Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy

First published Thu Apr 2, 2015

While there was no word corresponding precisely to the term “metaphysics”, China has a long tradition of philosophical inquiry concerned with the ultimate nature of reality—its being, origins, components, ways of changing, and so on. In this sense, we can speak of “metaphysics” in Chinese Philosophy, even if the particular questions and positions that arose differed from those dominant in Europe. Explicit metaphysical discussions appeared in China with a turn toward questions of cosmogony in the mid-fourth century BCE. These cosmogonies express a number of views that became fundamental for almost all later metaphysics in China. In these texts, all things are interconnected and constantly changing. They arise spontaneously from an ultimate source (most often called dao 道, the way) that resists objectification but is immanent in the world and accessible to cultivated people. Vitality and growth is the very nature of existence, and nature exhibits consistent patterns that can be observed and followed, in particular patterns of cycles and interaction between polar forces (such as yin 陰 and yang 陽).

This basic outlook differs fundamentally from the assumptions that dominated metaphysical thinking in Europe after the introduction of Christianity: the belief that the ultimate principle of the world is transcendent but anthropomorphic (as human beings are made in its image), that the things of the world arise through design, and that the world is composed of ontologically distinct substances. These assumptions have been widely rejected by philosophers over the course of the 20th century, which is partly what makes metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy interesting. In the Chinese tradition we see one possibility for what metaphysics might look like if we were neither apologizing for nor reacting against such views (in Nietszche’s terms, a metaphysics based neither on God nor the Death of God). This is not to say that Chinese metaphysics is homogenous or without its own problems. Rather, we can say that while European metaphysics has tended to center on problems of reconciliation (how ontologically distinct things can interact), Chinese metaphysics has been more concerned with problems of distinction. The most central problems are around the status of individualized things, the relationship between the patterns of nature and specifically human values, and how to understand the ultimate ground of the world in a way that avoids either reification or nihilism. These become problems precisely because of the underlying assumptions of holism and change.

Readers should keep in mind that a survey of metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy is no more adequate than such a survey would be regarding Europe. I have necessarily left out more than I have included. Aside from introducing the most influential positions and philosophers, my primary goal is to illuminate recurring patterns and concerns that can serve as orientation for further reading.

1. Is there “Metaphysics” in Chinese Philosophy?

This entire entry could be taken up with the question begged by its title: Is there metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy? The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy itself seems ambivalent. There is this entry, but instead of a corresponding entry for “Metaphysics in European Philosophy” there is an entry for “Metaphysics” that draws exclusively on European traditions. Rather than argue for the legitimacy of my topic in the abstract, I will explicate specific issues and positions from various Chinese philosophers, leaving it to readers to decide how well they fit the category of metaphysics. Nonetheless, one cannot entirely ignore the problem of applying the term “metaphysics” so far beyond its Greek origins, and so a few preliminary comments are necessary. (For discussions of this issue, see Li and Perkins forthcomingA; Weber 2013; Tan 2012; Liu 2011; Wen 2011; Yu 2011; Yu and Xu 2009; Zhao 2006; Hansen 2001; Zhu 1998; Cheng 1990.)

If we designate an area of philosophical inquiry concerned with the ultimate nature of reality—its being, origins, components, ways of changing, and so on—there is no question that Chinese philosophers addressed issues within this domain. The question is, do we apply the label of “metaphysics” to philosophical arguments within this domain, or do we reserve the label for some specifically European approach or theory. The latter faces an obvious problem—any definition broad enough to include all European approaches will include some Chinese theories, just as any definition narrow enough to exclude all Chinese approaches will also exclude some European philosophers that everyone would agree addressed metaphysics. The question, though, is more about rhetoric and power than the facts. If “metaphysics” labels the broader domain, then studying metaphysics involves engaging other cultures, and an SEP entry on “Metaphysics” that discussed only ideas derived from Europe would be biased and partial. In contrast, if “metaphysics” labels a specifically European view, then courses, books, and encyclopedia entries on metaphysics legitimately exclude other cultures.

At the same time, while applying “metaphysics” to both European and Chinese thought is more inclusive, it also obscures the depth of the differences between the two. More insidiously, it erodes these differences by presenting Chinese philosophy in European terms. That is a legitimate worry, but given the almost entire exclusion of other cultures from the discipline of philosophy, the greater danger is ignoring Chinese Philosophy. Yet if we do take Chinese Philosophy as having metaphysics, we must strive to avoid distorting it to fit into European terms. For example, a simple approach would be to list the main topics in European metaphysics and then see what Chinese philosophers have to say about them. The results would be disappointing, and this approach would miss what is most interesting about a cross-cultural perspective, which is its ability to show that we have not been asking the most interesting or relevant questions. Within this entry, then, I have tried as much as possible to follow and explicate the main issues that arose when Chinese philosophers were concerned with the nature of reality. I have then made brief gestures toward how these issues might connect to metaphysical problems in the European tradition.

A label like “metaphysics” refers to certain human practices at the same time that it draws boundaries around those practices. While Chinese philosophers engaged in the kinds of practices that metaphysics refers to, they did not draw the same boundaries. Isolating metaphysical inquiry from practices of self-cultivation, for example, would have struck almost any Chinese philosopher as odd, if not dangerous. Thus there is no native Chinese term marking the same boundaries as “metaphysics” in European philosophy. When Chinese encountered the term, it was translated by way of Japanese as xing er shang xue 形而上學, literally, “the study of what is above forms”. “What is above forms” had long been a central concept in Chinese philosophy, originating in a passage from the “Xici” commentary on the Yi Jing 易經, the Classic of Changes, which says: “What is above forms refers to the way [dao 道]; what is below forms refers to utensils [qi 器]” (Gao Heng 1998: 407).[1] The distinction between what is above forms and what is below forms has a vague resemblance to the distinction between metaphysics and physics, but the differences are telling. First, what is above forms cannot be fully separated from what is below forms (see Wang forthcoming). Studying only what is above forms would make little sense. Second, while the distinction between metaphysics and physics can be construed in many ways, its most common correlate in the European tradition is the distinction between transcendence and immanence. In the Chinese tradition, the issue instead is the relationship between the formed and the formless. The implications of this difference will appear across a range of metaphysical issues.

2. Proto-Metaphysical Background: The Mandate of Heaven

As far as we know, explicit metaphysical discussions began in China in the mid to late 4th century BCE with the Laozi (Daodejing) and associated texts. Before that, the two dominant philosophical movements were the Mohists and the Ru (Confucians). Both focused on political and ethical issues and showed little direct concern with metaphysical questions, but one can find metaphysical views implicit in their positions. These are closest to the surface in their discussions of the divine, which set the context for the emergence of metaphysical debates.

The two key concepts are tian 天 (heaven) and ming 命 (the command; fate). The idea of tianming 天命 (the “Mandate of Heaven”) first came to prominence in rationalizing the conquest of the Shang dynasty by King Wen and King Wu, who founded the Zhou dynasty in the eleventh century BCE. Heaven is described in anthropomorphic terms as having awareness, preferences, and values. Its most fundamental concern is for the people, as expressed in a famous line from the “Great Declaration” chapter of the Book of Documents (Shangshu 尚書): “Heaven sees from where my people see; heaven hears from where my people hear” (quoted from Mengzi 5A5). As a political doctrine, the claim is that heaven will support rulers who help the people and will bring disaster on rulers who do not. On this view, the world works on regular principles that encompass ethical and political concerns. Human beings determine their own success or failure based on these patterns rather than depending on divine whim. The emergence of this view is commonly seen as a decisive moment in the formation of Chinese philosophy.

While heaven is presented as a willful and anthropomorphic being in the early parts of the Shangshu 尚書, it was not transcendent in the sense of being external to the system of nature. The term tian simultaneously refers to the sky, with senses of the orderly movement of the heavens and of something that encompasses all things equally. The classical Chinese word for the “world” or “realm” is literally what is “under-heaven”, tianxia 天下. Since the actions of heaven occur through the world, the two are often difficult to distinguish. The primary expression of heaven’s will is through human actions—to lose heaven’s mandate is to lose the support of the people. The eventual transition in conceptions of heaven from a willful deity to the causal patterns of nature was possible because heaven was never separate from those patterns. Debates were about the nature of heaven rather than its existence, and heaven remained a central term for philosophers holding widely different viewpoints.

The belief that heaven rewarded good people and punished those who were bad came into question as the Zhou dynasty fell apart. Something like the classical problem of evil arose as centuries of civil war and disaster made it difficult to believe that the world was structured along ethical lines (see Perkins 2014). Three responses can be distinguished. One, exemplified by the Mohists, defended and theorized the earlier view that heaven rewarded those who are good, defined as those who care inclusively for other people. The second questioned the regularity of any natural order, emphasizing that good and bad events come without reason and without concern for justice. This view was associated with a new meaning for ming, taking it not as a command but as something more like blind fate. The third position argued for the regularity of natural patterns but took those patterns as amoral. On this view, human beings remain in control of their fate, but what brings success is not necessarily being ethical, at least in a conventional sense. Versions of this view appears in the Laozi and in theories arising from practical arts like medicine or military strategy. While expressed in different ways in different times, the belief that nature follows consistent patterns that can guide human action became a dominant view across Chinese philosophies, while the relationship between these patterns and humanistic values became one of the main points of dispute.

3. The Cosmogonic Turn

Sometime probably in the middle of the fourth century BCE, a radical shift in vocabulary, concerns, and visions of the human took place.[2] This new position has long been known from the Laozi, but recent archaeological studies show that the Laozi was just one of a number of positions that together constitute what we might call “a cosmogonic turn”.[3] These texts are the first we know of to directly question how the diverse things of the world arise and take form. This concern seems to have been bound up with de-centering and de-privileging human beings. As the Zhuangzi puts it:

In stating the number of things we say there are “ten thousand”, and human beings are just one of them. […] In comparison with the ten-thousand things, [human beings] are not even like the tip of a hair to the body of a horse. (Guo 1978, 17: 564; cf. Ziporyn 2009: 69)

This break with anthropocentrism went along with a shift away from humanistic values like rightness (yi 義) or ritual propriety (li 禮) and toward concerns with maintaining life, reducing desires, and acting spontaneously.

These cosmogonies share the following four assumptions:

  1. The diverse things of the world ultimately trace back to a single source.
  2. The generation of things happens spontaneously, without design, purpose, or deliberate values.
  3. The ultimate is immanent in the world and can be accessed in some way.
  4. Between the ultimate and the myriad concrete things, there are intermediary steps, particularly a role for polarities and cyclical patterns.

Almost every example of cosmogonic thinking in Chinese philosophy shares these characteristics, so it is important to discuss them in some detail.

3.1 Monism

All Chinese thinkers who discussed ultimate origins took that origin to be unique. The best known name for this source is dao 道, which means path, way, or guide. Another important name is taiji 太極, the “supreme polarity”.[4] The term taiji appears in the Yi Jing as the original unity from which yin and yang emerge. It remained an important term and become particularly prominent during the Confucian revival in the Song dynasty. Positing a single source had a decisive influence on Chinese thought, as it implies an underlying unity and connection that easily threatens differentiation and division. One of the most persistent metaphysical concerns is the ontological status of difference and individuation (see Perkins forthcoming). This orientation is just the opposite of that in philosophies based on dualisms or ontologically independent substances, views that were dominant through most of European intellectual history. We can say that European metaphysics has tended to focus on problems of reconciliation (how ontologically distinct things can interact), while Chinese metaphysics has been more concerned with problems of distinction.

There is some ambiguity in saying that the ultimate origin is one. Chapter 42 of the Laozi says that “the one” (yi 一) generates two, which generates three and then the myriad things, but claims that the one itself is not ultimate. It is generated from dao. Chapter 40 says that things are born from being [you有], but being is generated from no-being [wu無]. This reflects one of the early metaphysical debates—is this unitary origin a thing? There seems to have been advocates for each side, but the one that came to dominate is given as a principle in the Zhuangzi: “what things things is not itself a thing” (wuwuzhe feiwu 物物者非物) (Guo 1978, 22: 763; cf. Ziporyn 2009: 91).

The terms you 有 and wu 無 are among the most important metaphysical terms in the Chinese tradition. They are often translated as “being” and “non-being”, but wu refers not to radical nothingness but to the lack of differentiated beings. Thus in the context of the Laozi, Hans-Georg Moeller (2007) translates the two terms as “presence” and “non-presence”, Roger T. Ames and David L. Hall (2003) translate them as “determinate” and “indeterminate”, and Brook Ziporyn (2014) as “being-there” and “not-being-there”. One problem in taking the ultimate as no-thing is that it becomes impossible to speak of. The danger of reifying it is unavoidable, leading into an alternation between those tending toward reification and those rejecting it. For example, the Zhuangzi points out that as soon as you label something, even as no-being (wu), it becomes a thing that needs its own explanation:

There is being, there is no-being, there is not yet beginning to be no-being, there is not yet beginning to be not yet beginning to be no-being. (Guo 1978, 2: 79; cf. Ziporyn 2009: 15)

This very warning against reification, though, is explicated into an influential cosmogony appearing at the start of the second chapter of the Huainanzi, which takes each phrase as labeling an identifiable point in a progression of concrete stages. This dialectic between being and no-being was later taken up in a different form through Buddhist debates about emptiness, and it can be considered one of the central metaphysical problems throughout the Chinese philosophical tradition (See Wang Bo 2011, Cheng 2009, and the essays in Liu and Berger 2014).

3.2 Spontaneous Generation

If we take no-being as indeterminacy, then the problem of a first cause is not getting many from one nor getting something from nothing but rather how differentiation emerges from the undifferentiated. The common explanation appeals to another key metaphysical concept—ziran 自然. The character zi 自 is a reflexive pronoun, and ran 然 means to be in a certain way. Thus ziran means to be so-of-oneself or to be “self-so”. Ziran excludes appeals to purpose, deliberation or design, a view also expressed in the displacement of heaven by terms such as dao or the one. Using ziran to explain how things arise may seem like an evasion, not much different from replying, “that’s just how it is”. If we are to avoid an infinite regress of causes, though, the only possibility is to stop at something that just is the way it is from its own being. The role of ziran (self-so) is similar to the role of causa sui (self-caused) in European philosophy. While classical European metaphysics attempts to isolate this self-causality through a transcendent God, the Chinese took it as the very nature of existence. In this approach, there are similarities with Spinoza’s identification of being and conatus (striving) and even with Nietzsche’s “will to power”.

Two important points follow. First, existence is seen not in terms of abstract being but rather as sheng 生: life, growth, birth, vitality. The fundamental role of sheng appears explicitly in the “Xici” commentary on the Yi Jing, which says that the foundation of the Changes is shengsheng, “generating and generating”, “growing and growing”, “living and living”, or even “natura naturans” (Gao Heng 1998: 388). This phrase inspired the famous description of nature as shengsheng buxi 生生不息: generating, generating, never ceasing! It is sometimes said that Chinese philosophy lacks ontology (and thus metaphysics) because philosophers were never concerned with being as such. It is more accurate to say that Chinese philosophers took dynamic organization as implicit in the very nature of being, rather than positing an external source for motion and order. This means that ontology is also cosmology, even biology.

Second, if spontaneous generation is the very nature of being, then one can legitimately attribute ziran to the ultimate or to things themselves. So chapter 25 of the Laozi says, “Human beings follow earth, earth follows heaven, heaven follows dao, dao follows ziran”, but chapter 64 speaks of “the ziran of the myriad things”, and in chapter 17, the people speak of their own ziran. This contrasts the common division between God as self-caused and everything else as caused by God, a view which ultimately sees being as divided into two fundamentally different kinds. In employing a univocal conception of being as sheng, Chinese philosophies did not segregate self-generation from the world itself.

3.3 Immanence

The third common point is that the ultimate is immanent in the world. It is worth noting that the lack of tense in classical Chinese introduces a fundamental ambiguity into all of these cosmogonies—while they can be read as describing something that happened in the past, they can just as well describe an ongoing process in which the generative function is always present. In one passage, Zhuangzi is asked where dao is and he replies that there is no place from which dao is absent (wusuo buzai 無所不在). Pushed to give an example, he says dao is in ants and crickets. When asked to go lower, Zhuangzi says dao is in weeds, broken tiles, and even in piss and dung (Guo 1978, 22: 750; cf. Ziporyn 2009: 89). Similar statements would later be made about Buddha-nature, particularly in the tradition of Chan 禪 (Zen) Buddhism. The immanence of the source is demonstrated most of all by the fact that it remains accessible to cultivated people. In the Laozi, dao is something one can use in the world:

Dao is constantly without name. Although in its unhewn simplicity it is minute, heaven and earth do not dare subordinate it. If princes and kings can preserve it, the ten thousand things will make themselves their guests. (Ch 32)

It is difficult to find the right language to describe the relationship between dao and human beings. The dao is not external, so it is not a matter of getting or reaching it, and it is not an object that could be grasped. Since the self-so spontaneity to which dao refers is always present, what is required is a negative process of removing obstacles. Ziran is what remains if we free ourselves from striving and conventional goals. Thus this same process is described as wuwei 無為, which literally means “lacking action” but refers to giving up striving and effort. The Zhuangzi gives another example, the “fasting of the heart/mind” (xinzhai 心齋) that allows us to rely directly on vital energy (qi) and respond spontaneously to whatever appears before us (Guo 1978, 4: 147; cf. Ziporyn 2009: 26).

3.4 Polarity and Cycles

All of the cosmogonies posit stages between the ultimate and the concrete myriad things of the world. The need for intermediary stages is given no explicit justification, but it follows if things arise spontaneously rather than by conscious choice or design. If their ground is immanent rather than teleological, concrete things must be explained through a gradual process of spontaneous differentiation. Having a series of stages also allows for degrees of differentiation within a connected whole. That provides an explanation not just for the concrete myriad things, but also for nature as a system.

The most common stage involved interaction between two forces. These polar forces could be specified in many ways—heaven and earth, hot and cold, dry and moist—but the pair that came to dominate is yin 陰 and yang陽. (For an authoritative study of yin and yang, see Wang 2012.) Yang originally referred to the south side of a mountain, which received the sun, while yin referred to the north side. Ultimately, yang was associated with the masculine, the forceful, and the bright, while yin was associated with the feminine, the yielding, and the obscure. Creativity followed from the interaction of yin and yang, modeled on sexual reproduction.

Another common point is a role for cycles and processes of return. One prominent model is the four seasons. The change of seasons places cycles of growth and decay into a broader context of continuous vitality. The change of seasons itself, though, was seen as expressing a more fundamental cycle between poles such as yin and yang. Cyclical change could also be theorized through the progressions of generation (sheng 生) or overcoming (ke 克) among the five phases (wuxing 五行): wood, earth, fire, air, and metal. Another version of this cycling between poles was the claim that when processes reach an extreme, they reverse. Yet another manifestation is that things emerge from a common source and ultimately return to that source. In all of these cases, cyclicality explains the sustainability and predictability of natural patterns.

4. Impartiality and Differentiation

No pre-Buddhist Chinese philosophers claimed that the qualitatively differentiated world we experience is an illusion, but their monistic metaphysics privileged connectedness and unity. While patterns of differentiation may be objective, individuation (i.e., what counts as a thing) is provisional and contextual. It is always possible to view all things as forming one whole or one body, and this unity has strong tendencies toward equalizing values. From our contextual point of view, one thing can be said to be better, bigger, or more beautiful than another, but from a broader perspective all things have the same status. This could lead toward skepticism of absolute values (as in the Zhuangzi) or toward an imperative to care for all things. Hui Shi (c. 380–305 BCE) is reported to have said: “Care overflowingly for all the myriad things; heaven and earth form one body [yiti 一體]” (Guo 1978, 33: 1102; Ziporyn 2009: 124). This can be seen as a radicalization of the Mohist claim that heaven generates all human beings and thus cares for them all equally, a point rooted in the early Zhou view of heaven as protecting the people. A progression toward more and more radical impartiality is mapped out in a passage from the Lüshi chunqiu 呂氏春秋, a text compiled around 239 BCE. The passage begins with a statement of nature’s impartiality:

The world is not one person’s world but the world’s world. The harmony of yinyang does not grow just one type. Sweet dew and timely rain are not partial to one thing. The birth of the myriad peoples does not favor one person.

This is followed by story contrasting Kongzi (Confucius) and Lao Dan (Laozi):

A person of Jing lost a bow and was not willing to search for it, saying, “A person of Jing lost it, a person of Jing will find it, so why search?” Kongzi heard this and said, “If you leave out ‘Jing’, then it is acceptable”. Lao Dan heard it and said, “If you leave out ‘person’, then it is acceptable”. Thus it was Lao Dan who reached the utmost impartiality. (Chen Qiyou 1984, 1/4: 45)[5]

The level of impartiality attributed to Laozi makes loss impossible. Everything is already found.

As the reference to Kongzi suggests, this tendency toward inclusivity threatened the humanistic ethics of the Confucians. While they continued to focus on social and ethical issues, they needed a metaphysical basis for their views. Moreover, while the cosmogonies exemplified by the Laozi explained the dynamism inherent in particular things and they explained the broader patterns of nature in which those things operated, they did not address the differences between kinds of things—what makes human beings differ consistently from dogs? The concept that arose to fill this gap and to justify Confucian humanism is xing 性 (see Perkins 2013). Xing is most often translated as the “nature” of a thing or kind of thing, but it refers specifically to the way a thing responds spontaneously to its environment. In human beings, xing manifests itself primarily as desires and emotions, broadly labeled as qing 情 (genuine affects). One of the key questions debated by the Confucians was the nature of these spontaneous responses—do they push us to pursue our own pleasures or do they lead us to care for other people?

Xing became a foundation for theories of motivation but its roots are in metaphysics. Xing derives from heaven and is closely connected to sheng 生, the term meaning to live or generate. Xing moves from the generic creativity or vitality of nature to the specific life processes of kinds of things. More concretely, xing was conceptualized as the dynamic flow of qi (vital energy). One recently discovered text from the late 4th century BCE (known as the Xing zi ming chu 性自命出) brings these levels together:

Although all human beings have xing, the heart lacks a stable resolve. It awaits things and then stirs, awaits being pleased and then acts, awaits practice and then stabilizes. The vital energies (qi 氣) of pleasure, anger, grief, and sadness are xing. Their appearing on the outside is because things stimulate them. Xing comes out from what is allotted (ming) and what is allotted comes down from heaven (tian). (Liu Zhao 2003: strips 1–3).

The term qi, translated here as “vital energy”, is already well known in English. It was originally taken as one kind of stuff, connected with air and breath, but it eventually became the dominant label for the basic stuff of the world, used to explain all kinds of dynamic processes, from the formation of heaven and earth to the patterns of weather to the processes of the human heart.[6] It was closely connected with life and the generative power of nature. In this passage, human affects (including desires and a tendency to approve or disapprove) are the movement of this qi when stimulated by events in the world. This is part of the Confucian response to the focus on wuwei and reducing desires in texts like the Laozi and Zhuangzi—affects like sorrow and care arise spontaneously, by ziran. They are as natural for human beings as it is for water to flow downward or for trees to grow toward the sun.

It may seem that with this topic we have drifted from metaphysics into ethics, but human actions are not different in kind from the movements of other things in the world, and human motivation expresses the tendency toward growth inherent in the very nature of existence. The use of xing and ziran in relation to motivation differs from the concerns around free will in almost every way, but there is still something analogous in that both arise as ways of explaining how human choices relate to the forces driving change in the rest of the natural world, or even how human choices relate to the very nature of being. In this way, both issues unite metaphysics and ethics.

Beyond its role in explaining motivation, xing helps explain the organization of the world into individuals and kinds. In a series of passages arguing with a rival named Gaozi, Mengzi shows that whatever would explain the natures of things must have its own dynamism and directionality, and it must explain the specific differences between kinds of things (6A1–3). On the one side, xing differentiates things in terms of coherent patterns of force, providing a basis for individuation, even if what counts as an individual is contextual and provisional. One can refer to the xing of a human being but also the xing of the human mouth (6A7), to the xing of a mountain ecosystem (6A8) or the xing of a single tree (6A1). On the other side, xing was generally used as a species concept—things of the same kind have the same xing. Mengzi’s ethical philosophy is based on his belief that human beings share certain ways of responding to the world, all having the same xing. The status of species, though, was a point of controversy, linked to the question of whether or not all human beings could be held to the same standards. A more radical line of thought took each individual as having its own unique xing, a view rooted in parts of the Zhuangzi and developed later by Guo Xiang (?–312 CE).

5. Correlative Cosmology

Near the end of the Warring States Period, new assumptions about cosmology appeared that dominated the Han dynasty and profoundly influenced the development of Chinese thought. This new view has come to be known as “correlative cosmology”, following a phrase used by A.C. Graham (1986), but it was not a single cosmology as much as several cosmological principles.[7] As a metaphysical theory, its core elements are various schema for sorting phenomena into kinds (lei 類) and a theory of causality based on stimulus and response (ganying 感應). These elements appear together in a paradigmatic statement from the Lüshi chunqiu:

Things of the same kind summon each other, those with the same vital energy join together, sounds that match resonate. Thus if you strum a gong note other gong will resonate; if you strum a jue note other jue will vibrate. Use a dragon to bring rain; use the form to move the shadow. The masses of people think that fortune and misfortune come from fate [ming]. How could they know from where they truly come! (Chen Qiyou 1984, 20/4: 1369)

The categories used could be more or less general, so on one side might be “human being” or “animal” while on the most general side all things could be classified as either yin or yang. Another of the most common categories were wood, earth, fire, air, and metal, known as the five phases (wuxing). Yet another set were based on the Yi Jing, using either the eight trigrams or sixty-four hexagrams. These various systems of categorization were eventually integrated, so that categories from one could be translated into the others. Given the underlying ontology of change and process, categorization is not based on inherent qualities or essences. The basis is not the thing itself but its typical ways of acting and reacting—does it tend to expand or contract, work gradually or swiftly, manifest itself obviously or subtly? Since these traits are relational, the same “thing” may not always be in the same category (it might act like wood in one context but metal in another), and because they are dynamic, the categories give immediate information on how things can be controlled, influenced, or disrupted. The application of the categories depends on context and the context depends on our particular purposes, but they are meant to capture real properties of things, which is why they can be considered as falling within the realm of metaphysics.

Consider the use of the most general categories, yin and yang. Yang labels the tendency to expand and dominate; yin labels the tendency to draw things in by yielding. On the broadest level, anything can be put in one of these two categories, but yin and yang are not inherent properties. The same thing that might be active and dominating in one relationship might be softer and yielding in another (as is commonly the case in Chinese medicine). The function of the labels can be compared to the way we label cause and effect. We can designate a cause and an effect in any change, but being a cause is not an essential property. Everything is simultaneously the cause of many effects and the effect of many causes. As cause and effect illustrate, even a set of two labels can be helpful in analyzing situations, and yinyang could become more and more specific in various ways. For example, in the Yi Jing, lines representing either yin (a divided line) or yang (a straight line) can be combined into groups of three to form eight trigrams, or groups of six to form 64 categories. Each of these lines could be taken as more or less stable, thus leading to 4096 possible readings.

The conception of causality at work here has come to be labeled with the Chinese phrase ganying 感應, “stimulus and response”. In fact, causality was described in several ways. One model is resonance, as in the quotation above where the vibrations of one string stimulate vibrations in strings tuned to the same note. Another model is stimulation, in which one action induces or provokes the actions of another. Causality could also be a matter of drawing something forward. These ways of analyzing causality reflect the fact that existence is inherently active and dynamic—an effect is never purely passive or inert, and a cause works through the inherent activity of the thing affected.

The final element that must be considered is the role of correlations. As noted, phenomena were categorized by characteristic ways of acting and reacting. Since these are context specific, the categories necessarily situate phenomena in relation to others—to be yin is to have a relationship to something that is yang, to be wood-like is to stand in certain relationships to fire, metal, earth, and air. Thus to place two phenomena in the same category is to situate them in analogous configurations. In this way, the basis for categorization immediately grounds a kind of analogical or correlative thinking. These correlations were based on similar ways of functioning, but as the categories were integrated and extended to all phenomena, the similarities become less and less apparent, sometimes seeming forced and arbitrary. The Lüshi chunqiu is one of the earliest examples of this kind of correlative thinking. For the first month that starts spring, it correlates (among other things) certain days of the month, certain divinities, scaly animals, the musical note jue, sour tastes, bad smells, and the number eight (Chen Qiyou 1984, 1/1: 1–2).

The significance of these correlations is that phenomena can be influenced through their correlates. So in Chinese medicine, an illness categorized as excessive heat can be treated with foods categorized as cold. While many of the correlations now seem implausible, this kind of thinking is rooted in a concern for acting in harmony with natural patterns, going back to the concept of shi 時, which refers to the seasons, to the temporal configuration of a given moment, and to the ability to act according to the demands of that moment (on this issue, see Sellman 2002). So for the first month, in addition to rules for what the king should wear and where he should reside, the Lüshi chunqiu recommends surveying the land to set the boundaries of fields (so that conflicts are settled before planting begins), bans killing young animals and destroying eggs (so as to avoid shortages later), and forbids conscripting groups for war or major construction (so that they have time to plant the fields). These are essentially rules for sustainability.

It is striking that the model that dominated modern European thinking about causality—linear causality through collision (on the model of billiard balls) was not central to Chinese reflections on causality (as it also was not central in Europe before the late Renaissance). For Chinese philosophers, the paradigms for causality were things like the effects of music over a distance, the relationship between spring and the growth of plants, and the influence between a teacher and a student. This orientation followed from belief that all things are interconnected and are ultimately composed of the same stuff—qi. It also reflected practical concerns—How does culture work so that people can live together harmoniously? How do we relate to nature in a way that is sustainable? Approaching causality from this direction, though, is notoriously difficult. Han dynasty philosophers were basically starting from what we might now call ecological thinking or theories of complexity.

The dominance of correlative cosmology was tied to the interests it served. It posited a tightly ordered universe whose patterns could be grasped and mastered. The earlier quote from the Lüshi chunqiu ends with a powerful message: people think some things happen without reason or cause, attributing it to fate, but they are wrong. Nothing happens without a cause, and the system of causes can be known and controlled. While philosophers such as Wang Chong王充 (27–100 CE) argued that correct actions sometimes end in failure, the dominant view placed human beings in full control of their fates.

The elevation of human power appears also in the way the system of correlations provides a metaphysical foundation for what would seem to be human constructs. Nature exhibits the same hierarchical relationships implicit in the systems of categorization. Yin and yang were still seen as complementary, but they shifted from equal forces driving generation to markers for unequal positions in a system of correlated arrangements (Wang 2005). So the dominance of the ruler correlated with the dominance of the father but also with the dominance of the sun and ultimately the dominance of yang. Another example of this shift was the correlation of leniency and violence (or the civil, wen 文, and the martial, wu 武) with the spring and the fall. This correlation made the use of violence a necessary and natural principle, while also restricting it to certain times. This cosmology ends up doing much of the work that was done by anthropomorphism in the European tradition. In both cases, human culture is seen as mirroring structures at the foundation of the natural world. In the case of Europe, that foundation is seen as human-like in that we are made in the image of God, thus anthropomorphizing the natural. In Chinese correlative cosmology, the opposite occurs, where specifically human phenomena are theorized as natural. In both cases, social and political hierarchies are given a metaphysical basis.

The Han dynasty collapsed in 220 CE, leading to a long period of fragmentation, instability, and uncertainty. The dominant philosophical movement is known as Xuanxue 玄學, “Profound Learning”. The term xuan means dark, obscure, or profound, but it also has a sense of what precedes any division, as it is used in the first chapter of the Laozi. The best known works from this movement are the commentaries by Wang Bi (226–249) (on the Laozi and Yi Jing) and by Guo Xiang (?–312 CE) (on the Zhuangzi). (For studies of Xuanxue philosophy, see Ziporyn 2014: 137–184; Ziporyn 2003; Wagner 2003; Chan 1999.) Because of the centrality of the Laozi and Zhuangzi, the movement is sometimes known in English as “Neo-Daoism”. Different philosophers held different positions, but the core metaphysical issue was how to understand dao as ultimate ground, particularly how to interpret descriptions of dao as no-being (wu 無) and how to understand the relations between dao and the concrete world we experience.

Xuanxue was important for establishing much of the metaphysical vocabulary used in later Chinese philosophy. One of the most important terms is li 理, which in its original use was a verb for laying out borders according to the contours of the land, or for carving jade according to its own patterns. Both Wang Bi and Guo Xiang use li as a technical term—for Wang Bi li refers to the patterns of coherence represented by the hexagrams of the Yi Jing, while for Guo Xiang li refers to patterns of differentiation that spontaneously arise in the world (Ziporyn 2014: 137–84). Li was later used by Chinese Buddhists to refer to emptiness and by Neo-Confucians to refer to patterns of coherence. The latter will be discussed further below.

A second key concept to arise is the pairing of ti 體 and yong 用. (For discussions of ti-yong, see Ziporyn 2014: 149–155; Zhang 2002: 252–53; Cua 2002; Cheng 2002.) Yong means use or function. Ti originally refers to an organized form, a pattern that can be recognized, or to a body or part of the body. The pairing of tiyong was applied in different ways, but what is most consistent through these uses is that ti is singular and yong is multiple. For example, the same piece of wood (ti) could have many different uses (yong): to fuel a fire, to build a house, to carve into bowls, and so on. As in this example, the multiplicity of yong comes through involvement in concrete circumstances or purposes. In this way, ti is usually less determinate than yong. In fact, the ultimate ti was generally taken as fully indeterminate, thus allowing for infinite determinate uses (yong). The contrast between ti and yong sometimes looks like a contrast between the thing itself and the various ways it can be used. Such a contrast is highlighted in the translation of ti as substance. This translation is misleading in several ways. First, like yin and yang, the labels ti and yong are contextual and thus the very same thing might be considered as ti in one context but as yong in another. Second, the ultimate ti is almost never taken to be individuated—it is emptiness or vital energy or the patterns of coherence (li) that all things share. So the “substance” of a thing ultimately undermines its status as an individual. It is worth noting that the phrase chosen to translate the ontos in ontology was benti 本體, literally the “root” ti, a term that was prominent in Neo-Confucianism.

6. Buddhist Metaphysics in China

The next major transformation in metaphysics in China came with the introduction and incorporation of Buddhist philosophy, a process that began in the 1st century CE. On the surface, one might think that Buddhism opposes metaphysical speculation. In the famous parable of the arrow, the Buddha compares a student insistent on metaphysical speculation to someone who has been shot with a poisoned arrow but refuses to be treated until he knows who shot the arrow, why they shot it, where the arrow came from, and so on. The point is that we know that the central problem in life is suffering and we know that the cure is the elimination of self-centered desires. Nonetheless, Buddhists commonly claim that one can be released from such desires by seeing reality as it truly is. The truth to be realized is that there is no self as an independent and lasting being. Much of Buddhist philosophy can be read as a sustained attack on any kind of substance-based metaphysics. The existence of substances (and thus of the self as a real and lasting thing) requires three things: ontological separation between things (making the self distinct from others), internal unity (so that it is one self), and sameness over time (so it remains the same self). Buddhists attack all three of these, arguing that things are interconnected, lack intrinsic unity, and change endlessly. This involves two of the the main themes in Buddhist metaphysics—impermanence (anitya/wuchang 無常) and dependent co-arising (pratītyasamutpāda/yuanqi 緣起).

The process oriented metaphysics of Buddhism fit well with the Chinese philosophical tradition, but it had a profound transformative effect. Buddhist metaphysics brought a level of precision and complexity honed through a long tradition of intense disputation and dialectic. Positions that had been taken for granted in China were articulated in detail and defended against alternatives that had never been a concern (such as the idea of an eternal and unchanging soul). New possibilities were introduced, including the claim that only mind is real. Of course, as Buddhism impacted Chinese philosophy, China transformed Buddhism, leading to schools of Buddhism that never existed in India.

Much of Buddhist metaphysics involves negotiating a middle ground between reification and nihilism. The problem appears in relation to the self—it may be true that there is no self, but surely there is something which grounds or generates or is the illusion of self. One early school (Abhidharma) argued the self is a label for what is really an aggregate of elements and factors, known as dharmas (fa 法). Apparent wholes like the self can be reduced to these constituent factors, just as a chariot can be reduced to its parts. A more radical view, though, extended the critique of the self to any entity that might be taken as independently real or self-defined, in Buddhist terms, anything that might have svabhāva, literally “self-being” or “self-nature” (in Chinese, zixing 自性). This denial of self-being follows from dependent co-arising, which claims that any event depends on and is bound up with others. Lacking an independent essence or ground, all phenomena are said to be empty, śūnyatā or kong 空. Emptiness is meant to be a middle ground between affirming or denying the existence of things, but such a middle ground is difficult to articulate, and the history of Buddhism can be seen as a dialect between those proposing some kind of reality (tending toward reification) and those rejecting it (tending toward nihilism).

This dialectic is portrayed differently by different thinkers, depending on what they take to be the final position that encompasses all others. As an example, we can consider the progression given by Zongmi 宗密 (780–841), a philosopher representative of the Huayan 華嚴 school but with close links to Chan (see Gregory 1995 and 2002). In his Inquiry into the Origins of Humanity (Yuanren lun 原人論) Zongmi begins with the view that each person has a soul that is reincarnated according to his or her actions. He critiques this position by analyzing this self in terms of its parts—the self cannot be identified with the totality of parts (since some parts are lost at death) nor with one part among many (which would make the other parts irrelevant and thus not really even parts). This leads into the next position, that

bodily form and cognitive mind, because of the force of causes and conditions, arise and perish from moment to moment, continuing in a series without cease, like the trickling of water or the flame of a lamp. (trans. from Gregory 2009: 143)

According to Zongmi, this denial of the self cannot account for continuity, and in particular, the links between actions and consequences. There must be some common medium that holds the various elements together. That leads into the third position, that all the various changes are appearances of one mind, which is the ultimate reality. This was the position of the Yogācāra or Consciousness-Only (weishi 唯識) school of Buddhism.

The claim that mind is the ultimate reality tends back toward the side of reification and so the next step negates it. Zongmi’s argument is typical of the Madhyamaka school (commonly known in Chinese as the “Three Teachings”, Sanlun 三論). If we identify this one mind with concrete thoughts, then either both are illusions or both are real, but if we separate this mind from concrete thoughts then we end up with thoughts that exist on their own and a mind that has no qualities whatsoever. While the target here is mind as the ultimate reality, a similar argument can be used to attack anything claimed to be real and unchanging. For Zongmi, though, this position does not end the dialectic:

If the mind and its objects are both nonexistent, then who is it that knows they do not exist? Again, if there are no real things whatsoever, then on the basis of what are the illusions made to appear? Moreover, there has never been a case of the illusory things in the world before us being able to arise without being based on something real. If there were no water whose wet nature were unchanging, how could there be the waves of illusory, provisional phenomenal appearances? (trans. from Gregory 2009: 146)

He calls this fifth and final position “The Teaching that Reveals the Nature”, reinterpreting a term we have already seen, xing 性, which here stands for the Buddha-nature (Fo xing 佛性). This ultimate reality could also be referred to as the true mind or as the Tathāgatagarbha (Rulaizang如來臧), which literally means the “Womb of the Thus-Come” (“Thus-Come” being a common name for the Buddha).

While the last three positions had prominent advocates in China, the final position became dominant and was shared by Tiantai 天臺, Huayan, and Chan Buddhists. (For broader studies of metaphysics in Huayan Buddhism, see Ziporyn 2000; Odin 1982; Cook 1977. For Tiantai, see Ziporyn 2004, 2000; Swanson 1989.) One obvious question is how this final position differs from the position of Mind-Only. Zongmi’s argument comes down to the relationship between reality and illusion, which is another core metaphysical problem within Chinese Buddhism (see Kantor forthcoming). The basis of the problem is in the critique of self-being. The world we experience obviously fits the Buddhist account—nothing is independent, a true unity, or free from change. Thus any metaphysics that allows for substances with self-being requires a bifurcation between reality and appearances, or more specifically, between the substance itself and the various qualities or modes by which it appears. A common line of argument in Buddhist metaphysics is to attack any such split. To claim that things are empty is to say that there is nothing more to them than there appears to be. This is the meaning of the common saying: “form is emptiness and emptiness is form”. Any attempt to articulate something as ultimately real tends to fall into a split between reality and the changing phenomenal world, making the latter false or illusory. That is the core of Zongmi’s critique of the Mind-Only school. Buddha-nature as it is articulated in Tiantai and Huayan attempts to talk about ultimate reality while avoiding the dualism that implies. This leads to the claim that all sentient beings are already enlightened—what is needed is not to change reality or get rid of illusion but just to realize that we are already where we need to be.

One of the more thorough and influential discussions of the relationship between emptiness or Buddha-nature and the realm of experience is the Meditative Approaches to the Huayan Dharmadhātu (Huayan Fajie Guan Men 華嚴法界觀門), attributed to Dushun 杜順 (557–640) (see Fox 2009). According to Dushun, the world of experience can be viewed in four different ways. The first is as phenomena or events (shi 事), which is equivalent to the realm of form. The second is as emptiness, referred to here with the term li 理. The point is that, in one sense reality can be seen as the multitude of phenomena but in another sense it can be seen as all empty, which entails a kind of equality and interchangeability. The third perspective addresses the relationship between emptiness and phenomena, using the relationship between water and waves as a metaphor. The two are mutually encompassing and mutually dependent, just as there is no water without waves and waves are nothing other than water, yet one can obscure the other, just as we can focus solely on the wave or solely on the water. The point is that designating a wave is not the same as designating water, yet these designations do not “obstruct” each other. The very same reality can be taken as the phenomena of everyday experience and as emptiness.

The fourth perspective brings us to a metaphysical issue that has recurred across the Chinese philosophical tradition—the interconnection of things. It is not just that emptiness and phenomena are mutually penetrating but that any phenomenon is penetrated by all others. The claim that any one thing includes all others is clearest on the level of causality and intelligibility. Consider the cause for your reading this article. It might be for help in a course, or because you followed a link out of curiosity, or from a desire to better understand the context of the Laozi. But we could say the cause was the story of how your parents met—had that not happened you would not be reading this article. Or it might be the story of how my parents met, or the creation of the internet, or the founding of Stanford University. It could be the gravitational pull of the earth or the farm that raised the food I ate for breakfast. If everything is interconnected, then anything could be given as a cause for your reading this article. What makes one answer better than another is determined only by the interests of the questioner (are they interested in increasing web traffic to the SEP? understanding digital humanities? the legacy of Stanford University?). This shows how any one event implicates and arises with all others. Consider further, though, that all things are empty. They have no independent self-nature, so what it is to be that thing is explained entirely by all of the factors that allow it to appear as what it is. Thus it is not just that things implicate each other but that things include each other. This inclusion applies not just between any two events but also between any event and the totality of other events; the story of the whole universe can be explicated from any one point. Brook Ziporyn (2000) calls this “omnicentric holism”—any phenomena can be taken as the center from which the whole follows (a position with remarkable similarities to that of Leibniz). We must remember the soteriological purposes of these Buddhist theories—if any one thing implies all others, then it is impossible to grasp only one thing. Grasping and attachment become incoherent. It is worth comparing this result with the elimination of loss through radical impartiality, discussed in Section 4 above.

7. Coherence and Vital Energy in Neo-Confucianism

The interpenetration of emptiness and phenomena is an affirmation of the changing world in which we live. Thus it is false to see Chinese Buddhism as life-negating or as denying the diversity of the world. Nonetheless, the metaphysics of emptiness is directed toward overcoming attachments. Diversity remains, but there are no individuals that could be held onto. The Confucian response, which became a dominant force in the Song dynasty (960–1279), was driven primarily by an aversion to these consequences. This reaction can be seen in three concrete positions—the acceptance of suffering and death as unavoidable, the differentiation of roles and norms within society, and most of all, the embrace of negative affects such as sorrow at the death of a parent or anxious concern for a child in danger, taking these as essential to our humanity. This Confucian movement was known as the “Learning of the Way” (Daoxue 道學), but it has come to be known in English as “Neo-Confucianism”.

While based on practical concerns, this Confucian revival was grounded in metaphysical claims.[8] In terms of the dialectal movement we have seen, the Neo-Confucians take all of the Buddhist positions as nihilistic. The first influential Confucian responses appear in cosmologies that reflect the characteristics of early Chinese cosmogonies discussed above. We can take the cosmogony given by Zhang Zai 張載 (1020–1077) as an example. (For studies of Zhang Zai, see Ziporyn forthcoming and Kasoff 1984.) Zhang Zai’s basic move is to argue that the ultimate—labeled as “Supreme Emptiness” (Taixu 太虛)—cannot be nothingness but must instead be qi, and the fundamental characteristic of this qi must be a dynamic and vital interplay between opposites. Zhang explains:

The Supreme Emptiness of necessity consists of vital energy. Vital energy of necessity integrates to become the myriad things. Things of necessity disintegrate and return to the Supreme Emptiness. Appearance and disappearance following this cycle are a matter of necessity. (modified from Chan 1969: 501)

There are several important points to note in Zhang Zai’s position. First, he explicitly argues that the only way to explain the origins of the world we experience is if dynamism and differentiation are the very nature of existence. For this reason, Ziporyn (forthcoming) argues that the ultimate for Zhang Zai is not qi but harmony itself. Second, by positing qi as fundamental, Zhang Zai shifts from questions about nihilism and reification back to the relationship between the formed and the formless. In making the formed and formless two modalities of existence, Zhang Zai allows that both are equally real. In this way, he reaffirms the importance of individuated things like parents and children.

Zhang Zai’s cosmology extends several points we have already seen. To say that the nature of qi is active differentiation is to say that the nature of qi is sheng, vitality or generation. This emphasis on being as a force of growth and vitality was a common point among Neo-Confucians, and it was linked directly to the virtue of ren 仁, humaneness or benevolence. To be humane is to support and extend the generative process of nature itself. Furthermore, there is a unity to things in the world, grounded in the fact that they are all made up of qi and they unfold in interlocking patterns of influence. As Zhang Zai puts it in the famous Western Inscription:

Heaven is my father and earth is my mother, and even such a small creature as I finds an intimate place in their midst. Therefore that which fills the universe I regard as my body [ti 體] and that which directs the universe I consider as my nature [xing 性]. All people are my brothers and sisters, and all things are my companions. (trans from Chan 1969: 497)

Cheng Hao程顥 (1032–1085) later compares one who does not care for these other things to someone who has lost sensation in their own limbs. Wang Yangming 王陽明 (1472–1529) extends these feelings of concern even to trampled grass and broken roof tiles.

Deriving inclusive care from the vitality and unity of nature appeared in the Warring States Period, but in opposition to Confucianism. For the Confucians, this focus on being as vitality needed a counterpoint, and that came through a reinterpretation of the term li 理. The difficulty of the term appears in the range of common translations: principle, patterns, coherence. Li often refers to something we should follow and in this sense it might be taken as principles, but li also refers to actual patterns of differentiation, not just to ideals. Considering that li is contextual and involves human purposes and perspectives, translating the term as “coherence” or “coherent patterns” probably best brings these various aspects together. Stephen C. Angle gives an excellent brief definition of li as “the valuable, intelligible way that things fit together” (Angle 2009: 32).[9] There are patterns of coherence in world, and these patterns define individual things, constitute nature as a system, and structure human society. Li describes the way that these patterns can be optimally harmonized or made to cohere so as to foster the human good (i.e., to be valuable and intelligible).

In some ways, the Neo-Confucian interpretation of li is a return to earlier Chinese views that took nature as having stable patterns that we can recognize and follow. The Neo-Confucians defend these earlier views against what they saw as Buddhist attacks by claiming that the differentiated structure of the world we live in is real. At the same time, these patterns of coherence give specific form to our concerns and efforts, so that one can justify caring primarily for one’s own parents while still taking all things as part of one’s own body. Even so, the term li had already been appropriated by Buddhists, and the Neo-Confucian conception of li retains several Buddhist aspects.

The most obvious example is the claim that the totality of li is contained in any one thing. Cheng Yi 程頤 (1033–1107) coined what became a standard motto: “Li is one but distinguished as many” (li yi fen shu 理一分殊) (Angle 2009: 44). This unity within diversity was illustrated with a metaphor taken from Buddhism—the moon reflects on many different surfaces, but it remains the one same moon. Since li refers to patterns of coherence and all things ultimately form one body, it follows that all things are mutually implicated, a point already discussed in relation to Huayan above. The Neo-Confucians do not go so far as to say that each thing contains all other things, though. Any instance of coherence implicates all others, but events still have their own reality. Another common Neo-Confucian claim with Buddhist overtones follows: if the totality of li is included within any particular thing, then it must also exist within each person’s heart/mind. One of the main disputes among the Neo-Confucians was on the precise meaning and significance of this point. Zhu Xi朱熹 (1130–1200) argued that li is the nature (xing) found in the heart, while Lu Xiangshan 陸象山 (1139–1192) and Wang Yangming took li and the heart to be identical. This leads to a difference in emphasis between the two main schools of Neo-Confucianism regarding their recommended process of accessing li: the “School of Li” (lixue 理學) (also known as the Cheng-Zhu school) placed more emphasis on study and learning, while the “School of Heart/Mind” (xinxue 心學) (the Lu-Wang school) concentrated more on self-reflection. This difference, though, is one of emphasis: since they agreed that li could be accessed through our own heart and through things in the world, all Neo-Confucians promoted both self-reflection and learning.

One more expression of this Buddhist background is in the relationship between the normative and descriptive functions of li. In so far as coherence implies value and intelligibility, li is never purely descriptive. The difficulty is that li seems sometimes to refer to actual patterns of coherence but other times to the ideal of maximal coherence. So one might assume the li of human beings explains what human beings are, but it actually describes the way sages are—responding to every situation with the appropriate feelings and actions. The key to understanding this point is to recall the claim that since everyone possesses Buddha-nature (fo xing), everyone is already enlightened. The Neo-Confucians inherit this view and merge it with Mengzi’s claim that human nature (xing) is good. This position involves inherent ambiguities in relating is and ought—strictly speaking, there is nothing we ought to do, since we already are what we are supposed to be. The process of self-cultivation must be conceptualized not as a process of changing ourselves but rather as removing the obstacles that keep us from being what we already are. Phillip J. Ivanhoe has nicely captured this point by contrasting the views of self-cultivation for Mengzi and Wang Yangming as the difference between a model of development and a model of discovery (Ivanhoe 2002).

Within this shared position, though, there are great differences. While Buddhists claim one who realizes li (emptiness) will be free of desires and negative affects, Neo-Confucians think someone who follows li will have the appropriate desires and affects. Another major difference from Buddhism is in how the obstacles to enlightenment are conceptualized. Neo-Confucians always discuss li in relation to qi, vital energy. If li refers to patterns of coherence, qi is the stuff in which those patterns inhere. This distinction has functional similarities with Aristotle’s distinction between form and matter, but the force of activity and change is with qi rather than li. That means that li cannot be externally imposed and must be immanent in qi in some sense. The precise ontological status of li and qi became one of the main metaphysical disputes among Confucian philosophers. One could easily claim that the distinction between patterns of coherence and the stuff that follows the patterns is more conceptual than ontological. That is close to the view seen in Zhang Zai, for whom qi is active and inherently patterned. For Zhu Xi and Wang Yangming, though, li has ontological priority over qi. Zhu Xi writes:

Fundamentally, li and vital energy cannot be spoken of as prior or posterior. But if we must trace their origin, we are obliged to say that li is prior. However, li is not a separate entity. It exists right in vital energy. Without vital energy, li would have nothing to adhere to. (modified from Chan 1969: 634)

The question of the relationship between qi and li extended into cosmogonies as well. While Zhang Zai took qi to be the ultimate, Zhu Xi claimed it was li (using the term Supreme Polarity). Since li is the locus of intelligibility and values, the question ultimately was whether causal and explanatory priority was with this coherence or if coherence was instead a product of the generative forces of nature (qi).

The distinction between li and qi provided a way to deal with the tension between the claim that the nature of human beings is good and the recognition that people need extensive self-cultivation in order to actually be good. Li is inherently good and is the same in all things, but the quality of qi varies. Turbid qi—which manifests itself as selfishness and partiality—obscures li. Thus from the perspective of li human nature is good, but from the perspective of li and qi together, a person can be good, bad, or in between. On the psychological level, the work of self-cultivation is cultivating tranquility and impartiality; on the metaphysical level, one purifies qi so as to more perfectly express li.

8. Conclusion: Beyond “Chinese Philosophy”

If one turns to metaphysics in the twentieth century and beyond, it becomes necessary to distinguish “Philosophy in China” from “Chinese Philosophy”. Like almost everywhere else in the world, the twentieth century in China was characterized by the incorporation of ideas from other cultures, most obviously from Europe. The terms “philosophy” and “metaphysics” were introduced as distinct concepts through translation and thus they become the objects of conscious reflection.[10] Even scholars dedicated to “Chinese Philosophy” set themselves in dialogue with the West, so that almost all philosophy was more or less comparative. The main influences from Europe were Kant, Hegel, and Marx, but a wide range of philosophers were incorporated, including Nietzsche, Bergson, Dewey, and Heidegger. Almost all of the major philosophers in China—from Xiong Shili 熊十力 (1885–1968) to Feng Youlan 馮友蘭 (1895–1990) to Mou Zongsan 牟宗三 (1909–1995)—were concerned with establishing a metaphysical foundation for Chinese Philosophy.[11] These philosophers, drawing on resources from multiple cultures and traditions, are better suited for an entry on “Metaphysics” than one on “Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy”.


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This entry benefitted greatly from detailed feedback given by Stephen C. Angle, Brook Ziporyn, Karyn Lai and Sor-hoon Tan, as well as from discussions with Chenyang Li.

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