding relation induces an order among theorems according to the degree of complexity (the number of simple concepts occurring in a truth).
  7. “The simpler truth must be stated in advance of the more complex and, where there is an equal complexity, the more general must always be stated before the more particular” (Bolzano 2004, 79). This property, too, admits exceptions.
  8. In case of conflict between the criterion of simplicity and that of generality, simplicity is prior to generality.
  9. The search for the grounds of a truth ends with basic truths (= axioms).

Bolzano distinguishes between principles of a science, Grundsätze, which may be demonstrated in another science, and basic truths, Grundwahrheiten, which have no ground and are true axioms. With Bolzano, the status of axioms changes: instead of being evident, objects of intuition, they become the starting points of proofs in a deductive theory. Sometimes even the evidence of theorems is superior to that of axioms, but even evident theorems need a proof. The role of proofs, too, is transformed: they have not only to provide subjective certainty, but above all to integrate the theorems into the whole conceptual system. The crucial elements of science are proofs exhibiting the objective connection among truths. In the TS we also witness the appearance, for the first time in the history of logic, of proof trees, i.e. diagrams showing the dependence of theorems on their grounds, axioms and auxiliary truths.

At the end of his enquiry, Bolzano considers a set of propositions that may be both demonstrated from and grounded in given axioms. He thinks that from the point of view of pure deduction, not taking grounding into account, there are several possible partitions of such a set into theorems and initial hypotheses. Is not one of these partitions privileged by the grounding relation?

It results from the condition of simplicity that “the number of propositions that we have to admit (as hypotheses) will be for any arbitrary partition [between hypotheses and theorems] greater than when we order them according to their objective connection” (Bolzano 1837, II, § 221, 386). In other words, the ratio between the theorems and the hypotheses is the greatest when we separate them according to the objective connection among truths.

Pursuing this line of thought, Bolzano finally arrives at a possible definition of the grounding relation in terms of the whole axiomatic system: “I occasionally doubt whether the concept of ground and consequence, which I have above claimed to be simple, is not complex after all; it may turn out to be none other than the concept of an ordering of truths which allows us to deduce from the smallest number of simple premises the largest possible number of the remaining truths as conclusions” (Bolzano 1837, II, § 221, 388 note).

Some conclusions may be drawn from this passage (even if Bolzano did not draw them). The notion of a basic truth would have to be transformed: a basic truth would now be one that belongs to a minimal set of hypotheses which allows the most efficient deduction of all the other truths of the system. At the same time, instead of being a particular relation between the ground and its consequence, the concept of grounding in deductive sciences should become a property of the whole system of propositions. Grounding, being no more a simple concept and defined in terms of deducibility by the optimal partition between axioms and theorems, becomes a global property of a deductive theory.

Mancosu (1999, 452) pointed out the difficulties of Bolzano's conjectural definition. In particular, Bolzano's geometrical examples “fail to provide sufficient intuitive evidence for distinguishing grounds from consequences” (ibid.). On the other hand, the holistic model of the optimal partition provides simply “an arbitrary axiomatic system with the extra condition of optimality” (ibid.), which, he argues, is irrelevant for the difference between explanatory and non-explanatory proofs. Nevertheless, “Bolzano had the great merit of singling out the problem of mathematical explanation as central to the philosophy of mathematics” even if “his attempted solution(s) do not satisfactorily answer the issues he cleverly raised” (ibid.).

8. Conclusion

While at least some of Bolzano's mathematical works drew the attention of some of the greatest German mathematicians (Weierstrass, Cantor, and Dedekind), until the end of the XIXth century his logic met for the most part with indifference and incomprehension. In mathematics, Bolzano proved some of the fundamental theorems of analysis, sketched the first theory of real numbers, produced an extraordinary theory of real functions, introduced the concept of set and that of the actual infinite, and stated the characteristic condition of infinite sets. Even his friend Exner, who had had the benefit of additional detailed explanations, was unable to understand his reform of logic. He was not happy with the TS because of Bolzano's concepts of proposition and intuition in itself and of his criticisms of Herbart. Bolzano's treatment of logic was so radically new that only at the end of the XIXth century, did philosophers of the Brentano school begin to understand some of its parts, starting with Kerry, Twardowski, Meinong and Husserl. Some of the most important logical ideas of Bolzano spread among Austrian secondary school students through the first edition of Zimmermann's textbook (1853), which contained a summary of Bolzano's logic. Being accused of plagiarism, Zimmermann omitted these passages from Bolzano in the second edition. Wittgenstein might have taken inspiration from them in writing his Tractatus. Russell knew the Paradoxes of the infinite and some of his thoughts on logic are parallel to Bolzano's. Curiously, Frege, whose ideas were often so close to those of Bolzano and who in his time was the only logician capable of understanding him, never mentioned him. He was confronted with Bolzano's ideas three times: in one of Kerry's articles, in the correspondence with Husserl, and later in the controversy with Korselt (see Sundholm 2000); he never reacted to their allusions. It is quite possible that he never laid hands on any of Bolzano's works (see Kreiser 1981), apart, perhaps, from the Paradoxes of the infinite. After Twardowski (1894), it was chiefly Husserl who drew philosophers' attention to Bolzano. In several of his books, he praised Bolzano's logic, while insisting at the same time on the originality of his own phenomenological method (see Sebestik 2003). Between the two wars, Bolzano's logic and philosophy of mathematics inspired Heinrich Scholz and Jean Cavaillès. At the same time Tarski discovered the concept of logical consequence independently of Bolzano, but Tarski discovered the affinity between his work and Bolzano's only after Scholz pointed it out to him. However, already in Twardowski (1894, see Sebestik 1995), the founder of the Polish Lwow-Warsaw school, Bolzano's ideas are discussed and criticized at length, and some of them might have become the common ground of the Polish school (some of Bolzano's expressions are found literally in Tarski). In 1920, Hans Hahn edited the Paradoxes of the infinite with important critical notes, comparing Bolzano with Cantor. Karl Menger might have taken inspiration for his theory of dimension not only from Poincaré, but also from the Paradoxes. Neurath praised Bolzano as one of the ancestors of the Vienna Circle, because of the conciseness of his style and the rejection of Kant's philosophy. Some important Bolzanian ideas are also found in the work of Quine. All these currents are indebted to Bolzano for the lesson of intellectual rigor and of analytic power. It is Bolzano who is the true founder of the kind of analytical philosophy whose core is logic and which is impregnated with science. His logic has archaic aspects, but he introduced not only new concepts, methods and theories, new themes and new problems, but above all a new spirit that has pervaded philosophy ever since.

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Primary literature

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Articles in encyclopedias

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Special issues

  • Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987. International Workshop, 1992, Florence: Leo S. Olschki.
  • Impact of Bolzano's epoch on the development of science, 1982, Prague.
  • Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis, 1987, 24 (4).
  • Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987, 1992, Firenze: Olschki.
  • Grazer philosophische Studien, Bolzano and Analytic Philosophy, 1997, 53.
  • Revue d'Histoire des Science, Mathématique et logique chez Bolzano, 1999.
  • Les Etudes philosophiques, Bernard Bolzano, 2000, 4.
  • Morscher, E., (ed.), 2000, Bolzanos geistiges Erbe für das 21. Jahrhundert, Sankt Augustin: Akademia.
  • Morscher, E., (ed.), 2003, Bernard Bolzanos Leistungen in Logik, Mathematik und Physik, Sankt Augustin: Akademia.
  • Ganthaler, H.,und Neumaier, O. (ed.), 1997, Bolzano und die Österreichische Geistesgeschichte, Sankt Augustin: Akademia.
  • Philosophiques, 2003, Bernard Bolzano. Philosophie de la logique et théorie de la connaissance, 30 (1).
  • Trlifajová, K., (ed.), 2006, The solitary thinker Bernard Bolzano, (Czech), Prague: Filosofia.

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