# Bolzano's Logic

*First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Mon Nov 14, 2011*

Bernard Bolzano (1781–1848), of Italian-German origin, was born and
died in Prague. He spent his entire life in Bohemia (today part of the
Czech Republic), which remained part of the Austrian Empire until
1918. He studied philosophy, mathematics and theology and became a
Catholic priest and professor of the science of religion at the
University of Prague. He devoted his life to the reform of the
backward semi-feudal Austrian society and of the *a priori*
sciences: logic, mathematics and theology. Because of his unorthodox
views on the constitution and the government, he was removed in 1819
from the University and spent the rest of his life in retirement
writing treatises on the theory of science (1837), mathematics
(*Grössenlehre*, manuscript not yet completely
published), *Science of Religion* (1834), a utopia *On the
Best State* (published only in 1932) and the
posthumous *Paradoxes of the infinite* (1851).

Bolzano's presentation of logic is embedded in the vast
*Theory of Science* (henceforth *TS*). His logic is
based on the abstract concepts of propositions and ideas in themselves
(*an sich*), which are independent of thought and language. His
logic of ideas contains a new treatment of their content and extension
and, among other things, provides an analysis of ideas without
objects. A purely logical definition of intuitions as simple singular
ideas allowed Bolzano to distinguish them from concepts and to
characterize the traditional epistemological distinction between *a
priori* and *a posteriori* in terms of the logical
distinction between conceptual and empirical propositions (and
sciences). The main innovations of Bolzano's logic consist in the
definitions of validity, analyticity and logical truth, and the
creation of a complete system of extensional relations between
propositions, the most important of these being compatibility,
deducibility (= consequence), and equivalence. Bolzano discovered the
link between deducibility and conditional probability, according to
which deducibility and incompatibility appear as two limit cases of
conditional probability (this idea was taken over or reinvented by
Wittgenstein in the *Tractatus*). Deductive logic is thus
extended to inductive logic based on probability. Bolzano's theory of
the grounding relation (*Abfolge*) leading to a hierarchical
order of theorems is the first modern study of axiomatic
systems. Morover, the thorough discussions of concepts of logic and
many other insights contribute to make the *TS* one of the
classical works in logic and epistemology, on a par with those of
Aristotle, Leibniz, and Frege. The extensive historical notes
contained in it are a unique source for the history of logic. Although
written in natural language, Bolzano's logic represents a decisive
breakthrough in the development of modern logic.

- 1. Towards a new logic
- 2. Logic as Theory of Science
- 3. Some fundamental concepts
- 4. Propositions and truths in themselves
- 5. Ideas and relations between ideas
- 6. The method of variation
- 7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (
*Abfolge*) - 8. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Towards a new logic

In 1810, Bolzano published a booklet entitled *Contributions to a
better founded presentation of mathematics*
(*Beyträge…*, Russ 2004) where he developed his
views about the unsatisfactory state of the mathematics of his time
and the need for its reform. He proposed a new definition of
mathematics as “the science which deals with the general laws
(forms) to which things must conform in their existence”
(Bolzano 1810, I, § 8; Russ 2004, 94), a new division of
mathematics into universal mathematics (arithmetic, algebra,
analysis and elements of his future theory of collections) and
particular mathematical disciplines (mathematical theory of time,
geometry and mechanics), and also put forth some considerations on
logic. As with Leibniz, logic is again seen as closely connected with
mathematics.

The logical theory of the *Contributions* is still fairly
traditional, sometimes Kantian in spite of Bolzano's criticisms, but
it contains some important innovations. Following Aristotle, Bolzano
distinguished two sorts of proofs: those which show *that*
something is the case and those which also show *why* it is
so. He called the former “certifications” (Russ 2004,
254: “confirmations”) [*Gewissmachungen*], the
latter “groundings” [*Begründungen*]. The
concept of grounding reflects the “objective dependence among
truths” [*objektiver Zusammenhang der Wahrheiten*].
It would later become the fundamental concept in Bolzano's treatment of axiomatic
theories in the *TS*. Another innovation consisted in the
criteria for the correctness of proofs and in the treatment of
simple, undefinable concepts. On one hand, already in the
*Betrachtungen* Bolzano pointed out that he “could never
be satisfied with a completely strict proof *if it were not
derived from the same concepts* which the *thesis* to be
proved contained” (Russ 2004, 32). On the other hand,
“[…] in any correct proof of [the] proposition all
characteristics of the subject must be used, i.e., they must be
applied in the derivation of the predicate” (Bolzano 1810, II,
§ 28; Russ 2004, 122–123). With Aristotle, Bolzano prohibits
crossing from one genus to another in demonstrations. Proofs of
theorems of mathematical analysis such as his proof of the
intermediate value theorem (Bolzano 1817) must not contain concepts
alien to the domain of investigation; in the case of this theorem, one
must not introduce geometrical or kinematic considerations to prove a
theorem of universal (pure) mathematics.

According to Bolzano, a mathematical theory should be presented in the form of an axiomatic theory, whose propositions are deduced from previous propositions according to their objective dependence and eventually from the axioms. Axioms are not necessarily evident truths and intuition has no place either in the proofs or the axioms. An axiom is simply an indemonstrable proposition from which other propositions may be deduced. A science thus becomes an autonomous, ordered system of propositions, independent of the human mind; the goal of foundational research is to discover and to reproduce this objective order.

A further important innovation consists in the treatment of simple, undefinable concepts. How do we understand them? Our understanding

is brought about by mentioning several sentences, in which the concept in question, designated by its own word, appears in various combinations. From the comparison of these sentences, the reader is able to abstract which determinate concept the word designates. […] This means is well known as that by which each of us learned the first meanings of words in our mother tongue (Bolzano 1910, II, § 8; Russ 2004, 107; here Rusnock's 2000 translation).

Bolzano called such circumlocutions “paraphrases” or
“circumscriptions” [*Umschreibungen*]. His method
points to a solution of the paradox of definition according to which
all concepts are ultimately defined in terms of simple concepts, but
these remain undefined and thus devoid of meaning.

## 2. Logic as Theory of Science

Bolzano's new logic responded to the needs of both mathematics and
the “science of religion” which Bolzano taught from 1805
to 1819. In 1812, profoundly dissatisfied with the state of logic,
Bolzano conceived the project of a new logic which would lead to a
“total transformation of the *a priori* sciences”. The idea
of the “objective connection of truths”, based on the
grounding relation of consequence [*Abfolge*] was the core of
the project. The *Theory of Science*, published in 1837, marks
the realization of the project, enlarged in the broader context of
general epistemology and methodology of science.

Bolzano defined the theory of science by its ultimate goal, which is
the division of human knowledge into disciplines and the composition
of scientific treatises. According to the definition, the theory of
science is “the aggregate of all rules which we must follow
when we divide the total domain of truths into individual sciences,
and represent them in their respective treatises” (Bolzano
1973, 2–3). Bolzano calls this last part of the *TS* the Theory of
Science Proper.

This definition presupposes a whole sequence of disciplines involved
in the construction of a science, each of which is founded on the
preceding. The ultimate discipline in this sequence deals with the
classification of sciences and the principles of style of scientific
writing that should lead to the composition of a series of scientific
treatises forming an encyclopedia. Bolzano hoped that, following the
Great Encyclopedia of Diderot and D'Alembert, the ideal of the
Enlightenment, the effort to spread scientifically organized useful
knowledge would again find its finest expression in the completion of
an encyclopedia. In this way, the *TS*, “in accordance
with the laws of morality” (Bolzano 1972, 3), would contribute
to the general well-being.

In order to divide truths into different disciplines and present them
in particular treatises, we first have to discover them. Such is the
goal of the *art of discovery* [*Erfindungskunst*] or
*heuristics*, which yields the rules for finding new truths.
Heuristics presupposes the possibility of recognizing truths, which
is the object of the *theory of knowledge*
[*Erkenntnislehre*]. Now, the decisive step in the exploration
of the layers of science leads to the most important part of the
*TS*, the *theory of elements*, which analyses the
objective conditions of the subjective activity of knowing, namely
the theory of ideas, propositions and deduction, in short: formal
logic. The *Theory of Fundamentals* shows that these elements are
propositions in themselves and ideas in themselves, that there are
infinitely many truths in themselves and that we can know at least some
of them. Taking all the disciplines of the *TS* in the due
order, we obtain the following structure:

- Theory of fundamentals (
*Fundamentallehre*, vol. I), - Theory of elements (
*Elementarlehre*), i.e., formal logic (vol. I-II), - Theory of knowledge (
*Erkenntnislehre*, vol. III), - Heuristics (
*Erfindungskunst oder Heuristik*, vol. III), - Theory of science proper (
*eigentliche Wissenschaftslehre*), i.e., the theory of the division of the truths into particular sciences and the principles of composition for scientific treatises (vol. IV).

## 3. Some fundamental concepts

Bolzano's terminology often differs from current logical usage. For a proper understanding of Bolzano's logic, it is thus necessary to keep in mind Bolzano's fundamental distinctions and definitions. This is why the presentation of Bolzano's logic must begin with the examination of several preliminary concepts.

The expression “in itself” [*an sich*] is applied
only to propositions and ideas, never to things or metaphysical
objects such as the soul or God. Only logical objects are “in
themselves”. The determination “in itself” or
“as such” (a translation proposed recently by Jan Berg)
with its synonym “objective” means that we take an object
without any other qualification, independently of its being thought or
expressed linguistically. Bolzano's term for ideas in themselves is
‘representations in themselves’ [*Vorstellungen an
sich*], and he even speaks of intuitions in themselves; he is
aware of the incongruity of such a designation, but he has no other
term to propose.

For what we call – after Tarski – logical consequence,
Bolzano uses the word *deducibility* (*Ableitbarkeit*,
literally derivability, but it is a sort of semantical relation). He
calls *consequence* or *entailment* [*Abfolge*]
the ground-consequence relation [*Grund und Folge*]; with
Rusnock (Bolzano 2004), I translate *Abfolge* by
*grounding.* In English, the same word *grounding* is
also used for *Begründung* which is the objective proof,
*objektiver Beweis*, carried out by means of the grounding
relation [*Abfolge*]. Thus, *grounding* translates both
the *Abfolge* relation between the ground and the consequence,
and *Begründung*, the complete objective proof.

Bolzano has two words to designate properties:
*Beschaffenheit* and *Eigenschaft*. In translation, the
difference often disappears, but it is possible to capture it by
translating *Beschaffenheit* by “attribute”. An
*Eigenschaft* is a property in the strict sense;
“attribute” is the general term for both properties and
relations, and also covers the states and structure of an object. The
‘*Beschaffenheit*’ of a thing means how it
is *beschaffen*, made, organized, arranged, structured,
constituted. Nevertheless, often *Beschaffenheit* simply
designates an *Eigenschaft*, a property.

There are two fundamental kinds of objects in Bolzano's ontology: the
real ones, localized in space and time and subject to causality,
and the non-real, logical and mathematical objects. Real objects
are further divided into external and internal, subjective (mental
events). Thus, we have the first world of external, material things,
the second world of subjective states (mental events) and the third
realm of abstract meanings and mathematical objects; nevertheless,
the ultimate ontological division is between the *real* world
containing substances, their collections, states and properties, and
the *abstract* realm of logical and mathematical objects.

One can only say of real objects that they exist or have being in the
proper sense [*Existenz, Dasein, Sein*]. Bolzano marks the
difference in the modes of being of real and non-real objects by
saying that “there are [*es gibt*] non-real
objects”, although they do not *exist*. With Bergmann
1970 and other critics who stress that we do not have different
concepts of existence according to the nature of the objects, I shall
in both cases use the word “exist”.

Both kinds of being, real and non real, can nevertheless be expressed
by means of an important second-level concept: objectuality
[*Gegenständlichkeit*], a property of ideas expressing
existential quantification, the property of having an object. The idea
of a function is just as objectual as the idea of a horse, but in the
case of the idea of a horse, one may add that it is an idea of a real
being. The idea of a round square is objectless, without object, not
instantiated, because the existence of round squares implies a
contradiction. The idea of a golden mountain is objectless for
empirical reasons.

Surprisingly, Bolzano lacks a theory of quantification. He knows better than other mathematicians of his time how to treat quantifiers in his mathematical work (he was, for example, the first to give a viable definition of continutity, and to formulate the Bolzano-Cauchy criterion for the convergence of infinite series) but he gives no theoretical treatment of quantifiers in his logic. He considers that it is not necessary to prefix a universal quantifier to universal propositions. “Man is mortal” differs from “All men are mortal” only in grammatical expression; both sentences express the same proposition. Existential quantification is reduced to objectuality, a property of second order. “There are inhabitants on other planets” becomes “The idea of an inhabitant on other planets is objectual”.

## 4. Propositions and truths in themselves

Bolzano's first important innovation in the *TS*, which is at
the same time the most controversial, aims at the transformation of
the domain of logic. According to him, logic is not a theory of ideas
and judgments in our mind, it is not an *art de pensée*
in the sense of Arnauld's and Nicole's *Logic of Port-Royal*
or an exposition of the laws of thought. Logic is the theory of
formal relations between propositions in themselves (*Sätze
an sich*; Bolzano also uses as a synonym “objective
propositions”; here I shall simply use the term
“proposition”). Bolzano does not succeed in defining what
objective propositions are; he can only characterize them by a set of
specific properties (see Berg 1962). In contradistinction to
judgments, which are mental acts, and to sentences, which are
sequences of signs of a language, propositions form the
“matter” of a thought or of a judgment as well as the
meaning or sense (*Sinn*) of a sentence. Bolzano points out
that ‘to be in itself’ is not a new property of
propositions or ideas; it means simply to take a proposition or an
idea as it is, independently of its being grasped or expressed by a
human being. Conversely, thinking and speaking involve
‘grasping ’ (in the metaphorical sense) the meaning and
expressing it.

One will gather what I mean by proposition as soon as I remark that I do not call a proposition in itself or an objective proposition that which the grammarians call a proposition, namely, the linguistic expression, but rather simply the meaning of this expression, which must be exactly one of the two, true or false; and that accordingly I attribute existence to the grasping of a proposition, to thought propositions as well as to the judgments made in the mind of a thinking being (existence, namely, in the mind of the one who thinks this proposition and who makes the judgment); but the mere proposition in itself (or the objective proposition) I count among the kinds of things that do not have any existence whatsoever, and never can attain existence (Bolzano 2004, 40–41).

Like mathematical objects, propositions are non-mental and non-linguistic intensional entities; they do not belong to the real world, but rather, as Bolzano puts it, to “the realm of those things which make no claim to reality” (Russ 2004, 607). Contrary to other intensional objects, each proposition has a truth value, true or false. The best approach to Bolzano's concept of proposition (and of idea in itself) is to consider them as forming the universal realm of abstract meanings, from which each language selects specific meanings and associates signs with them.

Against psychologism, especially that of Kant, Herbart, and others, Bolzano propounded the concept of a proposition in order to prevent the interpretation of logical objects as mental entities. Bolzano's arguments in favor of the existence of propositions invoke the existence of unknown truths or of truths that nobody except God will ever know (a truth is simply a true proposition). Such is, for instance, the truth that a certain tree had determinate number of flowers last spring. But God's knowledge of that number does not mean that propositions depend on his mind: propositions and truths, not being real, are not created by him. “Something is true not because God knows that it is so; on the contrary, God knows that it is so because in fact it is so ” (Bolzano 1837, I, § 25, 113–115). The proposition “God exists” is not true because God thinks it; God thinks this because it is true.

The most plausible argument in favor of the existence of propositions deals with mathematical truths: the Pythagorean theorem, for example, is true independently of the language in which it is formulated, and does not even depend on the existence of thinking beings. According to Morscher (1973), Bolzano wanted to guarantee the objectivity and universality of logic by means of propositions.

Already during his life, Bolzano was obliged to defend his theory of
propositions against the attacks of Franz Exner, who wrote to Bolzano:
“Every truth exists only in the consciousness of an individual,
in an individual understanding, nowhere else and in no other
way” (Bolzano 2004, 85). Exner also speaks of the “ghostly
being” of propositions. Exner objected that Bolzano's theory of
propositions makes it a mystery how human beings, who belong to the
real world, grasp immaterial meanings. Bolzano replied that “the
word ‘grasp’ as well as all similar words [… ] are
only *figurative* expressions used in the hope that anyone who
understands the language can gather from the whole context which
simple [or almost simple] concepts” are designated with these
words (Bolzano 2004, 162). Against Exner, again and again he puts
forward as argument the existence of unknown truths and the existence
of meanings independent of any particular language.

Much later, Frege, the early Husserl, Church and Heinrich Scholz
advanced ideas similar to those of Bolzano, while Wittgenstein,
Schlick, Patočka, Quine and others presented objections based on
the analysis of human, subjective representations and the use of
language. In his *Metaphysics of Meaning*, Jerrold Katz
exposed an essentially Bolzanian theory showing how to respond to
Wittgensteinian and Quinian arguments: the meanings constitute a
universal field from which every language selects its own meanings,
not necessarily the same for all languages. A balanced position is
expressed in Rusnock (2000, 115):

[…] the question may fairly be asked whether Bolzano's view on logical objects can be usefully adapted to the modern setting – that is […] whether the notion of proposition is still useful. […] In my opinion, this question turns mainly on the issue of whether or not formal language theory is judged to have given an exhaustive description of possible forms of meaningfulness. If so, it would seem that propositions as entities over and above formal expressions would yield nothing that one did not already possess in a more precise form. On the other hand, if the question of analysis of possible forms of meaning remains open, then Bolzano's position, suitably adapted, becomes more reasonable. And the latter, it seems to me, is closer to the truth. […] when considerations of tractability, perspicuity, elegance, etc. are introduced, the question becomes once again interestingly open.

Bozano's concept of proposition also includes orders, questions and
expressions of desire. A question like “Is Newton's law of
universal gravitation an *a priori* truth?” means
“I want to know if Newton's law of universal gravitation is
an *a priori* truth” and it has a truth value. Here and
in similar cases, Bolzano confuses the question of truth with the
sincerity of the speaker.

What is truth? Truths are true propositions. Bolzano's theory is essentially Aritotelian: true propositions “state things as they are” (Bolzano 1837, I, § 25, 112; 1973, 56). A proposition is true if it says how things are. More precisely,

A proposition is true when it attributes to a subject a predicate that it possesses, or (in other words) when every object that stands under the subject concept of the proposition has an attribute that stands under the predicate concept (Bolzano 2004, 167).

This formulation is linked to the canonical form of all propositions
“*A* has (the attribute) *b*” (see below). A
proposition is true iff the object represented by the subject-idea has
an attribute represented by the predicate-idea. Moreover, empirical
propositions must contain determinations of space and time. Without
these determinations, the sentence “It is snowing” has no
truth value, it is just a propositional form which does not correspond
to a complete proposition; “in order to be true, [such
propositions] require the addition of such specifications as to time
(and often place as well), ‘It is snowing today, in this
place’” (Bolzano 1973, 57).

There are infinitely many truths in themselves. Bolzano proposed
several proofs for this claim, the simplest being the following. Let
us take as a first proposition *p*, e.g., that “there is
no truth”. Then if *p* is true, it is our first truth;
if *p* is false, some other proposition is true, e.g.
non-*p*. Thus there is at least one truth. Now, “
‘*p*’ is true” is our second truth, different
from the first one, because it has a different subject and different
predicate than those of *p*; ‘ “
‘*p*’ is true” is true’ is our
third truth, and so on *ad infinitum*. If *p* if false, we have
the same argument starting with non-*p*. Other proofs, by
complete induction, are more sophisticated, but hardly more
convincing.

## 5. Ideas and relations between ideas

Traditional logic begins with concepts or ideas, moves on to judgments
and ends with reasoning (syllogisms, arguments). Bolzano reversed this order with
regard to ideas and propositions. Propositions are composed of ideas,
but for Bolzano, propositions are primary, undefined objects, and
ideas in themselves [*Vorstellungen an sich*; hereafter just
*ideas* in contradistinction to subjective ideas] are defined
as parts of propositions that are not themselves propositions. This
is an important innovation, which appears already in Kant (see Coffa
1981 and 1992), because it allows one to grasp the meaning of a term
in a sentence from the context of the whole sentence, and authorizes
concept formation from sentential forms obtained from propositions by
declaring one or several of its components variable.

Ideas do not have truth values. They can nevertheless contain whole propositions as parts, e.g., the idea of “the man who discovered that the planets have elliptic orbits”. They have the same ontological status as propositions: they are the “stuff” of subjective ideas, they do not belong to the real world, they can only be grasped by a mind and thus be thought by means of subjective ideas. “To every subjective idea belongs an objective one” (Bolzano 1837, § 271) which is what is thought by the subjective idea.

### 5.1 The content of an idea

Ideas can be simple or composed of other ideas. The non-ordered set
or the sum of the parts of a complex idea is its *content*.
The parts of an idea form a sum, i.e., according to Bolzano's
definition, a collection in which “the parts of a part are
parts of the whole”. His definition means that the content of
an idea is invariant with respect to substitutions of the system or
sequence of simpler parts of a part for that part. Thus, substituting
“divisible by 2” for “even” in “even
number”, we obtain “number divisible by 2” which
has the same content.

On the other hand, two different ideas may have the same content.
“The learned son of an unlearned father” and “the
unlearned son of a learned father” for instance have the same
content. An idea is therefore not determined solely by its content.
Its complete determination requires its content and the order of the
parts. In their ultimate form, many ideas are systems or sequences of
simple ideas which form their content. Nevertheless, in certain ideas
having the form “*A* which has the properties
*b*, *b*′, *b*″,…”, no
linear ordering is supposed between the parts *b*,
*b*′, *b*″,….

All complex ideas can in principle be analyzed into their ultimate
parts which are simple. Bolzano does not give a list of simple ideas
but occasionally conjectures that a given idea is simple.
Among others, the following ideas are claimed to be simple:
“something”, “attribute”, “being”,
“composition” (*Zusammengesetzheit*, which is the
primitive idea allowing one to define collections and sets as
“something which has composition”), “to grasp or
apprehend”, “not”, “ought”.

### 5.2 Definitions

There are a variety of ways of conveying the meaning of expressions.
Definitions in a broad sense start with explanations, and
explanations are divided into contextual definitions of simple
concepts (or of concepts that we are not able to define) and
definitions in the strict sense, namely the decompositions of a
concept into its parts. Each concept has a unique definition. A given
decomposition may or may not attain the ultimate parts, but different
partial decompositions and the complete decomposition into ultimate
parts define the same concept. As we have seen, already before
Gergonne and Jeremy Bentham, Bolzano advanced the idea of contextual
definitions in the *Contributions* (1810): we grasp the
meaning of a simple idea “from the use or the context”
(Russ 2004, 107; the quotation is from Bolzano 1837, IV, 547).
Complete determinations are similar to definitions: they state an
exclusive, characteristic property of an object and yield thus a
concept equivalent to the defined concept.

Another important division concerns the division of attributes
[*Beschaffenheiten*] into internal properties, expressed by
monadic predicates, and external properties, i.e. relations, which
in fact correspond to internal properties of the whole composed from the
related parts. In the fundamental idiom, which approximates closely
the structure of propositions, “*A* is the father of
*B*” should be translated as “The whole which
contains *A* and *B* has the following property: the
first element is the father of the second”. In fact, Bolzano
transfers the weight of the relation to the predicate. Here are two
examples of something which looks like a property but is in fact a
relation: the attribute of being prime, which is a relation between a
prime number and all other natural numbers, and sensible qualities,
which are not internal properties but relations between external
things and sense organs. Thus, “*a* is red” becomes
“in relation to our sense organ of vision, *a* is
red.”

Two theorems, or rather simply observations, govern Bolzano's theory
of ideas. They invalidate theories of some of Bolzano's
contemporaries or predecessors by means of counterexamples. 1) The
parts of an idea are not necessarily the ideas of the *parts*
of their object. In the example “roof of a house”, the
idea “house” is not the idea of a part of the roof of the
house. 2) The parts of an idea are not always ideas of the
*properties* of their object. The idea “√2”,
for instance has parts such as “root”,
“square”, “of” and “2”, but none
of the infinity of its properties is represented by any of these parts.
In any case, many complex ideas contain also logical particles (e.g.
“which”, “of”) that connect their parts and
can be neither ideas of the parts nor ideas of the properties of the
object. Both observations show that the traditional formation of
concepts by mere agglomeration of characters does not exhaust the
multiple ways that concepts are formed. Moreover, both refute not
only all naive picture theories of knowledge, but also, as
Joëlle Proust (1999) has noted, the Leibnizian idea of
isomorphism between signs and things. The examples quoted by Bolzano
show that there is no direct correspondence between the composition
of things and the compositions of the ideas that represent them.
Ideas are not images of their objects.

### 5.3 Ideas and objects

The relation of an idea to its object is primitive, hence indefinable
relation. Ideas may have or represent or refer to one or more objects; these are
called objectual [*gegenständlich*]. Others represent no
object, they are objectless, empty [*gegenstandslos, leer*]. Bolzano
supposes that for any object there is an idea that represents it
uniquely. An idea of an idea is called symbolic.

Examples of the first kind: ideas like “Greek” (each Greek is one of its objects), “black”, “universe”, “prime number”; of the second kind are ideas like “nothing”, “round square”, “regular pentahedron”, “golden mountain” (empirically empty), logical particles such as “has” or “which”, and curiously also ideas of “imaginary” (complex) numbers like √−1. Objects of ideas may be real, e.g. real beings or their properties (“man”, “virtue”), but also not real, as in the case of logical and mathematical objects (“proposition”, “deducibility”, “number”, “function”). Altogether, we have the following relations:

*subsumption*, a primitive relation between an object and an idea (an object is subsumed under an idea if that idea represents it, e.g. Socrates is subsumed under the idea “philosopher”),*subordination*, a relation between ideas defined in terms of subsumption (an idea is subordinate to another idea if all objects subsumed under the former idea are subsumed under the latter but not conversely, e.g. “Greek” is subordinate to “European”),*part relation*between ideas, an idea is a part of another idea (e.g. “rational” is a part of the idea “rational animal”),*grasping relation*, a primitive relation between minds, and ideas and propositions (e.g., Plato grasps the idea of the supreme good, Bolzano grasps the proposition “Some continuous functions are nowhere differentiable”).

Before Frege, Husserl and others, Bolzano carefully distinguished between subsumption (in set-theoretical terminology: to be an element of a set) and subordination (to be a subset).

### 5.4 Extension

Loosely speaking, the *extension* of an idea is “the
collection of all the objects falling under it” (Bolzano 2004,
46), but strictly speaking, it is “that attribute of an idea by
virtue of which it represents just these objects and no others”
(Bolzano 1973, 104). That particular internal property mediates the
association of a collection (the extension) with an idea. In this
manner, Bolzano wants to stress the internal link between ideas and
their extensions, and the uniqueness of the extension of each idea
(Bolzano 1973, 105).

The fact that the idea of prime number represents all prime numbers is thus an internal property of this idea, that is, it is not a relation (the concept of prime number is a relational one, but its extension is a property). In practice, however, Bolzano takes the extension of an idea to be a collection of all its objects.

Each objectual idea has a unique extension, and only objectual ideas have an extension (in other words, Bolzano does not recognize the empty collection or set).

Objectual ideas are divided into singular (e.g., “God”, “universe”, “Aristotle”, “my actual intuition of the pleasant fragrance of this rose”, “even prime number”) and general (“animal”, “substance”, “quantity”).

Against the law of inverse relation between content and extension of
ideas, advocated by logicians since Arnauld and
Nicole's *Port-Royal Logic*, Bolzano invokes the existence of
redundant ideas (e.g., “ triangular figure which has
angles”) and of contradictory ideas, which have content, but no
extension. The following example aroused criticism and even provoked a
controversy (see Sebestik 1992, 151–152): the idea “man who
knows all living European languages” has at the same time a
larger content and a larger extension than the idea “man who
knows all European languages”. Rusnock (2000) proposed a less
controversial example: the idea “1” has both smaller
content and smaller extension than the idea “solution of the
equation *x*^{2} = 1”. The rule of the inverse
relation between content and extension nevertheless holds in the case
of concepts formed by the conjunction of characteristics.

### 5.5 Intuitions and concepts

Bolzano takes over Kant's distinction between two kinds of ideas,
intuitions and concepts, but rejects Kant's definitions. For Bolzano,
a pure concept is an idea that is not an intuition and does not
contain an intuition as a part. To these two kinds, Bolzano adds a
third: the *mixed* ideas, which contain both concepts and
intuitions as parts. As pure concepts play an important role in
Bolzano's theory of science, mathematics, for example, being a purely
conceptual science, everything depends on how intuitions are
defined.

Although many subjective intuitions are indirectly produced by the action of an
external object that causes a sensation in us, they correspond to ideas in
themselves. There are intuitions in themselves because intuitions
can be parts of propositions and thus have the same objective status
as other ideas. For this reason, Bolzano cannot define them by means
of subjective intuitions, which are mental events. He advances a
definition in purely objective terms: an intuition is nothing other than a
*simple singular idea*, simple with respect to content,
singular with respect to extension.

According to Kant, intuitions are singular (subjective)
representations, but according to his definition, even ideas
expressed by a proper name like “Alexander the Great” or
“Sirius” would be intuitions. Bolzano's subjective
intuitions are just ideas of the immediate effect of an external
object on our sensibility; they represent the change aroused in
ourselves on that occasion. Subjective intuitions are representations
of sensations and other mental events, and intuitions in themselves
their objective counterparts. The object of an intuition is always
real, but one should not confuse it with the external object. The
singular idea of a physical object, e.g. the idea “Alexander
the Great”, cannot be an intuition, because it contains both
intuitions and concepts. In fact, we infer the existence of an
external object from the intuitions we receive due to its causal
action. “[…] we infer that there is an outer object
acting on us only because a certain change in our inner self takes
place, a change that we interpret as the object's effect on
us.” (Bolzano 2004, 50). Expressed in words, an intuition is
the idea of “this, which occurs in me just now, which I just
now see or hear or feel” and its object is just “that
change that then takes place in us” and nothing else (*ibid.*).
The uniqueness of that change means that its idea is singular.

Despite the fact that verbal expressions of intuitions usually contain
several words, intuitions are simple ideas. In fact, the only word
that designates an intuition is the demonstrative “this”
[*dies*], the rest of the expression being just a redundancy,
because “the object that it represents remains throughout the
same single one, whether we think the additions or not”
(*ibid.* 51). Thus, in the idea “this red”, the
part “red” does nothing to narrow the extension; the
remaining part, “this”, is simple and, being singular, is
an intuition.

As a consequence, concepts may be singular, but complex (e.g. “God”, “7”), or simple but either objectless or general (i.e., having no object at all or more than one) (“round square” has no object, “proposition” has infinitely many objects). Proper names, which can be expressed by means of definite descriptions, always designate mixed ideas; the intuitions present in the idea “Socrates”, for example, might represent the sounds of which the name is composed.

Propositions containing only pure concepts are called conceptual
propositions; those containing intuitions are called empirical
propositions. This classification of propositions, founded only on the
structural properties of ideas, is the logical counterpart of Kant's
distinction between *a priori* and *a posteriori*
judgments, which is relative to the origin of the ideas that occur in
them and defined in subjective terms (*TS*, §§ 133,
306).

### 5.6 Extensional relations between ideas: the logic of classes

Of the two main parts of Bolzano's formal logic, the extensional
logic of ideas (the logic of classes) and the extensional logic of
propositions, the first part comes from a long tradition beginning
with Boethius (and derived from Aristotelian syllogistic) and ending
– in Bolzano's times – with Gergonne. Bolzano did not take his
logic of ideas from Gergonne or Euler, the most
influential authors in their time, but rather from a small booklet
(*Grundriss der Logik*) by a now completely forgotten logician,
J.G.E. Maass, published in 1806 (4th ed. 1823).

Bolzano's fundamental schema of extensional relations between ideas
can already be found in Maass' *Logic*. Bolzano made some
modifications and generalized it to relations between classes of
ideas and also to relations between empty (objectless) ideas. This
last generalization is important for Bolzano's propositional logic:
the relations between empty ideas are defined by means of the method
of variation that appears here for the first time in the *TS*.

Bolzano defined a system of relations between the extensions of
ideas. The first relations he defines are compatibility
[*Verträglichkeit*] and its negation, incompatibility.
Two ideas *A* and *B* are compatible if they have
(represent) at least one object in common, i.e., if at least one
object falls under both *A* and *B*. In the case in
which not only some but all objects represented by *A* are
also represented by *B*, *A* is included in *B*.
If this relation is reciprocal, i.e., if *A* is included in
*B* and *B* included in *A*, the ideas
*A* and *B* are equivalent (coextensive). Further, we
have two special cases: proper compatibility, i.e., compatibility
where neither *A* is included in *B*, nor *B* in
*A*; this relation is called by Bolzano overlapping or
linking [*Verschlungenheit oder Verkettung*]. Another is
subordination [*Unterordnung*] which is proper inclusion,
without reciprocity.

The negative cases give rise to three kinds of incompatibility:
exclusion (omnilateral incompatibility), contradiction and
contrariety (incompatibility without contradiction). Exclusion
[*Ausschliessung*] differs from incompatibility only in
comparing three or more ideas or collections of ideas: the ideas
*A*, *B*, *C*, … exclude each other if
they are incompatible and if not even two of them are compatible with
each other. To define contradiction, Bolzano needs also the universal
class which is the extension of the concept “something in
general” [*Etwas überhaupt*].

As all these relations are derived from compatibility and its negation, it is possible to represent both the relations between ideas and those between propositions in the form of a genealogical tree (see Sebestik 1992 and 1992a). Here are only the definitions of the most important of them for pairs of objectual ideas, written in our symbolic language (the objectuality condition excludes the definition of contradiction for ideas having the broadest possible extension).

AiscompatiblewithB= _{df}ext A∩ extB≠ ∅AisincompatiblewithB= _{df}ext A∩ extB= ∅AisincludedinB= _{df}Ais compatible withBand extA⊂ extBAiscontradictorywithB= _{df}Ais incompatible withBand extA∪ extB= universal classAisequivalenttoB= _{df}Ais included inBandBis included inAAiscontrarytoB= _{df}AandBare incompatible but not contradictory

## 6. The method of variation

### 6.1 Propositions and propositional forms

Bolzano's logic of extensional relations between propositions represents a major innovation which has no equivalent in traditional logic. It is based on what is called the method of variation. Its fundamental concepts are defined by means of propositional or rather sentential form.

The method of variation consists in the substitution of appropriate
ideas for variables at the places indicated by some sentential form and the examination
of the truth values of the resulting propositions. According to
Bolzano, logical relations imply some variation in the propositions
which they connect. The sentential form [*Satzform*] is a
linguistic expression obtained from a proposition, or rather from a
sentence which expresses it, by considering some of its parts
variable.

This characteristic Bolzanian concept has, so to speak, two faces.
Sometimes, Bolzano expresses it by means of letters:
“*A* has [the property] *b*” or
“*A* is *B*”. But very often, he simply
writes “Caius has wisdom and in this proposition, the idea
*Caius* is variable”. These two ways of writing
correspond to two different levels. On the first, linguistic level,
we deal with proper sentential forms, i.e., with expressions
containing variables, which become sentences (and express
propositions) after appropriate substitutions are made. When we write
sentential forms, we do not write incomplete propositions, because
there are no such entities. We write only
“*satzähnliche Verbindungen*”, combinations
of signs which resemble propositions. The second level is the level
of propositions and ideas in themselves, the level of meaning. Here,
Bolzano cannot use variables, letters or other indeterminate signs.
In the realm of the propositions and ideas in themselves, there are
no indeterminate entities that would correspond to sentential forms;
there are only propositions, true or false. This might be the reason
for Bolzano's cumbersome way of speaking about “the idea
*Caius* considered variable”. For Bolzano, the use of
genuine sentential forms is just a convenient linguistic procedure
yielding results which can be interpreted in terms of propositions.
Speaking of substitutions in sentential forms is then nothing more
than a *façon de parler* about atemporal relations
between species of propositions. Bolzano's loose manner of speaking
about substitutions of ideas in a sentential form instead of speaking
about their linguistic expressions is adopted in what follows. To
consider one or several ideas in a given proposition variable means
to take the class of all propositions which have the same structure
and contain the same ideas except at places occupied by the
“variable ideas”. This is the sense of Bolzano's
identification of a propositional form with a species or class of
propositions, proposed already in the *Contributions* in 1810,
and confirmed by several passages of the *TS*. A sentential
form, or equivalently the corresponding proposition “in which
certain ideas are considered variable”, can generate a whole
class of propositions if appropriate ideas are substituted for the
variable ideas. A proposition which results from such a substitution
performed on the given proposition (on the given sentential form) is
called a *variant*. As in the case of mathematical functions,
Bolzano insists that speaking about variation is only metaphorical.
There is no actual variation, no change in time, only atemporal
relations between a proposition, the class of ideas admitted for
substitution, and the class of propositions resulting from the
successive substitutions. Simultaneous substitutions for several
“variable ideas” in the same proposition also have their
place in Bolzano's logic.

Which ideas are admitted for variation? Some interpreters (e.g.
Siebel 1996, 195) think that *a priori*, any idea may be
considered variable. If, however, we take into account Bolzano's
*practice*, we notice that Bolzano *never* varies
logical and mathematical ideas other than ideas of numbers and
quantities, although he never forbids it (one could for instance
conceive of the variation of propositional connectives).

Another critical point of Bolzano's theory requires elucidation: the notion of “appropriate” substitution (substitution of appropriate ideas). Bolzano's only explicit criterion is the objectual character of the resulting proposition (i.e., the objectuality of its subject-idea). Some other constraints are needed in his logic of probability: the set of ideas admitted for substitution in a proposition must contain only non-equivalent ideas.

The ideas admitted for substitution cannot transform an objectual proposition into an empty (non-objectual) one. In the proposition “the man Caius is mortal”, I may substitute “Sempronius”, “Titus”, etc. for “Caius” and obtain true propositions. “But if we replace it with another idea, e.g. ‘rose’ or ‘triangle’, then the proposition that emerges not only has no truth, it does not even have objectuality” (Bolzano 1973, 189; I have modified the translation slightly), because their subject-ideas “the man rose” and “the man triangle” are empty. If we begin with the proposition “Caius is mortal”, by contrast, the substitution of “rose” for “Caius” yields an objectual proposition which is moreover true.

Validity and other logical properties and relations are defined only under the assumption of admissible substitutions.

### 6.2 Validity and analyticity

Two concepts prepare the construction of the logical system: validity
and analyticity. When the method of variation is applied to a
proposition, three different cases may arise: either the class of
propositions obtained by substitution contains only true
propositions, or it contains only false propositions, or it contains
both true and false propositions. In the first case, the initial
proposition is called *universally valid* (relative to given
variables), in the second *universally* *invalid*.
Bolzano does not give a name to the third case; such propositions
could be called neutral. Here are some examples:

The man Caius is mortal

is universally valid relative to the variable idea “Caius” because each appropriate substitution generates a true proposition, or alternatively, because all its objectual variants are true.

The man Caius is omniscient

is universally invalid relative to the same variable idea “Caius”, because all its variants are false.

The same proposition

The man Caius is omniscient

is neutral relative to the variable idea “omniscient”, because some of its variants are true (e.g. the first example quoted) while others are false (the second example).

The degree of validity [*Grad der Gültigkeit*] of a
proposition relative to chosen variables is the ratio of the number
of *true* propositions obtained by variation to the number of
*all* propositions obtained. There may be an infinity of
propositions in either case, but here, constraints on the admissible
substitutions apply and above all, Bolzano only considers
propositions having a finite number of variants. As an example, let
us take the proposition “2, which is a number between 1 and 10,
is prime” and vary 2: its degree of validity is 2/5. The degree
of validity of a proposition is a number from the closed interval
[0,1]. It is 1 for valid propositions, 0 for invalid propositions
and a proper fraction for other propositions.

Properly speaking, Bolzano's concept of universal validity is not a
logical notion. It depends on specifically chosen variables. To
obtain what we call a logical truth (Bolzano used the term
‘logically analytic’), he
defined another preliminary notion: analyticity. Bolzano's
analyticity is not our analyticity, and can be explained as a
generalization of his notion of validity (Bolzano's term is
“universal validity” [*allgemeine
Gültigkeit*]; as this notion is relative to ideas considered
variable, I prefer to use simply the term “validity”).
Valid propositions are those whose variants relative to the given
variables are all true. Analytic propositions are those which contain
at least one variable idea such that the resulting variants are
either all true (analytically true propositions) or all false
(analytically false propositions). Such a definition implies a very
broad conception of analyticity, as is shown by the following
example:

A morally evil man enjoys eternal happiness.

It is analytically false, because it contains the idea “man” relative to which all the variants are false.

Beside its own merits (mathematics is full of such propositions),
this kind of analyticity is an intermediate step towards logical
analyticity. After quoting such examples as “*A* is
*A*”, “*A* which is *B* is
*A*”, “Every object is *B* or not
*B*”, Bolzano also defines logically analytic
propositions. They are propositions whose only invariable parts are
logical ideas. The logically analytic true propositions are instances
of logical laws.

Bolzano does not give a definition or a list of logical concepts
permitting to separate them from non-logical ideas (for a tentative
list, see Sebestik 1999, 503–505). He simply says “that nothing
is necessary for judging the analytic nature of [the previous
examples] besides logical knowledge, because the concepts that make up
the invariant part of these propositions all belong to logic”
(Bolzano 1973, 193). Nevertheless, he is aware of the difficulty to
separate logical and non-logical ideas: the “domain of concepts
belonging to logic is not circumscribed to the extent that
controversies could not arise at times” (Bolzano 1837, §
148). The main problems arise from the confrontation of Bolzano's
definition with his examples. He declares some of them analytic by
means of problematic definitions (example: “every effect has a
cause”). The examples of § 447 are analytically true:
“the soul of Socrates is a simple substance” (the variable
idea being “Socrates”), “the angles of an
equilateral triangle make altogether two right angles” (analytic
with the variable idea “equilateral”),
“if *a*^{2}/2 =
*b*, then *a* = ± √ 2*b*”
(the variable idea is “2”), but the general truths from
which they follow are synthetic: “every soul is a simple
substance” (even though a soul is defined as a kind of simple substance),
“the angles of each triangle make altogether two right
angles”, “if *a*^{2}/*c* =
*b*, then *a* = ±
√*c**b*”.

The construction of the system is based on the method of variation: the different logical relations between propositions or classes of propositions are defined by means of relations between classes of their true variants. As in the case of validity, these relations are first defined relative to given variables; afterwards, in some particularly important cases such as deducibility, Bolzano defines them in an absolute way, i.e., relative to all non-logical ideas.

Bolzano's system of extensional propositional logic is closely connected with his extensional logic of ideas. In most cases, the same terminology is used for relations between ideas as for relations between propositions: this is the case for compatibility, subordination, equivalence, exclusion, contradiction, contrariety and others. Moreover, in a crucial passage, Bolzano sets up a correspondence between the truth values of propositions and the objectuality and emptiness of ideas:

With ideas, the crucial question was whether or not a certain object is indeed represented by them; the corresponding question for propositions is whether or not they are true. Just as I have called ideas compatible or incompatible with each other, depending on whether or not they have certain objects in common, so I call propositions compatible or incompatible, depending on whether or not there are certain ideas which make all of them true. (Bolzano 1837, § 154, Rusnock's translation).

How are extensional relations between propositions obtained from
those between ideas? In order to transfer the relations between ideas
to propositions, Bolzano has to resort to the method of variation: to
the *referring relation* between an idea and its object will
then correspond the *verifying relation* between an idea and a
propositional form (or, in the fundamental idiom, between one or more
ideas and a proposition in which one or more ideas are considered
variable).

Now Bolzano can define compatibility for propositions in complete
analogy with compatibility for ideas: The propositions *A*,
*B*, *C*, *D*, … are all mutually
compatible with respect to the variable ideas *i*, *j*,
… common to all of them if there is a sequence of ideas which,
substituted for the variables *i*, *j*, …, makes
all these propositions true (Bolzano 1837, § 154). To the
existence (or non-existence) of an object represented by each of the
compatible (or incompatible) ideas corresponds the existence (or
non-existence) of an idea or a sequence of ideas which make each of
the compatible (or incompatible) propositions true.

The examples quoted by Bolzano suggest a simplification of the
correspondence between ideas and propositions by applying a concept
used by Bolzano on several occasions, though not systematically: the
concept of the *system of ideas which make given propositions true
relative to specified variables* (“*Inbegriff von
Vorstellungen, welche die Sätze A, B, C, D, … wahr
machen*”; Bolzano 1837, II, § 155, 114, 122 and §
156, 133). More precisely, such a system of verifying ideas
**VA**(**i**) for the sentential forms
**A**(**i**) = (*A*(*i*,
*j*, …), *B*(*i*, *j*, …),
*C*(*i*, *j*, …), …) is the set of
the sequences of ideas that make the sentential forms
**A**(**i**) true (bold letters represent
sets or sequences, ordinary letters single predicates or variables).
Two examples: the system of verifying ideas for the proposition
*A* “Caesar was a good citizen”, relative to the
variable “Caesar”, is **V***A*
(Caesar) = {Socrates, Aristeides,. . .}. Such a system for the
proposition “Romeo loves Juliet” or, alternatively, for
the sentential form “Loves (*i*, *j*)” is
**V***L*(*i*, *j*) = {<Othello,
Desdemona>, <Romeo, Juliet>, <Juliet, Romeo>,
<Goethe, Lotte>, …}.

Bolzano's examples of compatible propositions are like the following:
let *A* be “a lion is a mammal”, *B*
“a lion has two wings”. Then *A* and *B*
are compatible with respect to the variable idea “lion”.
There is indeed an idea which makes both *A* and
*B* true; the system of verifying ideas of
*A* and the system of verifying ideas of *B* contain
both the idea “bat”:

VA(lion) = {man, dog, lion, bat, …},VB(lion) = {swallow, eagle, bat, …}

In this example, the two propositions are compatible because the same idea “bat” makes both true. Bolzano's compatibility is our simultaneous realizability or satisfiability.

Now it is possible to propose the following definition of compatible
propositions: Two propositions *A* and *B* are
*compatible* if their systems of verifying ideas are
compatible in the sense of the logic of classes:

A(i) andB(i) are compatible ifVA(i) ∩VB(i) ≠ ∅.

All extensional logical relations between propositions can now be
constructed by means of elementary set-theoretical relations between
their systems of verifying ideas. The result is a genealogical tree
whose fundamental structure is exactly the same as the structure of
the tree representing the relations between ideas. In order to stress
the correspondence between ideas and propositions Bolzano uses the
same terms (except deducibility) for the relations between ideas and
those between propositions. As before, **i** is the
sequence of variable ideas (*i*, *j*…);
**A**(**i**) =
(*A*(**i**), *B*(**i**),
*C*(**i**), …);
**M**(**i**) =
(*M*(**i**), *N*(**i**),
*O*(**i**), …). In the following
definitions, variables are omitted; the reader may supply them or may
consider the defined relations as logical relations *strict sense*,
all non-logical terms being taken as variables; the systems of
verifying ideas have to be adapted accordingly. As in the case of the
logic of classes, Bolzano constructed the complete system of
extensional relations between propositions; here only the most
important ones are given.

Ais compatible withM

(VA ∩ VM≠ ∅)

Mis deducible [ableitbar] fromA

(the sets of propositionsAandMare compatible andVA⊂VM)

Ais equivalent toM

(Ais deducible fromMandMis deducible fromA, i.e.VA = VM)

Ais incompatible withM

(VA∩VM= ∅)

AandMare contradictory

(¬Ais equivalent toMandAequivalent to ¬M, i.e.,VA=V¬MandV¬A=VM)

Bolzano's system of relations between propositions is constructed from the extensional relations between ideas as defined in the Maass-Bolzano logic of classes. The concept of a system of verifying ideas plays a crucial role in the systematic reconstruction of Bolzano's variation logic.

Both the class-logical relations and the relations between propositions are constructed from the initial relation of compatibility by adding specific conditions to previously defined relations. Compatibility is thus the basic relation of Bolzano's extensional logic. It is embedded in the very foundations of his system and all other relations (with the exception of different cases of disjunction, Bolzano 1837, § 160), deducibility included, are special cases of it.

### 6.3 Deducibility

Bolzano considered the relation of deducibility “the most
important concept of logic”. “One especially noteworthy
case occurs, however, if not just some, but *all* of the ideas
that, when substituted for *i*, *j*, … in
*A*, *B*, *C*, … make all these true,
also make all of *M*, *N*, *O*, …. true
[…] with respect to the variable parts *i*, *j*,
…” (Bolzano 2004, 54). Note that Bolzano's definition,
in agreement with Aristotle but contrary to the modern concept of
logical consequence, requires compatibility.

For Bolzano, it is impossible to deduce anything from contradictory
premises (see Berg 1962 and 1992, 82); in particular, nothing follows
from the premise *A*≠*A*.

In the general case, Bolzano's deducibility is a triadic relation between the premises, the conclusion and the variable ideas. Our logic focuses immediately on the variation of all and only non-logical elements, but Bolzano's concept is very useful allowing one to make deductions in a domain whose non-logical concepts are not submitted to variation.

Let us examine some examples:

The relation of deducibility in the *general* sense holds
between the premise:

“Leipzig is north of Dresden (both places being in the northern hemisphere)”,

and the conclusion:

“In winter, the days are shorter in Leipzig than in Dresden”.

Such a deduction works with two variable ideas, “Leipzig” and “Dresden”, and depends also on astronomical knowledge.

The next example shows *logical* deducibility where the only
invariable ideas are logical concepts:

All AareBIt is false that all not- Care not-AIt is false that all Care not-B

(Notice that Bolzano uses the predicate “it is false that” as a synonym for the logical particle “not”. He does not consistently distinguish object- and meta-language).

Bolzano's adherence to Aristotelian tradition has some slight
drawbacks. The requirement that the premises be compatible complicates
some inferences. Against Herbart and Fries, Bolzano thinks that
contraposition requires a supplementary premise: From “all
*X* are *Y*”, it is possible to deduce “all
not-*Y* are not-*X*” only if we add as premise
“the idea not-*Y* is not empty”.

### 6.4 Bolzano's deducibility and Tarski's logical consequence

Tarski's concept of logical consequence is close to Bolzano's logical
deducibility. Tarski's first formulation in terms of substitution is
even simply a paraphrase of Bolzano's definition. Tarski speaks about
the replacement of all non-logical constants by any other constants
in the sentences of the class **K** and in the sentence
*X*, the result of these replacements being **K**′
and *X*′, and states that “the sentence
*X*′ must be true provided only that all sentences of the
class **K**′ are true” (Tarski 1983,
415). This preliminary formulation must, however, be abandoned, if
“the language we are dealing with does not posses a sufficient
stock of extra-logical constants” (*ibid.*). Bolzano
escapes this objection, because his logic deals with ideas in
themselves and not with linguistic expressions, and because he assumes
that for every object there is an idea that represents it (the
difficulties involved with this assumption were discussed in detail by
Simons (1987, 42), Siebel (1996, 216–223), and Sebestik (1999, 501,
note 34); briefly, the price for this hypothesis seems too high for a
contemporary logician). Tarski, who did not make Bolzano's assumption
with respect to languages, stated his definitive formulation in terms
of models, or the satisfaction of sentential functions by sequences of
objects.

There are three main differences between Bolzano's and Tarski's concepts.

- Tarski defined logical consequence for formalized languages, while Bolzano's deducibility holds for propositions and ideas in themselves expressed in natural language. According to Berg (1973, 21), “this difference is of vital importance for the study of the relationship between consequence and other logical notions”, which resulted e.g. in the equivalence between logical consequence and syntactic derivability in first order logic and, in general, the separation of syntax and semantics. Nevertheless, fundamentally, Bolzano's deducibility is a semantic notion because it operates with the idea of “making true a propositional form”. Above all, slightly modified, Bolzano's relevant theorems remain true in Tarski's system.
- Tarski, as other authors before him, rejected the condition of compatibility of the premises. It is precisely this condition which makes Bolzano's system cumbersome and more complicated than ours. We shall see that this condition was essential for Bolzano's concept of probability and for the link between deductive and inductive logic.
- Bolzano's method of variation operates within
*one*universe, while in modern semantics, we generalize both over interpretations and domains (Berg, 1973, 21).

Marc Siebel tried to show that “the resemblances between
Bolzanian deducibility and Tarski's logical consequence are quite
limited [*sehr gering*]” (1996, 185–223), considering the
distance that separates Bolzano's and Tarski's concepts. I agree with
Siebel that it is a question of appraisal [*eine
Ermessungsfrage*]. If we take into account not the initial
Bolzanian concept of deducibility relative to given variable ideas,
but logical derivability, and either adapt or cancel the requirement
of consistency of the premises, the distance seems rather short. For
me, the main reasons for thinking the two conceptions to be quite
similar are the facts that in all logical literature between Bolzano
and Tarski (with the possible exception of Carnap), we cannot find
anything else so close to Tarski, and that many of Bolzano's theorems
about deducibility may be easily translated into Tarski's idiom and
remain true.

### 6.5 Exact deducibility

Bolzano tried to refine the concept of deducibility by adapting it to
the then-current inferential practices in science. The result is the
concept of *exact* or strict, adequate, irredundant
*deducibility* [*genaue, genau bemessene Ableitbarkeit*]
or deducibility in the narrower sense, where there are no idle
elements. The proposition *M* is *exactly deducible*
from the premises *A*, *B*, *C*, …
if *M* is deducible from those premises and “when the
same does not hold for any part ot the [set of]
propositions *A*, *B*, *C*, …”
(Bolzano 2004, 54) “and we are not able to take away a single
component [of the premises], much less an entire proposition”
(Bolzano 1973, 213). Bolzano proves that the premises of an exact
inference are independent and one can prove that in cases of exact
deducibility, the premises and the conclusion must share at least one
variable (see George, 1983). A deduction which is not exact is
called *redundant* [*überfüllt*]. In exact
deducibility the conclusion cannot be deduced from any proper subset
of the premises. The syllogism *Barbara* (i.e., All *A*
are *B*, All *B* are *C*, so All *A*
are *C*) is an exact deduction, while the deduction of
“Some *B* are
*A*” from the same two premises is redundant. Exact
deducibility requires that *all* the premises and *all*
the ideas contained in them are necessary to draw the conclusion; this
condition is the translation into logical terms of the condition of
analytic proofs. Propositions of degree 0 or 1 (e.g., universally
invalid or universally valid propositions) are excluded both from the
premises and the conclusion. Bolzano's exact deducibility thus
anticipates the logic of relevance of Anderson and Belnap (1975) in
certain respects.

### 6.6 Some theorems

- Deducibility is asymmetrical and transitive, but because of the condition of compatibility of premises, it is reflexive only for compatible propositions;
- from
**A**, a class of compatible premises, it is possible to deduce ¬*M*iff**A**is incompatible with*M*; - if one can deduce
**M**from**A**,**X**as well as from**A**, ¬**X**, one can deduce**M**from**A**alone; - contraposition, if the degree of validity of the premise and the conclusion are neither 1 nor 0;
- if all propositions deducible from the premises
**A**are true,**A**is true; - a case of Gentzen's cut-rule:
if from

**A**, one can deduce**M**and from**M**,**R**, one can deduce**X**, then from**A**,**R**one can deduce**X**; - deduction theorem (
*T**S*II, §224.2, p. 396):

If the inference:*A*,*B*,*C*,*E*,*F*,*G*, …*M*,*N*,*O*, …is valid, then so is:

*A*,*B*,*C*, …if *E*,*F*,*G,*… are true, then*M*,*N*,*O*, … are also true.

### 6.7 Deducibility and probability

One of the main reasons why Bolzano's notion of deducibility presupposes the
compatibility of the premises is that it renders possible the
extension of deductive logic to inductive logic via probability.
He defines the
*conditional probability* (or relative validity) of a
proposition *M*(**i**) with respect to a class of
premises or hypotheses **A**(**i**) and
variables **i**, as the ratio of the
number of cases in which all the propositions of the class as well as
*M*(**i**) are true to the number of cases in
which only the propositions **A**(**i**)
are all true. In other words, it is the ratio of the number of true
variants of **A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) to the number of true variants of
**A**(**i**). (As with the concept of degree
of validity, Bolzano's definition applies only if the number of
variants is finite.) As a consequence, the probability
of *M*(**i**) relative to
**A**(**i**) is a fraction in the closed
interval [0,1]. Bolzano's conditional probability is objective,
*an sich*. In probability inferences, only one idea from each collection of
equivalent (coextensive) ideas is admitted for substitutions, because
if for each variable idea we admit ideas equivalent to it, “the
set of true propositions and the set of false propositions produced
from the given proposition will both be infinite in every case”
(Bolzano 1973, 189), and the probability relation might not be well
determined.

One can immediately see why the premises of a probable deduction must be
compatible: the probability of *M*(**i**) is
defined only if the denominator of the fraction is not zero, which
means that the premises **A**(**i**) are
compatible. On the other hand, the number of ideas that make
both **A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) true cannot be greater than the number of
ideas that make true *M*(**i**); as a
consequence, the conditional probability of
*M*(**i**) cannot be greater than 1. It is 1
exactly when the number of ideas that make true both
**A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) is equal to the number of ideas that
make true **A**(**i**) alone, which means
that all substitutions of ideas that make true
**A**(**i**) also make true
*M*(**i**), i.e. if
*M*(**i**) is *deducible* from
**A**(**i**). In other words, if
*M*(**i**) is deducible from
**A**(**i**), its probability relative to
**A**(**i**) is equal to 1, which means
that the probability equals certainty. The probability is zero if no
ideas make both **A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) true, i.e. if
**A**(**i**) and
*M*(**i**) are incompatible. Incompatibility and
certainty are thus two extreme cases of probability with values of 0 and
1.

This is an extraordinary achievement. Bolzano's approach yields the
first logical definition of probability. For the first time deductive
logic and inductive logic are united in a global theory and the
former appears as a limit case of the latter. It is possible that in
his *Tractatus* 5.15, Wittgenstein took over Bolzano's treatment of
probability, perhaps through the mediation of the 1st edition of the
*Philosophical Propedeutic* of R. Zimmermann (1853). Carnap's
regular confirmation functions, too, are strongly reminiscent of
Bolzano's approach.

Bolzano adds proofs of some standard theorems, and also defines subjective probability and different important probabilistic notions such as the degree of confidence, the credibility of a witness, etc. He gives the formula of the degree of credibility of an event reported by independent testimonies as a function of the number of witnesses, of the number of testimonies, and of the number of true and false propositions stated by each witness. All these concepts play an important role in the chapter “on the nature of historical knowledge, particularly concerning miracles” in Bolzano 1834.

## 7. The objective connection among truths: grounding (*Abfolge*)

The idea of a reform of logic already appeared in 1810 under the heading
“objective connection among truths” in
the *Contributions*. Developed in the *TS*, it
represents the last stage of the development of formal logic in
Bolzano and at the same time the first modern study of axiomatic
systems. Although the logical relations studied in the previous
sections of the *TS* include relations among
collections of truths, they do not take into account the relationship
of *Abfolge* (explained below), which is necessary to
transform a simple collection of truths into a theory.

Bolzano's idea of an objective order among truths has its origin in
the Aristotelian distinction between proofs of the *fact* and
those that yield the *reason* of the fact. Bolzano's problem is
that of providing precise criteria for distinguishing the two types of
proofs. Proofs of facts, which Bolzano considers to be simple
subjective proofs or certifications, may, if correct, be used in
science, but they are not explanatory, for they do not capture the
objective connections among truths. The goal of a science is to order
its theorems according their relations of objective dependence, to
ground such theorems objectively in previous theorems and eventually
in axioms. Objective proofs are assumed to be explanatory and Bolzano
calls them grounding proofs [*Begründungen*].

Are *indirect proofs* (apagogical, proofs by reduction to
absurdity) explanatory? Bolzano definitely preferred direct proofs,
because in indirect proofs the “false conclusion could never
have been produced if all the premises from which we derive it were
true” (Bolzano 2004, 78). Hafner (1999, 387) showed that
Bolzano's objections to indirect proofs were not related to the
compatibility requirement or the concept of deducibility, but only to
the concept of grounding. According to Hafner, Bolzano prefers direct
proofs for two reasons: 1) indirect proofs proceed by a detour
[*Umweg*] and contain redundant premises, 2) indirect proofs
always contain a false premise which cannot be admitted as the ground
of other truths. Bolzano thinks that indirect proofs can be
transformed into direct proofs through the simplification of the false
propositions contained in them. Nevertheless, for pragmatic reasons,
namely the simplicity of expression, in his *Theory of
Magnitudes* [*Grössenlehre*, see bibliography], he
also sometimes accepts “here and there” indirect proofs as
(approximate) groundings.

Bolzano calls the ground-consequence relation *Abfolge*
(translated as “consequence” or “entailment”,
more recently as *grounding*; I shall take *grounding
relation* and *ground-consequence* [*Grund und
Folge*] *relation* as synonyms: *Abfolge* =
*Grund und Folge Verhältnis*). It must not be confused
with the purely logical relation of deducibility. It has no exact
equivalent in our logic because it is a “material”
relation in the sense that it depends on the “particular
character of ideas” that occur in it (1837, II, 348). The notion
of grounding is central to Bolzano's theory; however, Bolzano
acknowledges that his analysis of grounding is incomplete and
tentative, merely a first attempt to circumscribe the new
concept. “Almost everything I advance in this part is tinged
with uncertainty, on many topics I have not reached any decision, and
at best my inquiries are only fragments and suggestions which will
have attained their goal if they provide others with the stimulus to
reflect further on these matters.” (Bolzano 1837, II, §
195, 327–8).

According to Bolzano, the *ground-consequence* relation holds
only between truths, not between propositions in general. He has no
definite answer as to whether the relation is simple or definable. He
tries to characterize it implicitly by its properties expressed in a
series of theorems. In order to obtain a general concept valid for all
disciplines, he takes examples from various sciences: metaphysics,
morals, physics, mathematics, and logic. Despite his initial
conjecture that the ground-consequence relation might be simple and
thus undefinable, at the end of his investigation, he conjectures that
grounding might well be a formal relation definable in terms of
deducibility in an axiomatic system.

The grounding relation holds between a set of truths and their immediate consequences. “There is only one [grounding] for each truth, because the objective ground can only be a single ground” (Bolzano 1837, IV, § 528, 266). If a truth is the consequence of several truths, they constitute its total ground while each true premise is a partial ground.

Bolzano begins by comparing the grounding relation to deducibility and
causality. Contrary to grounding, deducibility can hold also between
false propositions. It can be reciprocal (equivalence) and it is
transitive and reflexive for propositions of degree of validity ≠
0. Moreover, deducibility presupposes the notions of sentential form
and of variable. On the other hand, grounding is neither reflexive nor
transitive; it is anti-symmetrical and (in some cases at least)
connects truths independently of all variation. The two relations are
compatible, however: the same proposition may be at the same time
deduced from and grounded in its premise. Hence there are two kinds of
grounding:
*formal* grounding that is at the same time deducibility and
*material* grounding that holds without deducibility.

Mechanics, particularly the theorem of the composition of forces (see
Bolzano 1842), yields a causal model of grounding. It is causality
that confers the particular character on the grounding relation but
eventually, causality is absorbed by it. Finally, for Bolzano, the
proposition “*A* is the cause of *B*” means
that the proposition “*A* exists” contains the
ground of the proposition “*B* exists”. As
causality holds only between actual things, it is reduced to
propositions about the grounding relation between real objects.

Let us take an example. The propositions “it is warmer in summer than in winter” and “the thermometer stands higher in summer than in winter” are equivalent (one is deducible from the other) relative to the variables “summer” and “winter”, but “only the latter can be considered as a consequence of the former” (Bolzano 1973, § 162, 245–246).

The different examples Bolzano considers show the difficulty if not the impossibility of constructing a general concept of grounding which is valid for all disciplines. The situation is different in purely conceptual sciences. If we take the following example:

Socrates was Athenian Socrates was a philosopher Socrates was Athenian and a philosopher,

we have a grounding relation, because the premises are simpler than
the conclusion. Bolzano invokes the same argument against Euclid's
parallel postulate, which is a proposition too complex to merit the
title of axiom or ground and should be replaced by the principle of
similarity. The Socrates example relates to the simple/complex
opposition, but in general, simplicity is not a sufficient condition
of the ground. According to the *Contributions*, all axioms
have simple subject- and predicate-concepts, although, conversely, a
proposition containing only simple concepts is not necessarily an
axiom; no such criterion is present in the *TS* (perhaps he
knew better by then). Thence, simplicity would be the primary but not
exclusive principle ordering axiomatic theories. The binomial theorem
(1 + *x*)^{n} with an imaginary or real
exponent is more general than with a positive integral exponent, but
the former is considerably more complex and cannot be considered an
objective ground of the latter which should be demonstrated first. In
other examples taken from geometry the general theorem has priority.
In his *Purely analytical proof* (1817), too, Bolzano proves
first the general theorem for two continuous functions (Russ 2004,
§ 15, 274) and only in § 18 (p. 276–7) for one continuous
function. In these cases, Bolzano puts forward the argument of the greater
generality of the grounds relative to their consequences, even though
the consequences are simpler.

The grounding relation in the purely conceptual sciences has the following properties:

- Only truths may be related by the ground-consequence relation.
- The grounding relation is irreflexive and anti-symmetrical.
- The complete ground may consist of one or several truths (each of them is called a partial ground), while the complete consequence contains always several truths (partial consequences).
- No conceptual truth can be grounded in an empirical truth, but a conceptual truth may be a partial ground of an empirical one.
- The grounds are more general than their consequences, where generality is understood in terms of broader extension of the subject or of the predicate.
- Often but not always, the grounding relation induces an order among theorems according to the degree of complexity (the number of simple concepts occurring in a truth).
- “The simpler truth must be stated in advance of the more complex and, where there is an equal complexity, the more general must always be stated before the more particular” (Bolzano 2004, 79). This property, too, admits exceptions.
- In case of conflict between the criterion of simplicity and that of generality, simplicity is prior to generality.
- The search for the grounds of a truth ends with basic truths (= axioms).

Bolzano distinguishes between *principles* of a science,
*Grundsätze*, which may be demonstrated in another
science, and *basic* truths, *Grundwahrheiten*, which
have no ground and are true axioms. With Bolzano, the status of
axioms changes: instead of being evident, objects of intuition, they
become the starting points of proofs in a deductive theory. Sometimes
even the evidence of theorems is superior to that of axioms, but even
evident theorems need a proof. The role of proofs, too, is
transformed: they have not only to provide subjective certainty, but
above all to integrate the theorems into the whole conceptual system.
The crucial elements of science are proofs exhibiting the objective
connection among truths. In the *TS* we also witness the
appearance, for the first time in the history of logic, of proof
trees, i.e. diagrams showing the dependence of theorems on their
grounds, axioms and auxiliary truths.

At the end of his enquiry, Bolzano considers a set of propositions that may be both demonstrated from and grounded in given axioms. He thinks that from the point of view of pure deduction, not taking grounding into account, there are several possible partitions of such a set into theorems and initial hypotheses. Is not one of these partitions privileged by the grounding relation?

It results from the condition of simplicity that “the number of propositions that we have to admit (as hypotheses) will be for any arbitrary partition [between hypotheses and theorems] greater than when we order them according to their objective connection” (Bolzano 1837, II, § 221, 386). In other words, the ratio between the theorems and the hypotheses is the greatest when we separate them according to the objective connection among truths.

Pursuing this line of thought, Bolzano finally arrives at a possible definition of the grounding relation in terms of the whole axiomatic system: “I occasionally doubt whether the concept of ground and consequence, which I have above claimed to be simple, is not complex after all; it may turn out to be none other than the concept of an ordering of truths which allows us to deduce from the smallest number of simple premises the largest possible number of the remaining truths as conclusions” (Bolzano 1837, II, § 221, 388 note).

Some conclusions may be drawn from this passage (even if Bolzano did not draw them). The notion of a basic truth would have to be transformed: a basic truth would now be one that belongs to a minimal set of hypotheses which allows the most efficient deduction of all the other truths of the system. At the same time, instead of being a particular relation between the ground and its consequence, the concept of grounding in deductive sciences should become a property of the whole system of propositions. Grounding, being no more a simple concept and defined in terms of deducibility by the optimal partition between axioms and theorems, becomes a global property of a deductive theory.

Mancosu (1999, 452) pointed out the difficulties of Bolzano's
conjectural definition. In particular, Bolzano's geometrical examples
“fail to provide sufficient intuitive evidence for
distinguishing grounds from consequences” (*ibid.*). On
the other hand, the holistic model of the optimal partition provides
simply “an arbitrary axiomatic system with the extra condition
of optimality” (*ibid.*), which, he argues, is irrelevant
for the difference between explanatory and non-explanatory
proofs. Nevertheless, “Bolzano had the great merit of singling
out the problem of mathematical explanation as central to the
philosophy of mathematics” even if “his attempted
solution(s) do not satisfactorily answer the issues he cleverly
raised” (*ibid.*).

## 8. Conclusion

While at least some of Bolzano's mathematical works drew the attention
of some of the greatest German mathematicians (Weierstrass, Cantor,
and Dedekind), until the end of the XIXth century his logic met for
the most part with indifference and incomprehension. In mathematics,
Bolzano proved some of the fundamental theorems of analysis, sketched
the first theory of real numbers, produced an extraordinary theory of
real functions, introduced the concept of set and that of the actual
infinite, and stated the characteristic condition of infinite
sets. Even his friend Exner, who had had the benefit of additional
detailed explanations, was unable to understand his reform of logic.
He was not happy with the *TS* because of Bolzano's concepts of
proposition and intuition in itself and of his criticisms of
Herbart. Bolzano's treatment of logic was so radically new that only
at the end of the XIXth century, did philosophers of the Brentano
school begin to understand some of its parts, starting with Kerry,
Twardowski, Meinong and Husserl. Some of the most important logical
ideas of Bolzano spread among Austrian secondary school students
through the first edition of Zimmermann's textbook (1853), which
contained a summary of Bolzano's logic. Being accused of plagiarism,
Zimmermann omitted these passages from Bolzano in the second edition.
Wittgenstein might have taken inspiration from them in writing his
*Tractatus*. Russell knew the *Paradoxes of the
infinite* and some of his thoughts on logic are parallel to
Bolzano's. Curiously, Frege, whose ideas were often so close to those
of Bolzano and who in his time was the only logician capable of
understanding him, never mentioned him. He was confronted with
Bolzano's ideas three times: in one of Kerry's articles, in the
correspondence with Husserl, and later in the controversy with
Korselt (see Sundholm 2000); he never reacted to their allusions.
It is quite possible that he never laid hands on any of Bolzano's works (see
Kreiser 1981), apart, perhaps, from the *Paradoxes of
the infinite*. After Twardowski (1894), it was chiefly Husserl
who drew philosophers' attention to Bolzano. In several of his
books, he praised Bolzano's logic, while insisting at the same time on the
originality of his own phenomenological method (see Sebestik 2003).
Between the two wars, Bolzano's logic and philosophy of mathematics
inspired Heinrich Scholz and Jean Cavaillès. At the same time
Tarski discovered the concept of logical consequence independently of
Bolzano, but Tarski discovered the affinity between his work and
Bolzano's only after Scholz pointed it out to him. However, already
in Twardowski (1894, see Sebestik 1995), the founder of the Polish
Lwow-Warsaw school, Bolzano's ideas are discussed and
criticized at length, and some of them might have become the common ground of
the Polish school (some of Bolzano's expressions are found literally
in Tarski). In 1920, Hans Hahn edited the *Paradoxes of the
infinite* with important critical notes, comparing Bolzano with
Cantor. Karl Menger might have taken inspiration for his theory of
dimension not only from Poincaré, but also from the
*Paradoxes*. Neurath praised Bolzano as one of the ancestors
of the Vienna Circle, because of the conciseness of his style and the
rejection of Kant's philosophy. Some important Bolzanian ideas are
also found in the work of Quine. All these currents are indebted to
Bolzano for the lesson of intellectual rigor and of analytic power.
It is Bolzano who is the true founder of the kind of analytical philosophy
whose core is logic and which is impregnated with science. His logic
has archaic aspects, but he introduced not only new concepts, methods
and theories, new themes and new problems, but above all a new spirit
that has pervaded philosophy ever since.

## Bibliography

### Primary literature

- Bolzano, B., 1969sq.,
*Bernard-Bolzano Gesamtausgabe*, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Fromann-Holzboog. - ––– 1810,
*Beyträge zu einer begründeteren Darstellung der Mathematik*(*Contributions to a better grounded presenta**tion of mathematics*), Prague (English transl. Russ 2004). - –––, 1817,
*Rein analytischer Beweiss des Lehrsatzes, dass zwischen je zwey Werthen, die ein engegengesetztes Resultat gewähren, wenigstens eine reelle Wurzel der Gleichung liege (Purely analytic proof of the theorem that between any two values which give results of opposite sign, there lies at least one real root of the equation)*,Prague (English transl. Russ 2004). - –––, 1834,
*Lehrbuch der Religionswissenschaft*(*Treatise of the science of religion*), Sulzbach: Seidel. - –––, 1837,
*Wissenschaftslehre*, 4 vol., Sulzbach: Seidel; reprint of the 2nd edition 1929–1931, Aalen: Scientia Verlag 1970;*Gesamtausgabe*I 11–14, with important introductions by Berg, J. - –––, 1842,
*Über die**Zusammensetzung der Kräfte*, Prag. - –––, 1972,
*Theory of science, attempt at a detailed and in the main novel exposition of logic with constant attention to earlier authors*, edited and translated by Rolf George, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press. - –––, 1973,
*Theory of science*, edited, with an introduction, by Jan Berg, translated from the German by Burnham Terrell, Dordrecht and Boston: D. Reidel. - –––, 1976,
*Einleitung in die Grössenlehre*und*Erste Begriffe der allgemeinen Grössenlehre Introduction to the Theory of Magnitudes and First concepts of the general Theory of Magnitudes, Bernard-Bolzano Gesamtausgabe*, II A 7, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Fromann-Holzboog (Engl. transl. of the chapter.*On the mathematical method*, 2004, P. Rusnock and R. George, Amsterdam-New York: Rodopi; Ital. transl. with an introd. by C. Cellucci, Torino, Boringhieri, 1966; French transl. Paris, Vrin, 2008). - –––, 1851,
*Paradoxien des Unendlichen*(*Paradoxes of the Infinite*), Leipzig ; (English transl. Steele, D.A., 1950, London: Routledge; new transl. Russ 2004). - –––, 2004,
*On the mathematical method and Correspondence with Exner*, transl. by Rusnock, P., and George, R., Amsterdam-New York: Rodopi; French transl.*De la méthode mathématique et correspondance avec Exner*, 2008, introd. par C. Maigné et J. Sebestik, Paris: Vrin. - –––, 2004a, S. Russ (trans.),
*The mathematical works of Bernard Bolzano*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - –––, 2010,
*Premiers écrits, Philosophie, logique, mathématique*, trad. fr. par M. Bartzel et al., introd. par C. Maigné et J. Sebestik, Paris, Vrin.

### Secondary literature

#### Articles in encyclopedias

- Rootselaar, B. van, 1970–1990, “Bernard Bolzano”, in
*Dictionary of Scientific Biography*, New York. - Künne, W., 1998, “Bernard Bolzano”, in
*Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy*1, London, New York, 824–828.

#### Special issues

*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987. International Workshop*, 1992, Florence: Leo S. Olschki.*Impact of Bolzano's epoch on the development of science*, 1982, Prague.*Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*, 1987, 24 (4).*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987*, 1992, Firenze: Olschki.*Grazer philosophische Studien*, Bolzano and Analytic Philosophy, 1997, 53.*Revue d'Histoire des Science*, Mathématique et logique chez Bolzano, 1999.*Les**Etudes philosophiques*, Bernard Bolzano, 2000, 4.- Morscher, E., (ed.), 2000,
*Bolzanos geistiges Erbe für das 21. Jahrhundert*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Morscher, E., (ed.), 2003,
*Bernard Bolzanos Leistungen in Logik, Mathematik und Physik*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Ganthaler, H.,und Neumaier, O. (ed.), 1997,
*Bolzano und die Österreichische Geistesgeschichte*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. *Philosophiques*, 2003, Bernard Bolzano. Philosophie de la logique et théorie de la connaissance, 30 (1).- Trlifajová, K., (ed.), 2006,
*The solitary thinker Bernard Bolzano*, (Czech), Prague: Filosofia.

### Books and articles on Bolzano

- Anderson, A. R., and Belnap, N. D., 1975
*Entailment: the logic of relevance*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Bar-Hillel, Y., 1952, “Bolzano's propositional logic”,
*Archiv für Mathematik, Logik und Grundlagenforschung*, 1: 65–98. - –––, 1950, “Bolzano's definition of analytic
proposition”,
*Theoria*: 91–117. - Bayerová, M., 1994,
*Bernard Bolzano, the European dimension of his thought*, (Czech), Prague: Filosofia. - Behboud, A., 2000,
*Bolzanos Beiträge zur Mathematik und ihrer Philosophie*([*Bolzano's Contributions to Mathematics and its Philosophy*), Bern: Bern Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science. - Benoist, J., 1999,
*L'a priori conceptuel.**Bolzano, Husserl, Schlick.*Paris: Vrin. - Benthem, J. van, 1984,
*Lessons from Bolzano.*Stanford: Center for the Study of Language and Information, Leland Stanford Junior University. - –––, 1985, “The variety of consequence,
according to Bolzano”,
*Studia Logica*, 44 (4): 389–403. - –––, 2003, “Is there still logic in
Bolzano's key?”, in
*Bernard Bolzanos Leistungen in Logik, Mathematik und Physik*, ed. Morscher, E., Sankt Augustin: Akademia, 11–34. - Berg, J., 1962,
*Bolzano's Logic*, Stockholm: Almquist Wiksell. - –––, 1973, “Editor's introduction”, in Bolzano 1973
- –––, 1977, “Bolzano's contribution to
logic and philosophy of mathematics”, in
*Logic Colloquium 76*, ed. by Gandy, R.O., and Hyland, J.M., Amsterdam: North Holland, 141–171. - –––, 1987, “Bolzano and situation
semantics: variations on a theme of variation”,
*Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*, 24 (4): 373–377. - –––, 1987, “Bolzano on induction”,
*Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*24 (4): 442–446. - –––, 1992,
*Ontology without ultrafilters and possible worlds: An examination of Bolzano's ontology*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Berg, J., 1987, Ganthaler, H., and Morscher, E., “Bolzanos
Biographie in tabellarischer Übersicht”,
*Bolzano – Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*, 24 (4): 353–372. - Bergmann, H., 1970,
*Das philosophische Werk Bernard Bolzanos*, reprint Hildesheim: Olms. - Berka, K., 1981,
*Bernard Bolzano*, Prague: Horizont. - –––, 1982, “ Bolzano's philosophy of
science”, in
*Impact of Bolzano's epoch on the development of science*, Prague, 427–442. - Betti, A., 1998, “
*De Veritate*: another chapter. The Bolzano-Lesniewski connection.” In*The Lvov-Warsaw School and contemporary philosophy.*Edited by Kijania-Placek K. and Wolenski J. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, p. 115–137 - Bouveresse, J., 2000, “Sur les représentations sans
objet, ”
*Les Études Philosophiques*, 4: 519–534 - Buhl, G., 1961,
*Ableitbarkeit und Abfolge in der Wissenschaftslehre Bolzanos*,*Kantstudien*, Ergänzungshefte n° 83. - Bussotti, P., 2000, “The problem of the foundations of
mathematics at the beginning of the nineteenth century : Two lines of
thought: Bolzano and Gauss” (Italian),
*Teoria*(N.S.), 20 (1): 83–95. - Casari, E., 1992, “An interpretation of some ontological and
semantical notions in Bolzano's logic”, in
*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987*, Firenze: Olschki. - Cavaillès, J., 1997,
*Sur la logique et la théorie de la science*, préf. G. Canguilhem and G. Bachelard, postface J. Sebestik, Paris:Vrin. - Cellucci, C., 1992, “Bolzano and multiple-conclusion
logic”, in
*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987*, Firenze: Olschki, 179–189. - Chihara, Ch., 1999, “Frege's and Bolzano's rationalist
conceptions of arithmetic”,
*Revue d‘ historie des sciences*, 52 (3–4): 343–361. - Coffa, A., 1982, “Kant, Bolzano and the emergence of
logicism”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 74: 679–689. - –––, 1991,
*The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Cohen, J.L., 1982, “Bolzano's theory of induction”, in
*Impact of Bolzano's epoch on the development of science*, Prague: 443–457. - Daněk, J., 1975,
*Les projets de Leibniz et de Bolzano: deux sources de logique contemporaine*, Quebec: Presses de l'Université de Laval. - Detlefsen, M., 1988, “Fregean hierarchies and mathematical
explanation”,
*International Studies in Philosophy of Science*, 3: 97–116. - –––, 2010, “Rigor, Re-proof and Bolzano's
critical program”, in
*Constructions*, P. Bour*et al*. (eds.), Festschrift for Gerhard Heinzmann, 171–184, King's College Publications. - Dorn, G. J. W.,1987, “Zu Bolzanos
Wahrscheinlichkeitslehre”,
*Bolzano-Studien.**Philosophia Naturalis*, 24 (4): 423–441. - Etchemendy, J.,1990,
*The concept of logical consequence*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - Fedorov, B. I ., 1980,
*Logic of Bernard Bolzano*, (Russian), Leningrad. - –––, 1988, “Bolzano's ideas on the
methodological analysis of science” (Russian),
*Methodological analysis of the foundations of mathematics ‘Nauka’*, Moscow, 36–46. - Føllesdal D., 2001, “Bolzano, Frege and Husserl on
reference and object”, in
*Future pasts. The analytic tradition in twentieth century philosophy*, edited by Floyd J. and Shieh S., Oxford: Oxford University Press: p. 67–80. - George, R., 1983, “Bolzano's consequence, relevance, and
enthymemes”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 12 (3): 299–318. - –––, 1986, “Bolzano's concept of
consequence”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 83 (10): 558–564. - –––, 1987, “Bolzano on time”,
*Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*: 24 (4): 452–468. - –––, 2004, “Intuitions: the theories of
Kant and Bolzano”, in
*Semantik und Ontologie. Beiträge zur philosophischen Forschung.*Edited by Siebel M. and Textor M.. Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag. - Hafner, J., 1999, “Bolzano's criticism of indirect
proofs”,
*Revue d‘histoire des sciences*, 52 (3–4): 385–398. - Haller, R., 1992, “Bolzano and Austrian Philosophy”,
in
*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987*, Firenze: Olschki. - Jarník, V., 1981,
*Bolzano and the foundations of mathematical analysis*, Prague. - Husserl, E., 1900,
*Logische Untersuchungen, I, Prolegomena zu reiner Logik*(*Logical Investigations*, I,*Prolegomena to pure logic*; Engl. transl. J.N. Findlay, 1973, London: Routledge. - –––, 1969,
*Formal and Transcendental logic*, transl. D. Cairns, The Hague: Nijhoff. - Johnson, D. M., 1976, “Prelude to dimension theory: The
geometrical investigations of Bernard Bolzano”,
*Archive for History of Exact Sciences*, 17: 275–296. - Kerry, B, “Über Anschauung und ihre psychische
Verarbeitung”,
*Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie*, 1885–1891 - Kitcher, K., 1975, “Bolzano's ideal of algebraic
analysis”,
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Science*, 6 (3): 229–269. - Kolman, A., 1961,
*Bernard Bolzano*, Berlin: Akademie Verlag. - Kozelmann Ziv, A., 2010,
*Kräfte, Wahrscheinlichkeit und “Zuversicht”, Bernard Bolzanos Erkenntnislehre*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia Verlag. - Koren L., 2011, “The Problem of Logical Consequence ”, forthcoming in Organon, Bratislava.
- Krause, A., 2004,
*Bolzanos Metaphysik*, München: Alber. - Kreiser, L., 1981, “Logical semantics in Bolzano and the
reproach of Platonism”, (Czech),
*Filozofický časopis*, 29: 94–103. - Krickel, F., 1995,
*Teil und Inbegriff. Bernard Bolzanos Mereologie*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Künne, W., 1997, “Propositions in Bolzano and Frege, ”
*Grazer Philosophische Studien*, 53: 203–240. - –––, 2003, “Bernard Bolzano's
*Wissenschaftslehre*and Polish Analytical philosophy between 1894 and 1935”, in*Philosophy and logic.**In search of the Polish tradition. Essays in Honour of Jan Wolenski on the occasion of his 60th Birthday*, Edited by Kijania-Placek K., Dordrecht: Kluwer, p. 179–192. - –––, 2006, “Analyticity and logical truth
from Bolzano to Quine”, in
*The Austrian contribution to analytical philosophy*, edited by Textor, M., New York: Routledge, p. 184–249. - –––, 2008,
*Versuche Über Bolzano. Essays on Bolzano*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Lapointe, S., 2000 “Analyticité, universalité
et quantification chez Bolzano”,
*Les Études Philosophiques*, 4: 455–470. - –––, 2008,
*Qu'est-ce que l'analyse?*, Paris: Vrin. - –––, 2011,
*Bolzano's Theoretical Philosophy*, Houndsmill: Palgrave Macmillan. - Laugwitz, D., 1964/1965, “Bemerkungen zu Bolzanos
Grössenlehre”,
*Archive for History of Exact Sciences*, 2: 398–409. - Laz, J., 1993,
*Bolzano critique de Kant*, Paris: Vrin. - Lukasiewicz, J., 1970,
*The logical foundations of probability calculus*, in*Selected Works*, Amsterdam: North Holland. - Mačák, K., 1996, “Bernard Bolzano and the
calculus of probabilities”, (Czech), in
*Mathematics in the 19th century*, (Czech), 39–55, Prague: Prometheus. - Mancosu, P., 1999, “Bolzano and Cournot on mathematical
explanation”,
*Revue d‘histoire des science*, 52 (3–4): 429–455. - Materna, P., 1995,
*The World of Concepts and Logic*, (Czech), Prague: Filosofia. - Meurers, J., 1974/1975, “Bolzanos Paradoxien des Unendlichen
und die von Seeliger-Charlierschen Sätze über ein
unendliches Universum”,
*Philosophia Naturalis*, 15: 176–190. - Morscher, E., 1973,
*Das logische An-Sich bei Bernard Bolzano*, Salzburg-München: Anton Pustat. - –––, 1997, “Bolzano's Method of Variation:
Three Puzzles”,
*Grazer philosophische Studien*, 53: 151–159. - –––, 1987, “Bolzanos Syllogistik”,
*Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*, 24 (4): 447-451. - –––, 2003 “La définition bolzanienne de
l'analyticité logique, ”
*Philosophiques*, 30: 149–169. - –––, 2007,
*Studien zur Logik Bernard Bolzanos*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Mugnai, M., 1992, “Leibniz and Bolzano on the ‘Realm
of truths’ ”, in
*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987*, Firenze: Olschki. - Niiniuloto I., 1977, “Bolzano and Bayes' tests”,
*Studia Excellentia*, Essays in Honour of Oliva Ketonen, 30–36, Helsinki. - –––, 1982, “Bolzano's contribution to science and
society”, in
*Impact of Bolzano's epoch on the development of science*, 9–23, Prague. - Novy, L., 1995, “Les mathématiciens sous
l'absolutisme autrichien : Bernard Bolzano et Franz Xaver Moth”,
*Bollettino della Storia delle science matematiche*, 15 (1): 49–59. - Preti, G., 1976, “I fondamenti della logica formale pura
nella ”Wissenschaftslehre“ di B. Bolzano e nelle
”Logische Unturschungen“ di E. Husserl”,
*Saggi filosofici*(vol. I, p. 11–31), Firenze: La Nuova Italia. - Prihonsky, 1850,
*Neuer Anti-Kant oder Prüfung der Kritik der reinen Vernunft nach den in Bolzano‘s Wissenschaftslehre niedergelegten Begriffen*, Bautzen. - Proust, J., 1994,
*Questions of form*,*logic and analytic proposition from Kant to Carnap*, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. - –––, 1999, “Bolzano's theory of
representation”,
*Revue d‘histoire des sciences*, 52 (3–4): 363–383., - Rootselaar, B. van, 1964/1965 , “Bolzano's theory of real
numbers”,
*Archive for History of Exact Sciences*, 2: 168–180. - –––, 1992, “Axiomatics in Bolzanos
logico-mathematical research”, in
*Bolzano's Wissenschaftslehre 1837–1987. International Workshop*, pp. 221–230, Florence: Leo S. Olschki. - Rumberg, A., 2009,
*Ableitbarkeit und Abfolge bei Bernard Bolzano vor dem Hintergrund des modelltheoretischen und beweistheoretischen Folgerungsbegriff*, Magisterarbeit Universität Tübingen. - Rusnock, P., 1997, “Bolzano and the traditions of analysis,
”
*Grazer Philosophische Studien*53: 61–85. - –––, 1999, “Philosophy of mathematics:
Bolzano's responses to Kant and Lagrange”,
*Revue d‘histoire des science*, 52 (3–4): 99–427. - –––, 2000,
*Bolzano's philosophy and the emergence of modern mathematics*, Amsterdam-Atlanta: Rodopi. - Rusnock, P., and George, R, 2004, “Bolzano as
logician”, in
*The Rise of modern logic: from Leibniz to Frege*, ed. Gabbay, D., and Woods, J., Amsterdam: Nort Holland, 177–205. - Russ, S., 1992, “Bolzano's analytic program”,
*The Mathematical Intelligencer*, 14 (3): 45–53; in Czech in*Pokroky matematiky, fyziky a astronomie*, 38 (5) (1993): 249–259. - –––, 1982, “Influence of Bolzano's
methodology on the development of his mathematics”, in
*Impact of Bolzano's epoch on the development of science*, Prague, 335–337. - Schnieder, B., 2002,
*Substanz und Adhärenz. Bolzanos Ontologie des Wirklichen*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Scholz, H., 1961, “Die Wissenschaftslehre Bolzanos: Eine
Jahrhundert-Betrachtung (1937)”, in
*Mathesis Universalis*, Basel-Stuttgart: Benno Schwabe. - Sebestik, J., 1964, “Bernard Bolzano et son mémoire
sur le théorème fondamental de l'analyse”,
*Revue d‘histoire des sciences*, 17: 129–164. - –––, 1990, “The mathematical system of
Bernard Bolzano”, (Spanish),
*Mathesis*6 (4): 393–417. - –––, 1992, J.,
*Logique et mathématique chez Bernard Bolzano*, Paris: Vrin,. - –––, 1995, “Twardowski entre Bolzano et
Husserl: theorie de la representation”,
*Cahiers de la philosophie ancienne et du langage*, 1: 61–85; in German in*Grazer philosophische Studien*, 35: 175–188. - –––, 1997, “Bolzano, Exner and the origins
of analytical philosophy”,
*Grazer philosophische Studien*, 53: 33–59. - –––, 1999, “Forme, variation et
déductibilité dans la logique de Bolzano”,
*Revue d'Histoire des sciences*, 52 (3–4): 479–506. - –––, 2000 “Frege's silence about Bolzano. A philosophical fiction” (Slovak), Logica et methodologica, Bolzano + 150 Frege * 150, Pramene analytickej filozofie, Univerzita Komenského (Bratislava), 43–48.
- –––, 2003, “Husserl reader of
Bolzano”, in Fisette D. (ed.),
*Husserl's Logical Investigations Reconsidered*, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 71–92. - Segura, L. F., 2001,
*La prehistoria del logicismo*, Mexico: Plaza y Valdes. - Siebel, M., 1996,
*Der Begriff der Ableitbarkeit bei Bolzano*, Sankt Augustin: Akademia. - Simons, P., 1987, “Bolzano, Tarski, and the limits of
logic”,
*Bolzano-Studien. Philosophia Naturalis*, 24 (4): 378–405. - –––, 1997, “Bolzano on collections”,
*Grazer philosophische Studien*, 53: 87–108. - Sinaceur, H., 1996, “Bolzano et les
mathématiques”, in
*Les philosophes et les mathématiques*, Paris: Ellipses, 150–173. - –––, 1999, “Réalisme
mathématique, réalisme logique chez Bolzano”,
*Revue d‘histoire des sciences*, 52 (3–4): 457–477. - Spalt, D. D., 1991, “Bolzanos Lehre von den messbaren
Zahlen”,
*Archive for History of Exact Sciences*, 42 (1): 15–70. , - –––, 1991, “Die mathematischen und
philosophischen Grundlagen des Weierstrass-schen Zahlbegriffs zwischen
Bolzano und Cantor”,
*Archive for History of Exact Sciences*, 41 (4): 311–362. - Stelzner, W., 2002, “Compatibility and relevance: Bolzano
and Orlov”, in
*The Third German-Polish Workshop on Logic & Logical Philosophy*, Dresden, 2001,*Logic and Logical Philosophy*, 10: 137–171. - Sundholm, G., 2000, “When and why, did Frege read
Bolzano?”,
*LOGICA.Yearbook*1991, Prague: Filosofia. - Tarski, A., 1936, “Über den Begriff der logischen
Folgerung”, in
*Actes du Congrès International de Philosophie Scientifique*, fasc. 7 (Actualités Scientifiques et Industrielles, vol. 394), Paris: Hermann et Cie, p. 1–11; Engl. transl. by J.H. Woodger in Tarski 1983,*Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics*, second edition, ed. by J. Corcoran, Indianapolis: Hackett . - Tatzel, A., 2002, “Bolzano's theory of ground and
consequence, ”
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 43: 1–25. - Textor, M., 1996,
*Bolzanos Propositionalismus*, Berlin-New York: De Gruyter. - Thompson, P., 1981, “Bolzano's deducibility and Tarski's
logical consequence”,
*History and. Philosophy of Logic*, 2: 11–20. - Trlifajová, K., “Parting the ways. Bolzano's measurable numbers revisited”, forthcoming.
- Twardowski, K., 1894,
*Zur Lehre von Inhalt und Gegenstand von Vorstellungen*, Wien; Engl. transl. and introd. by Grossmann, R, 1997,*On the content and object of presentations*, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff. - Vlasáková, M., 2005,
*Bernard Bolzano: the road towards logical semantic*(Czech), Prague: Filosofia. - Voltaggio, F., 1974,
*Bernard Bolzano e la dottrina della scienza*, Milano: Edizioni di Comunità. - Wussing, W., 1981, “Bernard Bolzano und die Grundlegung der
Analysis”,
*Mitteilungen der Matematischen. Gesellschaft der DDR*, 2–4: 128–152. - Zimmermann, R., 1853,
*Philosophische Propädeutik für Obergymnasien*, 1st. ed., Wien.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- O'Connor, J. J., and Robertson, E. F, “Bernard Bolzano”, MacTutor History of Mathematics archive.
- Bernard Bolzano and the Theory of Science