Tiantai Buddhism

First published Wed Nov 19, 2014

Tiantai is the name of a mountain and surrounding geographical location in China, literally meaning “platform of the sky”, but the term is traditionally used to denote a particular school of Mahāyāna Buddhism with historical connections to that locale. In this article, the term “Tiantai” will be used to refer to the philosophical ideas developed from the sixth to eleventh centuries by this school, as expounded in the writings of its three most representative figures: Tiantai Zhiyi (538–597), Jingxi Zhanran (711–782) and Siming Zhili (960–1028).

To translate Tiantai's rather technical scholastic terminology and its typically Buddhist soteriological orientation into something approaching traditional philosophical categories, we can start by identifying a few hashtag themes that are characteristic of Tiantai thinking. Tiantai is: a radical contextualism, a radical holism, a radical monism, and a theory of radical immanence. It asserts a radical impermanence, radical anti-substantialism, and radical ambiguity of identity for all finite and conditional entities. Epistemologically this entails radical skepticism about all unconditional claims, and radical anti-realism. Ethically it implies a radical renunciation of all finite aims, as well as radical repudiation of all determinate moral rules, moral consequences, and moral virtues.

But our understanding of each of these points must be thoroughly modified by the most characteristic premise of Tiantai thought of all, which determines the meaning we intend for the term “radical” here: the idea of “self-recontextualization”, whereby the full expression of any quiddity intrinsically entails its self-overcoming. This turn of thought may be termed dialectical, but in a way that differs from both Hegelian and Marxian notions of dialectics in that it is neither teleologically progressive nor hierarchical. It has roots in 1) indigenous Chinese interest in the “reversals” observed in the cycles of nature, conceptualized according to the naïve ancient generalization that when anything is pushed its own extreme it will “reverse”, that an increase in a thing's extension or intensity leads to its self-undermining (e,g., it keeps getting colder until it gets coldest, and then it starts getting warmer), and in 2) the sophisticated ruminations on the nature of conditionality developed in the Emptiness and Two Truths doctrines as expressed in Indian Buddhist logic. What this means is that “radical contextualism” will in Tiantai reverse into a radical assertion of the self-validation of every entity, that “radical holism” will in Tiantai self-reverse also into radical individualism, “radical monism” also into radical pluralism, “radical immanentism” also into radical transcendentalism, along with a claim that these two extremes are, when fully thought through, actually synonyms for one another. It will mean that for all finite conditional entities, radical impermanence is seen to be also radical eternalism, radical anti-substantialism is seen to be also radical substantialism, radical anti-realism is seen to be also radical realism, again supplemented by a claim about the interchangeability of these two seemingly opposed claims. Similarly, radical skepticism about all claims is seen to be also a radical “trivialism” (the claim that all possible claims are true), radical anti-realism also a fanatically absolute realism even for the most fleeting appearances, radical renunciation of finite aims, moral rules, moral consequences and moral virtues is seen to be also a radical acceptance of all finite aims and the endorsement of all determinate moral rules, consequences and virtues.

When the dust from these turnarounds settles, Tiantai ends up with a unique view of the structure of reality: every event, function or characteristic occurring in any experience anywhere is the action of all sentient and insentient beings working together. Every instant of experience is the whole of reality manifesting in this particular form, as this particular entity or experience. Each such instant is however no mere accidental, dispensable form; rather, it is itself unconditional and ineradicable, is eternal and omnipresent. Moreover, this “whole of reality” is irreducibly multiple and irreducibly unified at once, in the following way: all possible conflicting, contrasted and axiologically varied aspects are irrevocably present—in the sense of “findable”—in and as each of these individual determinate totality-effects. Good and evil, delusion and enlightenment, Buddhahood and deviltry, are all “inherently entailed” in each and every event. These multiple entities are not “simply located” even virtually or conceptually: the “whole” which is the agent performing every experience is not a collection of these various “inherently entailed” entities or qualities arrayed side by side, like coins in a pocket. Rather, they are “intersubsumptive”. That is, any one of them subsumes all the others, and yet, because of the view of what “subsumption” actually is, each is subsumed by each of the others as well: all relation is subsumption, and all subsumption is intersubsumption. Each part is the whole, each quality subsumes all other qualities, and yet none are ever eradicable. A Buddha in the world makes the world all Buddha, saturated in every locus with the quality “Buddhahood”; a devil in the world makes the world all devil, permeated with “deviltry”. Both Buddha and devil are always in the world. So every event in the world is always both entirely Buddhahood and entirely deviltry. Every moment of experience is always completely delusion, evil and pain, through and through, and also completely enlightenment, goodness and joy, through and through.

Traditional Buddhism gives a rather commonsensical account of sentient experience: every moment of sentient experience is a sensory apparatus encountering an object, giving rise thereby to a particular moment of contentful awareness. But in the Tiantai view, each of these three—sense organ, object, this moment of consciousness—is itself the Absolute, the entirety of reality, expressed without remainder in the peculiar temporary form of sense organ, of object, of this consciousness. Hence each moment of every being's experience is redescribed, to paraphrase a canonical early Tiantai work, as follows:

The absolute totality encounters the absolute totality, and the result is the arising of the absolute totality. (法界對法界起法界)

The Absolute, the whole of reality, is one and eternal, always the same and omnipresent, but it is also the kind of whole that divides from itself, encounters itself, arises anew each moment, engenders itself as the transient flux of each unique and individual moment of experience of every sentient being.

How this view is established, and what its consequences are, is what is to be explained in this article.

1. The Three Truths: Emptiness, Provisional Positing and the Center (空假中 kong, jia, zhong)

The meta-level claim about self-recontextualization as self-reversal, which applies at all levels to all Tiantai doctrines, is itself the consequence of some considerations concerning contextualism, holism and conditionality, with which it is thus convenient to begin our exposition. The heart of the matter, the most fundamental and far-reaching renovation of Buddhism accomplished by the Tiantai School, is the move from the Two Truths model to a Three Truths one. The Two Truths is an epistemological and pedagogical heuristic in most Mahāyāna Buddhism, but in Tiantai the Three Truths are taken to be a necessary logical entailment of any proposed determinacy, and thus to apply equally to any possible ontological, epistemological and ethical entities. They can be summarized by the claim that no entity can be either the same as or different from any other entity. This relation of neither-sameness-nor-difference is the “asness” relation: each determinate thing is the totality of all other possible things as this thing. The non-sameness implies that the specific characteristics of all other things are in some sense discoverable in each thing, that all their manifold properties and functions will also be simultaneously operative there.

1.1 Outline of the Three Truths Argument: Getting to “Neither-Same-Nor-Different”

We can reconstruct the argument for this claim as follows:

  1. For anything to be what it is, it must be mutually exclusive with whatever it is not. If it has aspects or qualities in common with anything else, it is nonetheless stipulated to be specifically itself not insofar as it has these in common, and thus is indistinguishable from the other things that share them, but insofar as it is different from them.
  2. To be is to be determinate. To be determinate is to be finite, non-all. To be finite is to be conditional. Anything strictly unconditional would ipso facto be omnipresent (no particular place rather than another can be the “condition” for its existence) and always occurring (no particular time rather than another can be the “condition” for its existence), and thus indistinguishable from anything else. This would be equivalent to not being determinate at all, for it would be impossible for an unconditional entity to be mutually exclusive with anything, since that exclusion would then have to be a “condition” of its existence.
  3. Any entity must thus be copresent with some otherness; it must exist in a world that includes something that is not it, i.e., (by item #1), something that is mutually exclusive with it (even if just the empty space around it). Some form of copresence-with-otherness is an essential characteristic of the existence of all entities. All forms of relation, including relations of causality and of conceptual contrast, are instances of this necessary copresence-in-the-world.
  4. The conditions from which it must be different but related include not only immediately contiguous causally efficient factors, but also prior states of affairs. More searchingly, the constitutive copresent otherness cannot be to non-X in general, for this would merely be a repetition of the determination of X itself, in reverse; to the extent that there is no more in non-X than the negation of X, no new content is provided by the contrast, which therefore presupposes X. Rather, the exclusions that make up the determination of X must be specific other determinations, other exclusions; they must in principle include anything at all that the entity in question is different from: to be determinate as X is a specific exclusion of all specific non-X things and states. We have greater knowledge of what the essence of a dog is by learning more about each and every particular thing that the dog is not, how it differs specifically from a cat, from a hedgehog, from a table, from a towel…. (Our knowledge is thus always constitutively partial and in-process; knowing X is always being poised to know more about X. Knowledge per se is non-omniscience.)
  5. However, all copresence-in-the-world, all conditioning, all relation, all causality between two entities requires some overlap or interface between them. There must be some place, thing, time, medium or concept that simultaneously includes them both, or which they both include. Any two entities must have something in common to succeed in being copresent—to have a causal relation or to even be contrasted.
  6. But no genuinely distinct entities, insofar as they are distinct and thus determinate, have anything in common.
  7. Hence two genuinely mutually exclusive entities can have no relation of conditioning one another.
  8. Hence there are no genuinely mutually exclusive entities. Thus the nature of determination stipulated in item #1 must be supplemented. This rewrite of the nature of determination is the Three Truths.
  9. Whatever appears to be, i.e., to be just what it is and nothing else, cannot really be mutually exclusive with whatever it is not. X is “non-different” from non-X. This non-difference is called the Emptiness (空 kong, Śūnyatā) of X. For if X is non-different from non-X, it fails to fulfill the condition of being X stipulated in item #1, and thus X is not X; X is “empty”.
  10. But X is also “non-same” with non-X. Empirically, if it were the same, there would be no X to be called non-different: its presence is nothing other than its non-identity with all other states. Logically, the alternative to the Tiantai view is the default bivalent assumption that either some entities exist or that no entities exist; but both existing and non-existing require non-sameness—i.e., the non-sameness between existing and non-existing. Anything determinate is non-same with what is not itself, by item #1. This is why there is something rather than nothing: even total nothingness would still be determinate and non-same to what it is not, i.e., non-same to somethingness. Nothing would therefore still be something, so the question why there is something rather than nothing is actually moot. Non-sameness to what it is not is analytically necessary to any proposed entity. Even if no entity is posited, “no-entity-being-posited” will not obtain unless the positing of entities is thereby excluded, and non-sameness is necessary to succeed in excluding the positing of any entity. This is non-sameness to non-X is called the Provisional Positing or Conventional Truth (假 jia) of X.
  11. The non-sameness of X and non-X and the non-difference between X and non-X are themselves non-same as one another and non-different from one another. Non-same in spite of being non-different is Provisional Positing. Non-different in spite of being non-same is Emptiness. These are just reversed ways of saying the same thing, but the reversal is itself not negligible. They are two opposite and mutually exclusive senses given to a single identical referent. They are synonymous and yet contrasted. This is called the Center (中 zhong).
  12. X has to be an aspect or part of more than whatever it seems to be, and even as a part or aspect it cannot really be just the single selfsame (i.e., simply and bivalently same or different) part or aspect it appears to be.
  13. But it also does and must seem to be just this and nothing besides, and can appear only if initially appearing to be mutually exclusive with what it is not: to appear is to appear as something, which is to appear as finite. The whole of which any appearance is a part or aspect can never appear simpliciter, even in thought. It is always appearing as one specific thing (or concept, or thought) or another.
  14. To be present as X is to not be X, but such that this not-X is showing itself only as X. To be X is to exclude non-X but only in such a way as to necessarily involve non-X, which can only be done by showing itself exclusively as X.
  15. Thus the Three Truths are:
    1. Provisional Positing: Some X is always appearing.
    2. Emptiness: X is not (only) X.
    3. The Center (or Middle, or Mean): The simultaneity, inseparability, sameness-as-difference of X appearing and X not being only X (this is the Center in its simplest formulation, as “the exclusive Center” (但中 danzhong) which is itself neither Emptiness nor Provisional Positing, is beyond both and more ultimately real than both, but which can appear as either).
  16. A further implication of the Center, called the “Non-exclusive Center” (不但中 budan zhong): Any two putatively distinct things, Y and X, are also not-same-and-not different from one another. For the Center can never appear simpliciter; it always appears as some specific coherence showing itself, to which it is non-different. Provisional Positing is intrinsic to every instance of both Emptiness and the Center, and Provisional Positing is always some specific provisional posit (even the abstract concept “provisional positing”, or the abstract concept “emptiness” or “the center” is still a specific provisional posit.) Each provisional posit involves every other provisional posit, specifically. Y is an instantiation of X. X is an instantiation of Y. All other appearances are thus “intersubsumptive” with X. The Center is thus ultimately not beyond or more real than Emptiness or Provisional Positing, but is itself synonymous-as-contrasted with them, such that just to be Empty or to Provisionally Posited, or to be any provisional posit, is to be the Center, the subsumer and subsumed of all other provisional posits—and vice versa.

1.2. The Self-Overcoming of Holism into Omnireductionism

From this we can perhaps see in what way Tiantai is able to stipulate at once the self-preserving and the self-overcoming of both holism and apophasis. First, atomism of any kind is rejected as unintelligible, and a thorough contextualism asserted: things can only be determinate in relation to a context, and there can be no non-arbitrary limiting of the extent and multiplicity of contexts, since each context will itself be intelligible only with respect to a larger context. This would seem to lead to a holism of some sort: each apparently isolable thing is really an aspect or expression of some more inclusive whole, and each of these finite wholes must be an aspect or expression of a still more inclusive whole. The part is dependent on the whole, the conditional is dependent on the unconditional. But the unconditional can have no specific separate identity, not even as “the unconditional per se”. Any determination for the whole turns out to self-overturn into other determinations, precisely due to its success in being a determination for the exceptionless whole. For example, Thales says the world is made of water. This is stipulated after first isolating other lesser wholes: water, earth, fire, air. Each of these was already a finite whole, involving an alleged collapse from appearance to a deeper reality: what appeared to be trees and stones and pillars turned out to be part of the larger whole “earth”, ways in which earth appears or manifests; what appeared to be body-heat and flames and sunshine turned out to be part of the larger whole “fire”, ways in which fire appears or manifests. Now Thales says both of these are really parts of a larger whole “water”, ways in which it appears and manifests. But each of these generalizing claims involves a meaning-change for the term in question. “Water” initially meant “what is not fire, earth, wind, which excludes them, what is contrasted to them”. After Thales, “water” means also “what expresses itself sometimes as watery, sometimes as fiery, sometimes as earthy, sometimes as windy”. Along comes Heraclitus and claims that all is really “fire”. “Fire” now means also “what expresses itself sometimes as watery, sometimes as fiery, sometimes as earthy, sometimes as windy”. What is intended in claims of this type, allowing them to appear to be doing explanatory work, is the maintenance of a distinction between which of these expressions is primary and which secondary, which direct and indirect; but Tiantai would deny that this distinction can be meaningfully maintained once this totalization has been effected. Because each now means the whole, they lose their original meaning, for that meaning was entirely dependent on a contrast to what was excluded. If fire is everything, then fire is not fire. If water is everything, then water is not water. If fire is everything, then water is really fire. If water is everything, then fire is really water. If fire is really water, then water is really fire. Hence by going through the universalization of any determinate entity, we reach the overturning of that determination into something that expresses itself as all other determinations, and at the same time undermines its own privileged status as ultimate foundation, making all other possible determinations equally unconditional, all-pervasive, universal, absolute. To see the absoluteness of any one entity is thus to de-absolutize that entity and also to absolutize every other entity.

1.3 From Two Truths to Three Truths: The Self-Overcoming of Apophasis into Trivialism

The Three Truths position of Tiantai derives from a particular understanding of the Two Truths doctrine advanced by Indian Buddhist philosophers of the Mādhyamaka school, interpreted as holding that any specific thing we could say about the world was at best a “Conventional Truth”, which served as a kind of “raft” to get beyond it to the “Ultimate Truth” of Emptiness—determinations of any kind were thus at best an indispensible means to get beyond themselves, to be discarded when their work is done. The stipulation of Emptiness (Śūnyatā) was itself a raft to get beyond not only all other determinate views but also Emptiness itself as a “view” or theory or concept. Ultimate Truth, true realization of Emptiness, was thus at best a celebratory term used to point to an ineffable experience of the liberation from all views, all definite conceptions of determinate “things”. The motivation for this was soteriological in a specific, pan-Buddhist sense: the goal of all human endeavor, including philosophy, including ethics, including epistemology, is assumed to be the reduction or elimination of suffering. Buddhism claims that this is what we're always trying to do, but usually in a self-defeating, ignorant way; it claims to provide a more effective way. Note that this does not make any claim about what is valuable, but rather addresses what is assumed to be a necessary entailment of what it means to consider anything valuable, i.e., what structures desire qua desire. To desire is to value, and suffering is simply the non-satisfaction of our desire. Hence all endeavors are endeavors to eliminate some suffering, i.e., to satisfy a desire. The characteristic Buddhist contribution is then to note that desiring any conditional object or state is necessarily self-defeating. This is because to be conditional is to be brought into being by a qualitatively distinct, heterogeneous and extrinsic cause. But examined closely, this cannot be a single extrinsic cause, for if any effect were produced by a single cause, that cause and that effect would always be copresent—wherever and whenever that cause occurred, the effect would also occur. But that would mean that the cause would therefore no longer be extrinsic to the effect; they would be, rather, necessary and intrinsically conjoined, actually two aspects of a single irreducible entity, which would mean that no causal event actually ever occurs. This means that all conditional things require multiple causes, each of which itself requires multiple causes.

This introduces an intrinsic instability and inner conflict into whatever exists conditionally, that is, whatever is finite, whatever is determinate. The unconditional would have to be omnipresent and omnitemporal and indeterminate. But the nature of desire is to have specific conditions of satisfaction: to desire is to require some one state of affairs rather than, to the exclusion of, some other state of affairs—minimally, pleasure instead of pain. This means all desire qua desire is desire for something conditional; otherwise there would be no need for the desire, since the desired state would already always and everywhere be present. Desire desires a single effect to the exclusion of any other effect; but the denial of effectivity for any single cause also implies that what is produced by any causal process can never be only a single effect. For since what is produced is not dependent solely on any single cause, or indeed any finite set of causes considered as a unit, the production of a new event always requires the conjunction with some hitherto excluded condition. Since by hypothesis this new condition is not a consistent part of the original set, it will not always be the same, and thus the effect will not be one and the same; every conjunction will produce its own effects, and by hypothesis there is no limit to the set of conjunctions (for that would make them simply a single cause). Less rigorously, it is held that the cross-purposes and conflicting tendencies thus built into any effect make it impossible for it to be a stably homogenous entity consistently isolable from the opposite conditional states it means to exclude, such as is required by the exclusive structure of specific desires. Whatever is desired must be identifiably present at a particular time and place, and whatever is such is conditional, and whatever is conditional entails impermanence, and thus suffering.

The pan-Buddhist denial of the existence of a “self” rests on the same point: the impossibility of single-cause causal events. For the “self” rejected here is precisely the claimant to single-causality: the agent of actions which putatively requires no second condition to produce an effect, e.g., to will something, to do something, to want something, to experience something. The self never acts alone, has no independent effects, and thus actually is not a self-as-efficacious-agent. “Self” here essentially means “controller”. Because there is no single causality, there is no single controller, and thus no self. For this reason too, satisfaction of desire is not sustainable. For in doing what the self desires, other causes besides the activity of the self are always also involved; the effect is not in the self's control, and thus will inevitably contravene its desires, its own causal contributions to the effect. Indeed, the early Buddhist analysis of the human condition amounts to the claim that all desire is really a proxy-version of this impossible desire for control, for single-agent causality, for pure autonomy, for selfhood; thus all desire is doomed.

The same considerations have serious epistemological consequences as well. The Buddhists viewed theoretical stances and philosophical positions as themselves objects of desire, of clinging. Since all such stances are themselves specific, determinate, they are ipso facto conditional. As conditional, they are ipso facto suffering. Hence attachment to views was seen as a form of suffering and an obstacle to liberation. All determinate metaphysical views about how or what things are were to be transcended and left behind.

In most of the dominant Indian theories, those ideas are granted temporary validity as conventional truths: they are to serve as “rafts”, to be clung to temporarily, but only because they are an effective means of passing beyond themselves. This includes both specific Buddhist doctrines and also ordinary conventional speech (necessary for even communicating Buddhist ideas). Whatever ideas do not lead to their own abandonment in this way (and hence do not lead to the end of suffering) do not count even as conventional truths—for example, 1) metaphysical and religious theories about the Absolute, or unconditional claims about the world as a whole and 2) non-conventional views of things in the world, claims that contravene ordinary language of the community. There tends to be a kind of hierarchy in the Indian Two Truths theory: first, plain falsehood, including all philosophical theories about reality and unconventional views. Then conventional truth, which includes ordinary daily life ideas about self and other, cause and effect and so on, and also Buddhist ideas about suffering, the Four Noble Truths, non-self, and even “Emptiness” considered as a concept. These ideas lead beyond themselves, instrumentally, to the experience of Emptiness, which is liberation from all views. The conventional truths had an instrumental value, but none were really “true” about things—Emptiness meant that all of them were, in the most ultimate sense, false. Also, there are really only one or two kinds of conventional truth: first, common sense daily speech, the correct general names for things as used in the daily life of your particular community, and second, Buddhist ideas. The reason these count as “truths” is because they are useful in leading us to liberation from suffering—and in leading us to liberation from these ideas themselves. “True” propositions are propositions that have the power to lead beyond themselves.

This led to a somewhat paradoxical situation, on several levels. There was always a problem in Emptiness theory: Emptiness was supposed to be not a “view” at all, to predicate nothing about reality. But if it does anything at all, if it negates or excludes any other view, it is, in the Tiantai view, still a kind of view. For to be something in particular is just to exclude something else in particular. That is all a “thing” is, that is all a “view” is. To be something just is to exclude something else; nothing more is required to count as a being. Pre-Tiantai Emptiness theory gets into an infinite regress, chasing its tail around the problem of the transcendence of Emptiness: no statement can represent it, even “all things are Empty”. It is purely and totally above and beyond anything that can be thought or said, all ordinary experience of identities in the world. It is a negation that is supposed to bear no relation at all to what it negates, to entirely escape the system of relations, of conditionality. Emptiness is supposed to be strictly “inconceivable”. In Tiantai, this problem disappears. Emptiness is still very important, but it is simply a conditional assertion of unconditionality. We do not have all the conditionality (specifiability, particularity) on one side and all the unconditionality (transcendence, inconceivability) on the other. Everything, every experience, every identity, every action, is in the same boat: they are all both conditional and unconditional, both conceivable and inconceivable. The thought, experience, concept “Emptiness” is also both conditional and unconditional, both conceivable and inconceivable, like “water” and “fire” in our example about. Emptiness is an especially efficient marker of self-exploded holism, the term that applies most easily everywhere and thus ultimately nowhere, allowing all other terms to do the same. It is Provisionally Posited, which means it is at least locally coherent (conditional, determinate, conceivable), but it itself is also Empty, which means it is globally incoherent (unconditional, indeterminate, inconceivable). It appears in experience as something in particular (locally coherent as precisely this word and this thought “Emptiness”), but this, like every other local coherence, is haunted by its own inseparable nimbus of infinite outsides, infinite contexts, each of which differently contextualizes it and thus bestows on it alternate identities: there is more to it than any single concept, including the concept “Emptiness”, can hold. Emptiness is, to use a word coined for just this Tiantai usage, “moretitivity”: and moretotivity is itself moretoitive. It appears not just as moretoitivity, but as specific identities, something more, above and beyond, simple moretoitivity as such. Ambiguity is itself ambiguous: fire is not just fire, it is ambiguous; but the ambiguity is not just ambiguity, it is also fire. This applies to everything else as well. Local coherence and global coherence (Provisional Positing and Emptiness) are just two ways of saying the same thing.

In the Tiantai “Three Truths” theory, instead of concluding that every particular view and thing is false, we conclude that all is, ultimately, true. Every possible view is equally a truth. There is no longer a hierarchy between the levels, and no category of plain falsehood. “Conventional Truth” in Tiantai is not something to be left behind when we reach enlightenment, but rather what is obtained and mastered and intensified there. Moreover, nothing is left out of it—all possible statements, viewpoints, ideas, concepts, positions are conventional truths. The criterion is still the same: all things can be used as “skillful means” to lead to Buddhahood. So now we have Three Truths, which are not a raft-like instrument to get beyond all statements and concepts, and a final higher truth that allows us to have no biased and particular view of things, but rather as three true ways of viewing any particular thing. It is not a raft to get beyond all rafts, but a raft that leads to the raft factory that makes and houses all rafts, and allows one to move at will from any raft to any other raft, including the initial one. However you may be viewing a particular part of the world or the world as a whole, it is “conventionally” true. There are not just a few conventional truths, but an infinite number of them, even when they are directly opposed and contradictory. So in Two Truths theory, we would say that “this is a cup” is conventionally true, and “this cup is empty” is a higher conventional truth, which finally leads us to a direct inconceivable experience of the emptiness of this cup, freedom from clinging to any view at all of this cup, which is the liberation from all suffering. If someone were to point to this “cup” and say, “This is an elephant”, however, that would not even be a conventional truth, because that is not how most people think of it, it is neither the ordinary speech of the language community, nor a Buddhist term designed to lead beyond itself. That would be a plain error. And if someone said, “This is an expression of the will of God”, that would also be an error, not even a conventional truth, since it tried to make a claim beyond that of conventional usage to an ultimate, universally applicable, absolute truth. But in Tiantai Three Truths theory, it is just as true to say, “This is an elephant” or “This is the Will of Baal” as to say “This is a cup”. And neither of these is less true than saying, “This is empty”, or indeed any less true than “experiencing” the emptiness of this cup/elephant. In both cases, what we have is a locally coherent way of viewing this thing—it just means that it looks that way from some perspective, within some set of parameters, for some length of time. It doesn't matter anymore whether those parameters are shared by the common sense of a particular community or speech group; all that matters is that it is possible to make it look that way, that it looks that way from anywhere, for even one moment. In Two Truths and Emptiness theory, nothing is really true. In Tiantai Three Truths theory, everything is true. We don't need an extra “Emptiness” outside of this locally coherent way of seeing things; Emptiness just means that whatever is locally coherent is also, ipso facto, globally incoherent. That is, when all factors are taken into consideration, the original way any thing appears is no longer unambiguously present, but it restored as a raft leading to all other rafts, including itself, as ineradicable aspects of all reality, of any reality.

2. Contextualism and Ontological Ambiguity

A simple thought experiment may draw out the implications of this idea. Imagine that you come upon what looks like a white marble lying on the ground. You experience it as round, as small, as white, and immediately you construct a lived attitude toward it—something that can be picked up, rolled, played with, pocketed. But then you go to pick it up, and find that it is stuck to the ground. You cannot lift it. You try to dig it out, and find that it extends downward, further than you can dig: it is the tip of a larger item. It appears to be a long rod or cylindrical pipe of some kind. But as you dig further, you find that after about five inches of narrow thinness it starts to expand outward; it is a spire on top of a cone. This cone expands outward as you keep digging down. When you get about twenty feet down, the cone ends, embedded in a soft, scaly material. Then the earth rumbles and an enormous two-horned monster emerges from underground; it is 500 feet tall, and each of its horns is twenty feet high, with a long sharp tip. You had been digging out one of the horns. What you had seen as a marble on the ground was in fact the very tip of one of the horns. Now look again at that tip. You had experienced it as round. But it turns out it was not round at all: it is sharp. Yet it has not changed at all: you are still seeing what you saw. It is not white either: the tip had looked white against the ground, but now, looking at the monster's horn as whole, you see it as a pattern of mostly green spots interspersed here and there with white: looked at as a whole, the horn, including its tip, looks green. Nor is it movable, pocketable, playwithable—it is rather dangerous, razor sharp, to be avoided. And yet nothing of what you saw was taken away: it was just supplemented with further information, with its larger context.

Tiantai views all things this way. Normally you might make some qualifications in order to preserve your view that some facts are unambiguous (indeed, to some extent this process is precisely what philosophy traditionally is); you might say “the tip, considered in isolation, is indeed round”. The usual procedure is to interpose the distinction between “how it appears” and “how it really is”, some form of reality-appearance distinction. But the most important consequence of the transformation of the Two Truths into the Three Truths is the wholesale dismissal of the appearance-reality distinction. Tiantai would reject the privileging of either considering in isolation or considering in any single particular connection; any of these would be legitimate in some heuristic (upayic) contexts, but none could be non-arbitrarily assigned the role of representing what is the “really the case”, simpliciter. To see something is to see “not-all” of it. We are always seeing a little fragment of the world, but every bit of the world is changed by the fact that it is a part of the world, is recontextualized by the rest of the world, by the rest of space and the rest of time. In fact, if we ever saw all, we would see nothing. For to see, to take something as “there”, as “real”, is to place it within a context, to contrast it to something outside of itself, something which is not it. To see all is to see nothing. As in the case of “fire” and “water” above, if someone were to say that the entire universe is “round”, this would require changing the meaning of “round”. This round would not be round: for round requires a non-round outside it to be round. It would have to be bordered by something to shape it into roundness, but the universe would also include that outside-the-roundness part. If someone were to say the entire universe were sharp, this would also make no sense. This sharp would not be sharp; for sharp requires a non-sharp outside it to be sharp. To say the whole universe is sharp, then, means no more and no less than saying the whole universe is round. We can make no specific determinations about the whole, about the entire universe, for that outside of which nothing exists; for all particular specifications require a contrast to something outside of them. Everything we can say or think comes from the realm of the finite, and cannot be applied to the infinite. But the Tiantai point is that we cannot speak of anything finite without also involving some determination of the Whole, of the infinite. If we were to say this thing is sharp, we would have to be assuming that “the whole universe is such that this thing is sharp”. We cannot say that: the whole universe cannot be “such that this marble is sharp” any more than the whole universe can be “sharp”. But this also means we cannot say the whole universe is “such that this marble is not-sharp”. Either is equally legitimate, either is equally illegitimate. What we can say, then, is that this marble appears to be round, but round is such that it is always turning out also to be more than round, to be non-round, and vice versa. Roundness is moretoitive. Round and non-round intersubsume each other.

In short, roundness is present as every non-roundness, and as moretoitivity; moretoitivity is present as roundness, and as every non-roundness.

To clarify this, consider the following:

What is the following figure?


What is that “same” figure in the diagram below?

−2 −1 Ο 1 2

What is it now?


How about now:


When we looked at that round figure in isolation, it may have presented itself immediately and unreflectively in accordance with our habits or proximate mental acts; if we had been thinking about numbers a moment ago, it might appear simply and unambiguously as “zero”, if about letters as the letter “o”, if about shapes as a “circle”. When a single explicit context was added in the second diagram, it had a clear and definite identity: it was the number zero. But when we added another context at the same time, in the third diagram, the figure became ambiguous: it could now be read as either a zero or the letter O. As we keep adding more contexts, its identity becomes more and more ambiguous; in the final diagram above, we can point to the initial circular figure and say, validly, “This is a triangle”—for it is the vertex of a triangle formed with the two other, non-contiguous and non-proximate, circles. Who knows what other circles there are out in the world, and what other figures this thing right here is actually forming? When we consider all things in the universe at the same time, the initial identities we assigned to them are supplemented by more and more ambiguity. Looking at just the single series of letters, is was a zero: this is local coherence. When we see this cup simply as a cup, we are doing the same thing: ignoring a lot of other factors, contexts, points of view, ways of viewing, and narrowing down the relevant factors to allow it to appear as a single unambiguous something: a cup. If we consider the molecules of which it is made, or the energy it expresses, or the uses to which it might be put in the context of various narratives, or its deep past and deep future, its “cupness” becomes ambiguous: it is simultaneously lots of other things, part of many different stories. It is a blip on the screen of energy transformations, or a murder weapon, or an art object, or a doorstop. The same is true of yourself, and your actions right now. They are unambiguous only to the extent that we narrow our vision around them (one way we can narrow our vision, of course, is to do philosophy; one of the narratives in which we are contextualizing our experience might be a conceptual system presupposing the sorting out of essences, attributes, accidents, substantial forms or what have you, and distinguishing appearances from reality accordingly, so that it appears to be “essentially” a cup and only “accidentally” a murder weapon and only “appearing to be” a revelation from Baal). This is the meaning of Emptiness in Tiantai: ontological ambiguity. The term “ambiguity” usually refers only to how we see things. We assume that, in themselves, everything simply is what it is; but we may have an unclear view of it; we can't yet tell if it's this or that. We assume that, at least in principle, it must be one or the other. The idea of Emptiness is the idea that this is true “ontologically”: that is, it pertains to the very being of things. To say they are empty does not mean they are a blank—for that would be a definite something, a specific exclusion of all determinate content, which is, ipso facto, itself a determinate content. Emptiness here means rather that they are, in themselves, ambiguous. Again, this is also to say that everything is more than it seems to be, or rather constitutively more than it can seem to be, no matter what angles it is seen from, no matter how thoroughly it is known, no matter how comprehensive a sum of information is gathered about it. It has the character of being a “something” (a cup, a chair, an elephant), with a number of specifiable characteristics, but every “something”, just to be there as something, has the additional characteristic of “moretoitivity”—of always overflowing whatever is determined about it, of being more than what can be seen from any angle.

This “more” however, does not leave the original “known” part unchanged. Rather, it recontextualizes it. We are always seeing the tip of an iceberg. But even the “tip” is no longer what we thought it was before we knew it was a tip of something more. The key here is that there is no total decontextualization, that leaving one context is always simply entering another context; contextual relations do not require physical contiguity, and the empty space surrounding a given thing does not cut it off from further recontextualizations but rather is itself a context, and an illimitable one that opens into infinite alternate contexts.

3. Transformative Self-Recontextualization (開權顯實 kaiquanxianshi)

This strange “neither-same-nor-different” structure of the Three Truths is to be understood in accordance with another key Tiantai concept, “opening the provisional to reveal the real” (開權顯實 kaiquan xianshi). This is a way of further specifying the relation between local coherence and global incoherence, which are not only synonymous, but also irrevocably opposed, and indeed identical only by means of their opposition and mutual exclusivity. Provisional truth is the antecedent, the premise, and indeed in a distinctive sense the cause of ultimate truth, but only because it is the strict exclusion of ultimate truth.

3.1 The Setup-Punchline Structure of Reality

This can be compared to the structure of the relation between the set up and the punch line of a certain kind of joke. Consider the following:

Two strangers were chatting on a bus. One told the other he was on his way to a biology lab downtown to pick up his dog. “The scientists there are doing some research on him”, he said. “He was born with no nose”.
“Really?” said the other. “How does he smell?”

Let's talk about that structure. When we hear the question “How does he smell?” it seems as if it is a serious query, an expression of serious curiosity about canine anatomy and its mutations. It has the quality of seriousness, of factuality, of non-ironic information. There is nothing funny about that statement. But, when the punch line comes, retrospectively, that set up is funny. That set up is funny because it has been recontextualized by the pun on the word “smell”, which is made to have more than one identity when put into a new context.

The interesting thing to note here is that it is precisely by not being funny that the setup was funny. In other words, if it was already funny, if you didn't take it seriously for a second, the contrast between the two different meanings of this thing could never have clashed in the way that is necessary to make the laughter, to make it actually funny. We have a setup which is serious and a punch line which is funny, but when you look back at the setup from the vantage point of having heard the punchline, that setup is also funny. After all, we don't say that just the punch line is funny. We say the whole joke is funny. The setup is funny in the mode of not being funny yet. It is only funny because it wasn't funny. It is the same thing in the Lotus Sutra and it is the same thing in life really. You're Enlightened! That is what Mahāyāna Buddhism says, everyone is Enlightened! Everybody is a Buddha! But the way in which you are a Buddha is the way in which the setup of a joke is funny, i.e., by not being a Buddha. By struggling toward buddhahood, toward something else, but by revisualizing or recontextualizing or expanding awareness, which has been the preferred technique in Buddhism all along, those very things which are the details of daily life, of the struggles to interact, to deal with conditions and suffering and lack of control are not just a means to buddhahood. They are themselves buddhahood as the life of a sentient being.

The “provisional”, conventional truth, local coherence, is the set-up. The “ultimate truth”, Emptiness, global incoherence, ontological ambiguity, is the punch line. What is important here is to preserve both the contrast between the two and their ultimate identity in sharing the quality of humorousness which belongs to every atom of the joke considered as a whole, once the punch line has been revealed. The setup is serious, while the punchline is funny. The funniness of the punchline depends on the seriousness of the setup, and on the contrast and difference between the two. However, once the punchline has occurred, it is also the case that the setup is, retrospectively, funny. This also means that the original contrast between the two is both preserved and annulled: neither funniness nor seriousness means the same thing after the punchline dawns, for their original meanings depended on the mutually exclusive nature of their defining contrast. Is the setup serious or funny? It is both: it is funny as serious, and serious as funny. Is the punchline serious or funny? It is both, but in an interestingly different way. It is obviously funny, but is it also serious? Yes. Why? Because now that the setup has occurred, both “funny” and “serious” have a different meaning. Originally, we thought that “funny” meant “what I laugh at when I hear it” or something like that, and “serious” meant “what gives me non-funny information” or something similar. But now we see that “funny” can also mean: What I take to be serious, what I am not laughing about, what I am earnestly considering, or crying over, or bewailing even.

But this means also that “serious” means “what can turn out to be either funny or serious”. So both “funny” and “serious” now both mean “funny-and-serious, what can appear as both funny and serious”. Each is now a center that subsumes of the other; they are intersubsumptive. As a consequence, the old pragmatic standard of truth is applied more liberally here: all claims, statements and positions are true in the sense that all can, if properly recontextualized, lead to liberation—which is to say, to their own self-overcoming. Conversely, none will lead to liberation if not properly contextualized.

3.2 Time and Facts

The Three Truths, then, are actually three different but mutually implicative ways of looking at any object or state. Each implies the other two, and each is one way to describe the whole of that object, including its other two aspects. To be established is to be negated. To be begun is to be constitutively incomplete; to be determinate is to be ambiguous, to be anything is to be more than that thing. If it were not more—other—than X, it would not even be X. We may think about this in terms of the status of a “fact”. Emerson says in his essay, “History” (1841):

Time dissipates to shining ether the solid angularity of facts. No anchor, no cable, no fences avail to keep a fact a fact.

He meant that every historical fact registers “at a distance”, in other times and places, taking on the role of an ever-ramifying metaphor that applies to more and more individual cases, with more and more diverse and rich implications. With a few small modifications, this brings us close to the Tiantai view: all we need to do is specify that “time” and “fact” are not really two different things, with the former acting to ambiguate the solidity of the latter, but are in reality two sides of the same thing, two aspects of a single process, in fact are ultimately synonyms. Time is just the addition of other facts. New facts are just the presence of additional time. In the Tiantai view these new facts are not imposed on the initial fact from without, but are posited as the context which alone made it a fact in the first place, made it determinate as just this fact. “Time” just means the self-positing of both itself and other facts by any fact. Time makes facts facts, and unmakes facts by making more facts, all of which are intrinsic to the first fact: history is the positing and transcending, the self-establishment and self-recontextualization of any given fact.

Put another way, let us stipulate that a fact—any determination about what is so—is something that is in principle knowable, and that knowability implies a subject-object relation, and therefore a “distance” or separation, some space away from the fact-to-be-known. That means that a fact is only a fact if there is something outside of it, another fact, another time, a place to view it from; it doesn't count as a fact unless it can impact on some other site, unless it relates to some otherness. But that means that its journey out beyond itself to otherness is intrinsic to its very facticity, and it is this journey out beyond itself that Emerson denotes with the word “time”. To be thus and so, a fact must be viewable from elsewhere, and elsewhere, whether in physical or in conceptual space, implies the illimitable positing of still other alternate perspectives from which to be seen, facts to impact, viewpoints to interpret and metaphorically internalize the initial fact. Determinacy implies limit, limit implies space, space implies infinity of other spaces, of other perspectives, of other contexts. For something to be a fact is for it to intrinsically posit distances from itself, and thus to be viewable otherwise.

Most simply, we can say that for Tiantai time itself simply is the continual “opening of the provisional to reveal the real”: an unceasing process of self-recontexualization where the past on the one hand remains unchangeable and on the other is constantly changing with each recontextualization. A moment of time is a recontextualization of the all the past. This also implies that the Tiantai notion of interpervasion of past, present and future, and of the “inherent inclusion” of all entities in each, is very far from resulting in a static picture of the universe devoid of any genuine creativity. For in Tiantai, each moment of time brings with it not only a new set of actual occasions, but a new set of “eternal principles”—categorical obligations, eternal objects, laws, universals. Each moment is effectively the creation of a new God who determines anew the character of the rest of the universe and of all the past and future.

A moment, to be a moment, must be surrounded by other moments, from which it differs. “Now” must be different from “then”. But that means “now” must relate to “then”. The “then” is part of the world of the “now”, against which it defines itself, to which it stands in necessary contrast. This contrast cannot be either internal or external to the “now” and to the “then”. “Now” is really “now-then”, and “then” is really “then-now”. This is easy to understand if we consider the state of the entire totality of being at moment M and at moment M+1. The state of things at M is thought to have the power to cause the arising of the state of things at M+1. But if M is gone when M+1 arrives, it cannot “reach” M+1 to do anything to it; it is already gone, non-existent, and thus can do nothing. If the state of things at M continues to exist when M+1 arrives, however, time has failed to move ahead, or we must admit the coexistence of two alternate total states of being at the same time. If the appearance of M+1 does not necessitate the disappearance of M (which by our hypothesis possesses the power to bring about M+1), M would then continue to generate precisely M+1 repeatedly forever. In either case, time would not be possible, and no real entities could arise. Moments of time are neither same nor different; they are present as one another, the past as present as future, the future as past and present, the present as past and future. The past is not yet over—every moment of the present and future reveals more about the past and its infinite changes, for they are non-different from it, though allowing it to appear as these new moments. The present never begins—however far back you look, you will always be able to find all the characteristics of the present there, unchanged though appearing as some former moment. The present never ends—all future moments are further disclosures about this present moment of experience happening right now.

3.3 Self-Overcoming of the Whole into Any Upayic Part

We can say all things are impermanent, as in early Buddhism—but now we know this is just a situationally attachment-undermining way of saying “impermanent-permanent”. We can say all things are permanent—meaning “permanent-impermanent”. We can say some things are permanent and others are impermanent—meaning “some-all are permanent-impermanent” and “all-some are impermanent-permanent”. But note too that this does not mean “permanent-impermanent” is the real truth, while “permanent” and “impermanent” are both one-sided distortions. That would be what Tiantai critiques as the “exclusive Center”. Rather, just as “permanent” really means “impermanent-permanent”, “impermanent-permanent” really means “permanent”, or really means “impermanent”. For impermanent-permanent appears as permanence and as impermanence, and each of these is the entirety, not a mere part, of the whole. To be permanent is already to also be impermanent—there is no other permanence. To be impermanent is already to also be permanent—there is no other impermanence. All is funny, all is serious, all is funny-serious. Each is a perfectly equal synonym for all three. Each is an equally adequate-inadequate description of the truth.

The same applies in all other cases. We can say all is suffering—meaning “suffering-bliss”. We can say all is bliss—meaning “bliss-suffering”. We can say all is mind—meaning “mind-matter”. We can say all is matter—meaning “matter-mind”. We can say there is a God—meaning “God-Godless”. We can say there is no God—meaning “Godless-God”. We can say all is illusion—meaning “illusion-reality”. We can say all is reality—meaning “reality-illusion”. We can say some things are true and some things are false—meaning “some-all is true-false and all-some is false-true”. We can say there is historical progress—meaning “progress-stagnation”. We can say there is historical stagnation—meaning “stagnation-progress”. We can say society is evil—meaning “evil-good”. We can say society is good—meaning “good-evil”. We can say we are sometimes happy and sometimes sad—meaning “we-everyone are sometimes-always happy-sad and sometimes-always sad-happy”. And so on. How should we choose which will we say at any time? If all things are sayable in some sense, what should we say right now? We should say whatever is most conducive to liberation from suffering, from one-sided attachments, in this particular situation and context.

4. The Ultimate Reality of All Appearances (諸法實相 zhufashixiang

The same method underlies all of Tiantai's shocking slogans, such as the claim that “all moments are permanent”, as we have seen, or “all appearances are the ultimate reality”, or “evil is ineradicable from the highest good, Buddhahood”. They mean what they say, of course: no moment ever ends, and however anything appears to anyone for however long is the ultimate reality that all things emerge from, all things return to, that explains and supports and sustains all things. True enough. The opposite would also be true. But these particular claims are emphasized in classical Tiantai writings to offset the more common one-sided prejudices that tend the other way. Because the impermanence of things and the illusoriness of appearances is stressed in the rest of Buddhism, it is assumed that anyone getting to Tiantai will already be aware of this side of reality, and indeed may be in danger of clinging to it. So Tiantai asserts the opposite, which is equally true.

All appearances are the ultimate reality: how is that true? Normally, we believe that in some kind of appearance versus reality contrast: “I thought that was a snake, but upon closer inspection it turned out to be a rope”. This is what most of Buddhism also says: “I thought there was a self, but it turned out to be a bunch of impermanent aggregates”. Or, “I thought there was a world, but it turned out to be all mind, or Buddha-nature, or illusion”. Common sense assumes this too: the rim of my glass looks oval, but in fact we know that, “really”, it is round—it's just that we're seeing it from an angle that foreshortens it. The rainbow is a mere appearance—when we go to touch it, we find nothing there. But the clouds and sunlight are real, they are what it really is, what it turns out to really be. Tiantai, however, makes the preposterous claim that the oval and the circle are both true—in fact, both are the ultimate reality, are findable in all things and at all times and places, are the Absolute. The rainbow and the cloudy sunlight—both true, both absolutely true, both the Absolute. The “self” and the impermanent aggregates—both true, both absolutely true, both the Absolute. The snake and the rope—both true, both absolutely true, both the Absolute. All is illusion. All is reality. Time is not an illusion. Time is the illusoriness of every possible thing. Time is a word that means “whatever you think is so is already not so”. What is real? What you can go back to, look at again, check up on, verify, re-examine. But there is literally no experience that you can go back to, so there is none that is real. What is illusion? Something that turns out to be otherwise than it appears. There is no thing of which this is not the case. The horn “appeared” to be round, but “turned out” to be “sharp”. But both roundness and sharpness are equally unreal, equally real. Each is determined by the context in which it is seen. Taking the unnameable whole into account, they too are unnameable, neither sharp nor round. Roundness and sharpness are two names for the same thing, which is round, sharp, and neither round nor sharp, and both round and sharp.

4.1. Inherent Evil Ineradicable In Buddhahood and the Buddha-nature of Insentient Beings

The same goes for the famous Tiantai claim that “evil is inherently included in Buddhahod”. Future Buddhahood lives in past delusion, so delusion is “Buddhahood-delusion”. Past delusion lives in future Buddhahood, so Buddhahood is “delusion-Buddhahood”. The same goes also for the famous Tiantai claim that “insentient beings have the Buddha-nature—i.e., that rocks and stones and all other things with no awareness have the all-pervasive unconditional nature of awareness: awareness is always nonawareness-awareness (all awareness exists-with nonawareness, e.g., the objects of awareness, which are not themselves aware), nonawareness is always awareness-nonawareness (i.e., nonawareness is determinately nonawareness only as contrasted by awareness to awareness itself, and is intrinsically inseparable from whatever awareness might exist in the universe, simply by virtue of the inseparability of all existence).

The controversial idea of “the Buddha-nature of insentient beings” is developed by Zhanran in his Jingangpi using a slightly different approach to the Three Truths, focusing on the trope of space as advanced as a metaphor for Buddha-nature in the Mahāyāna Nirvana Sutra, in its character of all-pervasiveness, ineradicability, and indivisibility, and the non-different/non-identical relation of all regions of space to each other and of each region of space to whatever possible object can occupy it. But here too the central argument is the inseparable intersubsumption of the two opposite terms: sentience is always insentience-sentience, insentience is always sentience-insentience.

One way to think about this is to consider a magnet. It has a north and a south “pole” to it. If we wanted to separate the north from the south pole, we might try cutting it in half. But when we do so, we find that each half still has both a north and a south pole. No matter how many times we slice it, the total set of different characteristics pertaining to the whole are also found in that separate part: northness and southness are, in their entirety, found in what was formerly, in the context of the whole magnet, purely the north part, and also in the former south part. This is how it is in the Tiantai universe: the universe is one big magnet, but instead of just a north and a south, it has 3000 different characteristic aspects: meness, youness, trains, oceans, dogs, soups, historical incidents, smiles, tears, delusion, enlightenment. If we try to isolate any of these, however, what we end up with is another entire “magnet”, which also has all 3000 aspects to it: this meness, it turns out, also has its youness part, its train part, its ocean part, its dog part, and so on. When I face you, it is you-and-me facing you-and-me. It is me-and-all-worlds facing all-worlds-and-me. It is the entire universe facing the entire universe. We are always different, because wherever we go, there is a you and a me, two different aspects, never merging into a blank indifferent mush of a single quality. But since me-and-you is contrasted to me-and-you, there is really no contrast at all: the same thing is found on both sides of the contrast. We are neither the same nor different. We are divided from ourselves, impossible to unify into a simple unity, but for that very reason we are impossible to separate from one another. Each of us, at each moment, are, in a word, absolute, the Center as which all appears, and which is appearing in and as all things. All things are our transformation bodies, we are the transformation body of all things.

4.2 Buddhahood as Full Realization of Dung Beetlehood et alia

This also means that, the more fully one realizes that one is any particular being, the more one realizes that he or she is also all other, contrasted, things as well. This is how traditional Buddhist “non-self” doctrine comes to play out in Tiantai. I think I am already this self, Brook, but in reality, Buddhism tells me, I am not yet really any such self—for to be a self is to be unconditional, and that is impossible for “me”, a conditional determinate being. Also, I am not yet enlightened—for enlightenment is unconditionality, the only freedom from suffering. To become unconditioned, as I'd thought I was when I thought I was a self, is to become enlightened. This non-self is the only thing that really fulfills my previous lust to be a self, to actually be me. I cannot become this by being me as a determinate being to the exclusion of all other beings, nor other beings to the exclusion of me. Rather, by the Three Truths, I can only become more and more me by becoming more and more everything else, and that is what it means to become more and more enlightened, and to become more me, more unconditionally this specific me. To “become what I am”, to be a more fully realized version of myself, is to see myself, Brook specifically, as unconditional, which means as omnipresent and eternal, which means as expressing itself in and as all things, which also means, conversely, intersubsumed, i.e., as an expression of all other things, as something as which all other things are appearing. I cannot be myself until I am a Buddha, but I cannot be a Buddha until I can be more fully (i.e., more unconditionally, more all-pervasively) myself, and that means being more fully a devil, a fool, a table, a spaceship, or, in Siming Zhili's example, a dung beetle. Buddhist practice is the progressively fuller manifestation of my latent Buddhahood—which means also the progressively fuller manifestation of my latent Dung-Beetlehood, and indeed, my allegedly long ago already actual but really hitherto merely latent Brookhood.

5. Practice and Doctrinal Diversity

Tiantai is encyclopedic in its approach to Buddhist practice; as one might expect in light of its view of “exclusion” in general, it excludes nothing. Hence in Tiantai works we find extensive, detailed cataloging of a huge diversity of traditional Buddhist practices, from rituals and devotions to meditations and contemplations of all kinds, derived from all strata of previous Buddhist culture. This accords not only with the philosophical objection to the possibility of any final mutual exclusion of entities rehearsed above, but also to the Lotus Sutra notion of upāya, and the expansion of the range of Conventional Truth in the Three Truths: the diversity of sentient beings is limitless, their specific delusions and attachments and sufferings are of limitless specific types, and thus the appropriate remedial practices and doctrines for them are limitless. This is also the justification for the “trivialist” position that all possible claims are true, for “true“ in the Tiantai context meansonly a remedial upāya serving as a raft to overcome itself, but doing so by totalization of itself, thereby undermining itself, expressing itself in and as all other things, intersubsuming all other truth-claims, thereby become all the more present as all the more absent.

5.1 Self-Overcoming of Doctrinal Hierarchy into Omniultimacy

Tiantai takes the non-dualistic ideas suggested by the Lotus Sutra in fables and unexplained narrative hints, and adapts the resources of Emptiness and the Two Truths to give them a full philosophical explanation and practical application for Buddhist practice. The Lotus Sutra had made upāya the centerpiece of Buddhism, and asserted a unity of all practices in the One Vehicle, all leading toward Buddhahood. Tiantai follows this lead and constructs a vast and complex system for accounting for and integrating all known forms of Buddhist and even non-Buddhist practice, all of which are acceptable skillful means appropriate and wholesome for different persons and times. It rejects nothing, but it organizes all known teachings and practices into an interconnected system. The system has an interesting double structure: the first time through, it appears to be hierarchical, putting the Mahāyāna above the Hinayana and the Lotus above the rest of the Mahāyāna. But the idea of redefinition of identity through recontextualization is applied here, and when the hierarchical crown of the Lotus has done its work, it has the retroactive effect of making all the other parts equal as aspects of the One Vehicle. That is, no teaching, practice or behavior has only a single meaning: its meaning is determined by the context in which it is viewed. So any given doctrine or practice can be seen as both the ultimate truth and as a more partial and only locally relevant, or lesser, truth. The Tiantai system of integrating all the various teachings and ideas and perspectives in the world provides a system for seeing everything twice, three times, infinite times, reassessing and developing the meanings of each item as it comes into broader and broader relations. The Hinayana teaching is, in the narrower context, a “lesser” truth. But in the context of the One Vehicle, it is itself an instantiation of the One Vehicle, and even gives unique expression to it: hence the claim (based on a clever strong misreading of a line from Kumārajīva's translation of the Lotus: 決了聲聞法 為諸經之王) that the Hinayana doctrine (rather than the Lotus itself) is itself the Highest of All Teachings. The same goes for all other particular ideas, beliefs, practices. Since nothing has only one meaning, everything can mean anything. The interesting question about any proposition is not whether it is true (it always is), but how. The Tiantai “classification of teachings” is an intricate and complex way of spelling out in what context and in what way each doctrine means each of the many things it means.

5.2 The Contemplation of Mind as the Three Thousand (觀心 guanxin, 一念三千 yiniansanqian)

The way in which each and any of these alternate methods or doctrines is recontextualized to promote the desired Tiantai implication is through the supplementation of the Three Truths view of any and every possible content. Tiantai meditation most centrally applies a method called “the contemplation of mind”, (觀心 guanxin) given its most famous formulation in Zhiyi's unfolding of 一念三千 yiniansanqian (Japanese: ichinensanzen), which means something like: “One Moment of Experience as Three Thousand Worlds”. The “three thousand” is of course a way of saying “everything”, but it is really something a bit more than that. For of course, as Zhiyi himself points out, any number would be an equally accurate possible way to talk about the totality of all things, from none to infinity. This number, “three thousand”, is concocted specifically with meditational practice in mind. Here's how it's derived:

Ten Realms × Ten Realms × Ten Suchnesses × Three Worlds=3000
Buddhahood Buddhahood Appearance Five Aggregates
Bodhisattva Bodhisattva Nature
Pratyekabuddha[1] Pratyekabuddha Components
Sravaka[2] Sravaka Capability
Gods Gods Action Sentient Beings
Humans Humans Causes
Asuras[3] Asuras Conditions
Animals Animals Effects
Hungry Ghosts Hungry Ghosts Consequences Environment
Purgatories Purgatories Ultimate Equality and Equal Ultimacy

Please note a few peculiarities of this way of listing “what exists”. First, special care is taken here to include both “purgatories” (i.e., the demonic thoughts, practices and consequences of extreme subjective delusion and suffering) on the one hand, and “Buddhas”, (the enlightened thoughts, practices and consequences of the greatest wisdom and liberation) on the other hand. This is important, because it cautions us against viewing these subjective states, good or evil, as mere epiphenenomena that are somehow outside the ultimate reality. They are themselves included in the ultimate reality. By including these terms, Tiantai guards against a vague notion of “everything” which might lend itself to thinking that only a pure or neutral substance—mind, matter, energy—is what is real, or that the values and perspectives, good and bad, painful and pleasant, that living beings experience are not part of the “everything”. The “everything” that is included in each moment of experience, and which is eternally ineradicable, includes all those good and bad subjective states as well.

Second, we have two important reduplications. The ten realms are all the states in which a sentient being might find him or herself in the Buddhist universe, from the lowest ignorance and suffering to the highest bliss and enlightenment. They are often interpreted symbolically: Buddhahood representing a moment of enlightened experience, Bodhisattvahood a moment of compassion, Sravakahood a moment of quiescence or renunciation of the worldly, Godhood a moment of great worldly bliss and power, Asurahood a moment of egoistic rage and combativeness, animals ignorance, purgatories suffering. One reason to read these as states that any being might undergo is that each of the ten realms is listed twice. This is because each realm “includes” or “instantiates” all the other ten realms. That is, each can appear “as” any of the others, and in fact nothing appears which is not always “as” something else. A human-bodhisattva, an animal-god, a Buddha-demon, an Asura-Sravaka, etc. A bodhisattva appears as a human, or an animal, or a Buddha, or an Asura. But as we've seen, this also means a human appears as a bodhisattva, or a demon as an animal, or a Sravaka as a hungry ghost, etc. Of course this goes on ad infinitum: each of these included realms further includes all ten realms, and so on. The 10 times 10 is just to point to this factor of mutual inclusion, and make sure it is accounted for in our meditative contemplation of “what exists”.

The other duplication comes in the “Three Worlds”. We have “the five aggregates” but also “sentient beings”. Actually, these are two ways of looking at the same thing. Early Buddhism taught that what we call a sentient being—you, me, Bill, Dave—is actually a set of five aggregates, momentarily arising and perishing impersonal processes of form, sensation, perception, volition and consciousness. One (the aggregates) was real, the other (the alleged “self”) was a pernicious illusion. The Three Thousand includes both. In other words, it does not exclude the illusions about things among the totality of “what exists”—as we've seen, all things are equally illusions and equally true. The view of you as Bill is one item in the list; the view of you as five impersonal aggregate processes is another item on the list. Here too we have a shorthand way of pointing to a larger principle, and a goad to keep it in mind in our contemplation of “all that exists”. We are not to think of a set of real entities lined up side by side, mutually exclusive, of which there may be some additional erroneous views. Rather, the erroneous view are part of all that exists, indeed all that exists is some erroneous (i.e., one-sided, locally coherent) view. There is no “thing” as such: a thing is just a way of appearing, and comes with a viewpoint upon it. Tiantai insists further that to have a single viewpoint requires at least one additional viewpoint, and so ad infinitum. Normally we drain off the ambiguity and call it “subjectivity” or “free will” or “the unknown future” to one side and leave the “reality” on the other side, calling it “objectivity” or “determinate fact” or “the settled past”. In Tiantai, these are inseparable, merely aspects artificially separated off from the whole, which is always both fixed and open, locally coherent and globally incoherent.

Now once we have gone through thinking about all possible objects of experience this way, one by one, almost in the manner of a list out of Walt Whitman's Leaves of Grass, we apply the Three Truths, the neither-same-nor-different relation, to this thought itself. First temporally: this whole line of thinking required some time to go through. Are the previous moments of thinking same as or different from the present one now considering this question? Neither. All other moments are present here as this moment—neither same nor different, the Three Truths. Next we consider the external world, including my sense organs and brain, that served as the efficient causes for the arising of this moment of thought about the Three Thousand realms of possible experience: is the actual world and my body different from or same as this moment of thought about them all? Neither. The external world is present here as this consciousness of it, neither same nor different. Next we consider all other possible thoughts or experiences, the contrast with which is what makes this moment determinate as itself: are they the same or different from it? Neither. All other experiences are present here as this moment of experience. I experience one moment of experience as a totality, including my illusory presence as the experiencer. The next moment, when new contents appear, will be experienced as more of or other expressions of the same moment. I experience the eternity-temporality of this moment continuing to show itself in and as the neither-same-nor-different array of all other possible experiences, beings, ideas, moments. This is the experience of Buddhahood-as-all-sentient-beings.


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Brook Ziporyn <ziporyn@uchicago.edu>

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