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A chimera is an individual composed of cells with different embryonic origins. The successful isolation of five human embryonic stem cell (hESC) lines in 1998 increased scientists' ability to create human/non-human chimeras and prompted extensive bioethics discussion, resulting in what has been dubbed “the other stem cell debate” (Shreeve 2005). The debate about chimeras has focused on five main arguments. The Unnaturalness Argument explores the ethics of violating natural species boundaries. The Moral Confusion Argument alleges that the existence of entities that cannot be definitively classified as either human or non-human will cause moral confusion that will undermine valuable social and cultural practices. The Borderline-Personhood Argument focuses on great apes and concludes that their borderline-personhood confers a high enough degree of moral status to make most, if not all, chimeric research on them impermissible. The Human Dignity Argument claims that it is an affront to human dignity to give an individual “trapped” in the body of a non-human animal the capacities associated with human dignity. Finally, the Moral Status Framework maintains that research in which a non-human animal's moral status is enhanced to that of a normal adult human is impermissible unless reasonable assurances are in place that its new moral status will be respected, which is unlikely given the motivations for chimeric research and the oversight likely to be provided. These arguments provide different rationales for restricting chimeric research and have different implications for the range of chimeric research that will be deemed unethical.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Unnaturalness Argument
- 3. The Moral Confusion Argument
- 4. The Borderline-Personhood Argument
- 5. The Human Dignity Argument
- 6. The Moral Status Framework
- 7. Conclusion
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In classical Greek and Egyptian myth, chimeras are depicted as having parts with the morphological characteristics typical of different species. The chimera of Greek mythology, for example, has the head of a lion, the body of a goat, and the tail of a serpent. Not all chimeras are mythical, however. In fact, each one of us is most likely a chimera, according to the modern scientific definition of a chimera as a single organism composed of cells with different embryonic origins (Nagy and Rossant 2001). As we interact with other organisms over the years, their cells become incorporated into our bodies, not through a process of consumption and digestion, but through processes that leave the cells intact. For example, pregnant women acquire cells from their fetuses and mosquitoes transfer blood between their successive victims. More exotic natural chimeras occur when early-stage human embryos fuse in utero, resulting in a child with two distinct genotypes. Laboratory-created chimeras include the geep, an intraspecies chimera made by fusing a sheep embryo with a goat embryo or by transplanting cells from one embryo into another (Fehilly, Willadsen, and Tucker 1984; Polzin et al. 1987). Like the chimeras of myth, the geep exhibits morphological traits of multiple species, with wool on some parts of its body and hair on others. Researchers have also created quail/chick chimeras by transferring parts of the neural tube (the precursor of the central nervous system) from a quail embryo into a Leghorn embryo, resulting in the transfer of vocalizations typical of a quail into the Leghorn chick (Couly, Coltey, and Le Douarin 1992). Intraspecies mice/mice chimeras, the most common of the laboratory-created chimeras, are typically created by genetically engineering embryonic stem cells derived from one mouse embryo and inserting them into another mouse embryo at the blastocyst stage. The modified embryos are then implanted into surrogate mice and brought to term. If the gametes (sperm or eggs) of the resulting chimeric mice are descendants of the genetically engineered cells, then they can be bred with each other to produce nonchimeric offspring carrying the genetic alteration in all of their cells.
The early discussion of ethical issues raised by chimeras occurred under the heading of xenotransplantation, the use of non-human animals as a source of cells, tissues, or organs for transplantation into humans (Institute of Medicine 1996). The moral argument in favor of xenotransplantation was one of beneficence: the shortage of human organs available for transplant and the inadequacy of alternatives meant that if non-human animals could serve as a source of organs, hundreds of thousands of human lives could be saved or improved each year (ibid., 14). The main ethical problems included the health risks for the transplant recipient (e.g., a substantial risk of hyperacute rejection and graft-versus-host disease), traditional animal ethics issues, concerns about informed consent (complicated by empirical uncertainties and the possibility of legally mandated life-long health surveillance), fair allocation of health care resources, and the public health issue that xenotransplantation would allow viruses to jump the species barrier into humans.
For the purposes of this entry, however, the term “chimera” will be restricted to chimeras formed by the introduction of human pluripotent stem cells (hPSCs) or their more specialized derivatives into non-human animals. Pluripotent cells are capable of turning into any kind of tissue, and stem cells are capable of renewing themselves indefinitely. So hPSCs theoretically provide an indefinitely renewable source of any kind of human tissue, thus offering tremendous potential for basic research, drug development, and regenerative medicine (NIH 2001, 5–21). The first sources of hPSCs were human embryos, and are thus referred to as human embryonic stem cells (hESCs). These were established by James Thomson and colleagues at the University of Wisconsin, Madison, in 1998 (Thomson et al. 1998) and their availability has expanded the range of human/non-human chimeras that scientists are capable of making. For example:
The gold standard for ascertaining whether non-human cells are pluripotent involves injecting them into blastocyst-stage embryos. The resulting chimeras are then bred and the offspring examined to see if all of their cells are progeny of the inserted cells. If so, then the inserted cells were pluripotent. In the case of hESCs, such a procedure would involve the creation of human offspring as a means for testing cell potency, not an ethically viable procedure. Instead, the standard method for ascertaining whether putative hESCs are truly pluripotent is to inject them into postnatal, immune-deficient mice, and see whether they give rise to teratomas (tumors that consist of disorganized tissue growth of the three embryonic germ layers, endoderm, mesoderm, and ectoderm).
Su-Chun Zhang, a researcher at the University of Wisconsin, Madison, discovered how to direct undifferentiated hESCs into neural precursors. To begin exploring whether these cells could serve as a source of cells for possible nervous system repair, he transplanted them into neonatal mice. The cells “were incorporated into a variety of brain regions, where they differentiated into both neurons and astrocytes” (Zhang et al. 2001, 1129).
Undifferentiated hESCs have been transplanted into blastocyst-stage chick embryos to determine whether “the chick embryo could be used as an in vivo system for the study of human ES cell differentiation” (Goldstein et al. 2002, 80).
Transplants of hESCs into blastocyst-stage mouse embryos have been performed to see if the chimeras could provide “an accessible platform for studying the emergence of many human cell types; and with the expansion of available hESCs to include genetically diseased lines, mouse/human chimeras may allow us to elucidate the bases of disease by examining the behavior of such hESC lines in live animal models” (James et al. 2006, 100).
Chimera research inherits the ethical issues associated with traditional animal ethics and, when using hPSCs derived from embryos, with hESC research in general, but one striking feature of the chimera debate is the existence of several advisory bodies that exhibit a cautious reaction to certain kinds of chimeric research even though they maintain that non-human animal research and embryo research are generally permissible. For example, the Human Embryo Research Panel of the National Institutes of Health (NIH) issued a general endorsement of a wide range of embryo research, including hESC research and research on non-human animals. Nonetheless, the panel expressed concern about the “extensive mixing” that would occur in some chimera research and unanimously opposed, “on ethical and scientific grounds, the creation of heterologous, or human-nonhuman chimeras, with or without transfer [into a uterus]” (NIH 1994, 80). Similar statements have been made by the Ethics Advisory Board of Geron, the private biotechnology company that financed Thomson's original derivations (Geron Ethics Advisory Board 1999, 34), the University of Wisconsin's Biotechnology Advisory Committee, which provided guidance to UW on hESC research policy (University of Wisconsin Biotechnology Advisory Committee 2001), the Committee on Guidelines for Human Stem Cell Research created by the National Academies' Institute of Medicine and the National Research Council (National Academy of Sciences 2005), and the International Society for Stem Cell Research (International Society for Stem Cell Research 2006, 7). This suggests that chimera research raises some ethical concerns that are distinct from the traditional issues discussed about the use of non-human animals or human embryos in research.
The argument against chimeras most often discussed is the Unnaturalness Argument. It is also the argument against chimeras most often rejected. Taken in its most basic form, the Unnaturalness Argument alleges that because the creation of chimeras is unnatural it is therefore wrong. The source of the alleged unnaturalness lies in the fact that creating chimeras involves violating the natural species boundaries between humans and non-humans.
Some criticisms of the Unnaturalness Argument focus on the difficulties of defining “species.” As Jason Robert and Françoise Baylis (2003) note, although species can be defined in terms of reproductive isolation, genetic isolation, shared ancestry, or homeostatic property clusters, none of these definitions takes precedence over the others. Rather, “Biologists typically make do with a plurality of species concepts, invoking one or the other depending on the particular explanatory or investigative context” (Robert and Baylis 2003, 3).
Definitional difficulties, though, do not in and of themselves provide reasons for thinking that a concept is morally irrelevant. There are, after all, intractable disagreements about how to delineate many key concepts relevant to ethics, including: killing and letting die, life and death, consciousness, rationality, equality, justice, respect, rights, and goodness.
Other criticisms focus on the permeability and fluidity of the alleged “boundary” between species. Over long spans of time, species undergo fusion and fission and although wide-crosses (breeding between individuals of different species) are rare, they can occur without human intervention. Moreover, bacteria and viruses frequently transfer genes between organisms without any human intervention in a process called “horizontal gene transfer.”
This criticism is certainly probative against those who believe that the boundary between species is morally relevant because they hold a “biblical or Aristotelian view of species as fixed and immutable rather than being slices of a dynamic, ever-changing process” (Rollin 2003, 15), but the proponent of the Unnaturalness Argument need not hold such a view. For example, the groups constituting one's family and one's fellow citizens change over time, and yet we owe special duties to our compatriots and to our kin in virtue of our special relationships to them. So, fixed boundaries are not necessary for moral relevance. And the mere fact that bacteria naturally transfer genes across species boundaries does not mean that the activity is natural when it is performed by humans.
A better objection to the Unnaturalness Argument challenges the alleged link between unnaturalness and wrongfulness. Indeed, if crossing species boundaries is sufficient for unnaturalness, and if unnaturalness is sufficient for wrongfulness, then the creation of mules and all other cross-species hybrids, even hybrid lilies, would be wrong. On those definitions of “unnatural” that make human intervention sufficient for unnaturalness, the view that unnaturalness is sufficient for wrongfulness would entail the even more outlandish conclusion that everything humans do is wrong. If the Unnaturalness Argument is to be at all plausible, it must avoid such implications.
The alleged link between unnaturalness and wrongness can be supported in two ways, depending on whether the Unnaturalness Argument is intended to be a so-called intrinsic objection or an extrinsic objection. An intrinsic objection alleges that an act is wrong because of its intrinsic properties, whereas an extrinsic objection alleges that an act is wrong because of its consequences. A person who claims that it is unethical to feed a certain diet to an animal because the diet is unnatural is presumably making an extrinsic objection: because the diet is unnatural, it will not meet the nutritional requirements of the animal and therefore it will have unacceptable consequences for the animal's health. A person who claims that the unnaturalness of bestiality makes it unethical, even when it does not cause any harm or pain, is presumably making an intrinsic objection.
If the Unnaturalness Argument is intended to be an extrinsic objection, the link between unnaturalness and wrongness will most likely be supported by pointing to possible adverse consequences for the environment, public health, or the animal subject itself. Adverse environmental consequences have not received much discussion, probably because they are presumed to be adequately managed through standard guidelines and regulations regarding the use of animals in laboratory research. The possibility of a public health crisis arising from a transmissible infection crossing species boundaries, a significant concern with xenotransplantation, is greatly reduced when the source of the biological material is human and the recipient a non-human animal confined to a laboratory. (It should be noted, though, that transmission of a porcine virus to human cells in a human/porcine chimera has already been demonstrated (Ogle et al. 2004).) Adverse consequences for the animal are important to address, but their implications will depend on the moral status of the animal, an issue addressed by the Borderline-Personhood Argument. On any of these bases of support, the proponent of an extrinsic unnaturalness argument would not be committed to the conclusion that everything unnatural is unethical, since unnaturalness is not necessarily connected with these kinds of bad consequences, and even when it is connected with bad consequences, the act may be justified on other grounds.
The Unnaturalness Argument is more commonly interpreted as being an intrinsic objection. Even as an intrinsic objection, though, it still might take a direct or an indirect form. A person who thinks that promise-breaking is intrinsically wrong might think that promise-breaking itself is the wrong-making property, or they might believe that promise-breaking is intrinsically wrong because it is the betraying of an induced expectation (Scanlon 1998; Pratt, 2001), which itself is the wrong-making property. On the latter view, promise-breaking is still intrinsically wrong because the betraying of an induced expectation is not a consequence of a prior and distinct act of breaking a promise; rather, in those circumstances, the breaking of a promise is identical to the betraying of an induced expectation. The ontological relationship between the two acts is not analogous to that between pulling the trigger and a person's death but rather to that between pulling the trigger and firing the gun. Similarly, those who believe that it is wrong to create chimeras because doing so is unnatural might claim that the intrinsic wrongness of these acts stems directly from their unnaturalness or they might think that the link between unnaturalness and wrongness is mediated by another property. As John Stuart Mill observed, concerns about unnaturalness are, for many, derived from concerns about offense to God:
The consciousness that whatever man does to improve his condition is in so much a censure and a thwarting of the spontaneous order of Nature, has in all ages caused new and unprecedented attempts at improvement to be generally at first under a shade of religious suspicion; as being in any case uncomplimentary, and very probably offensive to the powerful beings (or, when polytheism gave place to monotheism, to the all-powerful Being) supposed to govern the various phenomena of the universe, and of whose will the course of nature was conceived to be the expression. (Mill 1958 , 14)
The content of God's will with regard to the manipulation of nature, though, is subject to speculation on both sides. Gary Comstock, for example, defends the use of recombinant DNA techniques against the objection that it constitutes playing God:
If humans are made in the divine image, and if God desires that we exercise the spark of divinity within us, then it should be no surprise that inquisitiveness in science is part of our nature. . .. It is unclear why the desire to investigate and manipulate the chemical bases of life should not be considered as much a manifestation of our God-like nature as the writing of poetry and the playing of sonatas should be. (Comstock 2000, 185)
No matter whether the proponent of an intrinsic unnaturalness argument believes that the link is direct or mediated, she will still not be committed to thinking that all unnatural acts are wrong. Even if the wrongness stems directly from the unnaturalness, this leaves open the possibility that something unnatural could be justified by sufficiently strong countervailing considerations, such as those provided by medical benefit or scientific knowledge. The same holds if the link is mediated, with the additional caveat that unnaturalness may not be invariably correlated with the actual wrong-making property. As Mill noted, the proponent of the Unnaturalness Argument need only object to attempts “to exercise power over nature beyond a certain degree and a certain admitted range” (1958 , 15, emphasis added). There is also the possibility that the moral relevance of properties, unnaturalness included, can vary from context to context (See Dancy 1993). In short, it could be true that creating chimeras is wrong because it is unnatural even though not everything unnatural is wrong.
Conceding that unnaturalness is not sufficient for wrongness, however, opens the proponent of the Unnaturalness Argument to a further challenge, that of providing principled grounds for distinguishing between those cases in which an act is wrong because it is unnatural and those cases in which an act is unnatural but not wrong, and of showing that creating chimeras falls into the former category. If the Unnaturalness Argument is intended as an extrinsic objection, there are several detailed frameworks available for addressing risks to public health, the environment, or the non-human animal research subject. Any extrinsic Unnaturalness Argument is free to apply those frameworks to chimeras, but will be incomplete until it actually does so. If the Unnaturalness Argument is intended as an intrinsic objection, then Paul Thompson's observation regarding intrinsic objections to the use of recombinant DNA techniques states the problem succinctly: “no one has succeeded in articulating a principled way of stating why the unnaturalness associated with the manipulation of DNA is unethical, while ordinary plant and animal breeding, computers and modern transport are not” (Thompson 2000, 9).
At this stage in the dialectic, the Unnaturalness Argument can be supplemented by considerations of the “yuck factor.” Proponents of the yuck factor argue that the reaction some people experience in contemplating certain acts sometimes suffices for knowing that the act is wrong, even in the absence of satisfactory justification for the reaction (Kass 1998, 687). So proponents of an intrinsic unnaturalness argument can insist that in spite of not being able to provide principled grounds for distinguishing between the two kinds of cases, they still know that creating chimeras is wrong. Again, this conclusion is potentially supported by the literature on moral particularism, which allows that a property's moral relevance can vary not only from context to context, but also in a way not capturable by a general theory (Dancy 1993).
Some have argued that the yuck factor has been discredited because it has been used to rationalize discrimination (Thompson 2000). Racists claimed to “know simply by looking” that interracial marriages were wrong. But the fact that an argument has been used inappropriately in some areas does not mean that it is inappropriate in other areas. Paternalistic arguments were used to rationalize unjust treatment of women and racial minorities, but that does not mean that they are inappropriate when applied to toddlers.
Even opponents of the yuck factor must concede that, sometimes, we know that an action is wrong merely on the basis of our reaction to it, even if we cannot satisfactorily justify that reaction. We know it is wrong to kill a healthy person so that his organs can be transplanted to save five lives, even though we presently lack any theoretically satisfactory way of distinguishing that case from the various trolley cases prominent in the killing/letting-die literature. (See Kamm (2006) for recent discussion.)
So appealing to the yuck factor can insulate an intrinsic Unnaturalness Argument from the most common objections. It does so, however, at significant cost. By conceding that unnaturalness is not sufficient for wrongfulness while failing to provide any positive argument for thinking that unnaturalness in the particular case of chimeras makes them wrong, the proponent of an intrinsic Unnaturalness Argument is reduced to the bald assertion that chimeras are wrong because they are unnatural. This fails to provide any reasons whatsoever to those who do not already share that view. The many people, then, who think that the unnaturalness of a chimera does not make it unethical to create them are in no way epistemically irresponsible in simply rejecting the argument out of hand. Moreover, the intrinsic Unnaturalness Argument differs from the killing/letting die example given above in a significant way: although it is true that we presently lack any theoretically satisfactory way of distinguishing between the organ transplantation case and the various trolley cases, we can nonetheless go a long way towards explaining why it is wrong to kill a healthy person so that their organs can be transplanted. We can talk about the harm of death, the frustration of future interests, the loss of valuable opportunities, the right not to be killed, and so on. But why think that the mere fact that an activity is unnatural makes it intrinsically wrong, or even provides any reason whatsoever for thinking so? It is hard to even begin to make the case, at least in secular terms. Although some maintain that certain patterns of inference from an “is” to an “ought” are valid (see Thomson 1990, 1–33, for discussion), inferring that something is even prima facie intrinsically wrong from the particular fact that it is not natural certainly seems fallacious. An intrinsic Unnaturalness Argument, therefore, is in a much weaker epistemic position than an argument for the conclusion that it is wrong to kill a healthy person for his or her organs.
In the first journal article focusing on the ethics of chimeras, Jason Scott Robert and Françoise Baylis (2003) puzzle over the negative reaction exhibited by the public to human/non-human chimeras. Some people think that the public's reaction is explained by a widely held belief in fixed and well-defined boundaries between species, or at least between the human species and non-human species, but in fact “no extant species concept justifies the erection of the fixed boundaries between human beings and nonhumans that are required to make breaching those boundaries morally problematic” (ibid., 6). Others think that what people find objectionable is that crossing species boundaries constitutes playing God, but many people do not believe in God and others believe that God not only licenses, but enjoins the kind of creative research involved in chimeras. Others think that people react to the prospect of chimeras with repugnance, but such reactions are not themselves sufficient grounds for concluding that an activity is immoral. Nor do people's beliefs in its being taboo to blur sharp and significant conceptual boundaries explain their negative reaction, because the conceptual boundary between humans and non-humans is not sharp.
So what does explain the public's negative reaction? Baylis and Robert speculate that people object to chimeras because they accept the Moral Confusion Argument, according to which it is wrong to create chimeras because of the moral confusion that would be generated by the existence of individuals that cannot be definitively classified as human or as non-human (ibid., 9). This moral confusion would arise because people employ two distinct frameworks for understanding moral status: if an individual is a human being, then it has full moral status, and it has that status independently of anyone else's attitudes or intentions regarding it, but if an individual is a non-human animal, then it does not have full moral status, and, further, the moral status it does have and the nature of the obligations we have towards it are contingent upon the attitudes and intentions of their human creators or overseers. For a borderline human/non-human chimera, it would not be clear which framework to employ and, consequently, it would not be clear what our moral obligations to this entity would be. Would it be appropriate to patent it, or would patenting it constitute slavery? Would it be appropriate to kill it for food, or would that be murder? Which set of biomedical research protections would apply, the relatively weak constraints on animal research or the comparatively strong constraints on human subjects research? Moreover, the existence of a borderline human/non-human chimera would generate confusion regarding our existing relationships as we were forced to revisit the general question of whether being a human being really is necessary and sufficient for full moral status. Such confusion, Robert and Baylis say, “threatens the social fabric in untold ways; countless social institutions, structures, and practices depend upon the moral distinction drawn between human and nonhuman animals” (ibid., 10). In these ways, then, “the creation of novel beings that are part human and part nonhuman is sufficiently threatening to the social order that for many this is sufficient reason to prohibit any crossing of species boundaries involving human beings” (ibid., 10).
There appears to be no empirical evidence to support the sociological claim that the Moral Confusion Argument explains the public's negative reaction. Among the voluminous social science research on public attitudes towards biotechnology, the U.S. Office of Technology Assessment's (OTA) report on public perceptions of biotechnology remains the most comprehensive study of its kind in many ways. It found that consequentialist concerns were cited by only a meager 1% (for environmental concerns) to 8% (for “unforeseen consequences”) of the respondents who believed that creating cross-species plants or animals was morally wrong (Office of Technology Assessment 1987). Concerns about playing God and tampering with nature were much more prevalent. And even if these concerns are unfounded, as Baylis and Robert contend, it is surely fallacious to conclude that they are not motivating the public's negative reaction. Conversely, even if the threat of moral confusion is a serious one, that does not alter the fact that it apparently did not even merit explicit mention by the OTA.
Setting aside the sociological claim that the public's acceptance of the Moral Confusion Argument explains its reaction to chimeras, what about the Moral Confusion Argument itself? (Robert and Baylis explicitly refuse to endorse or reject the argument, but they do invite bioethicists to begin assessing its moral weight.)
Claims that the social fabric will be threatened by the latest scientific research are usually vague and ill-defined enough so as to resist conclusive refutation, but two things seem clear about the Moral Confusion Argument. First, it seems highly unlikely that chimera research would cause significant confusion along the lines described. Second, even if chimeras were to cause confusion, that would not provide much, if any, moral reason against creating them.
As to the first point, chimeras that are truly difficult to definitively classify as human or non-human are purely hypothetical. Even the chimeras involving the most extensive mixing to date (Goldstein et al. 2002; Muotri et al. 2005; James et al. 2006) resulted only in individuals easily classified as non-human animals. Such easily categorized individuals pose no more threat to our views about moral status than does a human being with a pig heart valve, that is, no threat whatsoever. Hence, the idea that such confusion is threatened by “any crossing of species boundaries involving human beings” (Robert and Baylis 2003, 10; emphasis added) is surely mistaken. And even if researchers were to create chimeras that were truly on the border between human and non-human, it still would not follow that there would be significant confusion as to the proper moral framework for their treatment. If the chimeras were clearly persons (by exhibiting a high degree of autonomy, rationality, self-awareness, etc.), then it would be clear to most people that they have full moral status, even if it would not be clear what species they were. As Andrew Siegel (2003, 33) notes, most people hold the belief that “species doesn't matter where one possesses other traits that confer moral standing.” Those who do mistakenly believe that being a human being is necessary for full moral status might simply correct their mistaken belief when confronted with an actual example of a non-human or borderline-human that was clearly a person. Only the remaining people who retain that belief would be confused.
Potentially more confusing would be an individual that was clearly a non-person but who had just enough human material that they could not be definitively classified as human or as non-human; for example, a blastocyst-stage chimpanzee embryo which has had half of its inner cell mass replaced with hESCs. But even in this extreme case, those who believe that a fully-human conceptus has no moral status prior to the onset of consciousness will simply conclude that a blastocyst-stage chimeric conceptus has no moral status either. Those who believe that a fully human conceptus has full moral status from conception would need to decide how to classify such a chimera and may be confused by the situation. But it is unclear why Robert and Baylis think that someone's being confused about the specific case of the chimera would also make them revisit their general belief that being a human being is sufficient for full moral status. If the clear lack of personhood of a human embryo or fetus does not cause such people to revisit the general issue, why would the clear lack of personhood of a chimeric embryo, which would seem to have even less going for it from this perspective, cause them to revisit it? Indeed, it is not clear why borderline cases would pose any challenge to a general belief about necessary and sufficient conditions. Someone who believes that being a male sibling is necessary and sufficient for being a brother will not be led to doubt that biconditional by the existence of an intersex person who is on the border between being male and being female. To the extent that it is vague whether the individual is male, it is also vague whether the individual is a brother.
So confusion would really only arise for certain subgroups of people with specific beliefs and with respect to chimeras that are, at the present time, purely hypothetical. And there seems to be no reason to think that confusion about these specific cases of chimeras would cause society generally to revisit the issue of whether being a human being is necessary and sufficient for full moral status.
As to the second point, even supposing that chimeric research did cause society to revisit its views about the comparative moral worth of humans and nonhumans, it still remains that this would provide little reason not to create chimeras. Indeed, it seems more plausible that this would provide, on balance, a reason to create them. Our willingness to place the gustatory interests of humans ahead of the interests of non-human animals in avoiding pain, suffering, and death has been one of the greatest causes of unnecessary suffering in history (Scully 2002). In the United States alone, there are approximately 9.5 billion agricultural animals slaughtered each year, even though a vegetarian diet could easily satisfy most Americans' nutritional needs (Humane Society of the United States 2009). (This count excludes marine animals, which could easily triple the total, and for whom death inevitably comes from either suffocation or being crushed.) To prevent scientific research on the grounds that it would force people to reexamine our views about moral status would be to prevent not only scientific progress but urgently needed moral progress as well.
Most groups that have issued an opinion on chimeras acknowledge the existence of traditional animal ethics issues, but are content to assert without argument that the use of non-human animals in chimeric research is justified because of its scientific and, ultimately, clinical importance. On the one hand, this attitude seriously underestimates the difficulties, abundantly articulated in the animal ethics literature, of justifying the use of non-human animals along these lines without either (a) implying false and morally odious conclusions about research on cognitively disabled humans or (b) taking an uncharitable view of the cognitive capacities of non-human animals that is inconsistent with current research on animal psychology. On the other hand, this attitude probably reflects a realistic assessment of the limited willingness of these groups' audiences (primarily scientists and research oversight bodies) to seriously consider the possibility that most animal research is ethically unjustifiable. The one person who has applied traditional animal ethics research to the subject of chimeras is David DeGrazia, who has argued that the psychological characteristics of great apes (chimpanzees, bonobos, gorillas, and orangutans) makes them “borderline persons.” Borderline persons have full, or near-full moral status, which makes it unethical to use borderline persons in what DeGrazia calls “neural chimeric research,” research intended to lead to the growth of human neurons in the subjects' brains (DeGrazia 2007, 325).
What is it to be a person? Being a human being (viz., being a member of the species Homo sapiens) is neither necessary nor sufficient for being a person: newborns are human beings but are not yet persons, and members of other advanced, now-extinct hominid species were persons but were not human beings. Rather, DeGrazia says, to be a person is to have the capacity for sufficiently complex forms of consciousness (ibid., 319). More specifically, albeit still vaguely, to be a person is to have “enough” of the following properties to a “high enough” degree: autonomy, rationality, self-awareness, linguistic competence, sociability, moral agency, and intentionality in action (ibid., 320).
Great apes deliberate, plan, and reason, thus displaying rationality and the capacity for intentional action. They exhibit bodily self-awareness, as evidenced through imitations of bodily gestures and their reactions to mirrors. They also exhibit social self-awareness, as evidenced by their knowledge of their position within their group's social hierarchies. Their social self-awareness also, ipso facto, demonstrates their sociability, which is also implied by the cultural transmission of accumulated knowledge in primate communities. The existence of a limited degree of moral agency is also supported by apparently altruistic actions for which no conditioning or instinctual explanation seems plausible.
Although great apes exhibit such forms of consciousness, DeGrazia also notes that primarily because of their lack of linguistic competence (itself important to personhood and also relevant because it limits the cognitive capacities available), non-linguistically trained great apes “are not so well endowed with [personhood-relevant] traits that they clearly qualify as persons” (ibid., 321). They do not even fare well compared to normal human children, who “are clearly capable of introspective awareness …, robustly competent in language, and more likely to show signs of autonomy” (ibid., 322). Despite his use of the adverb “clearly” which suggests that this is an epistemic claim, the conclusion is metaphysical: “It's not that we don't know enough about them to say whether they are persons. Rather, they exist in the gray area between paradigm persons and the vast majority of animals who definitely are not persons” (ibid., 322).
So what moral status do borderline persons have? On some views, moral status is a binary property; an individual either has moral status or it does not. Given that all sentient animals have at least some moral status, it would follow on such a view that all sentient animals have full moral status. A fortiori, borderline persons, being sentient, would have full moral status.
On other views, moral status comes in degrees and while paradigmatic persons (individuals that fully satisfy the criteria for personhood) have full moral status, merely sentient animals (animals that are sentient but that are clearly not persons) have a lower degree of moral status. DeGrazia distinguishes between two views of what such a difference in moral status consists in, the Unequal Consideration Model and the Unequal Interests Model. On the Unequal Consideration Model, this difference consists in its being the case that the interests of paradigmatic persons matter more, in and of themselves, than the equal interests of merely sentient animals. For example, causing a harm of a certain magnitude to a paradigmatic person is morally worse than causing a harm of the same magnitude to a merely sentient animal, even setting aside the fact that the harm to the paradigmatic person might well cause additional negative effects not caused by inflicting the same harm on a merely sentient animal (Harman 2003).
According to the Unequal Interests Model, the difference in moral status between paradigmatic persons and merely sentient animals consists in the fact that paradigmatic person have interests of significantly greater weight than the interests of merely sentient animals. These weightier interests mean that killing a paradigmatic person and thereby frustrating those interests will generally be morally worse in and of itself than killing a merely sentient animal. Moreover, harms that appear comparable at first glance, say, causing a certain kind of injury, are generally morally worse in and of themselves, when inflicted upon a paradigmatic person than on a merely sentient animal. This is because the same kind of injury is likely to impair the interests of the paradigmatic person more severely than it would the interests of a merely sentient animal.
It should be noted that the Unequal Consideration Model is compatible with assigning moral significance to the difference in interests cited by the Unequal Interest Model. A proponent of the Unequal Consideration Model could, for example, agree that being confined in a cage generally causes a much greater harm to a paradigmatic person than to a merely sentient animal. Differences between the two frameworks arise when the harms to the interests of the individuals are not merely similarly describable (e.g., “being confined”), but are in fact of equal magnitude: the Unequal Interests Model is committed to the conclusion that such harms are equally morally problematic in and of themselves while the Unequal Consideration Model is compatible with the conclusion that the harm to the paradigmatic person is more morally problematic in and of itself than the equal harm to the merely sentient animal.
According to these two models, what moral status do borderline persons have? DeGrazia's argument continues: personhood-relevant properties come in degrees, and so on the Unequal Consideration Model, it is plausible to say that the amount of consideration an individual is due is proportional to its “cognitive, emotional, and social complexity” (DeGrazia 2007, 323). Depending on how fine-grained the account is, borderline persons would therefore either have the same moral status as a paradigmatic person (viz., full moral status) or, at most, be due only slightly less consideration than paradigmatic persons.
According to the Unequal Interest Model, the difference between paradigmatic persons and borderline persons consists in their different interests. But, here again, DeGrazia maintains, the differences between paradigmatic persons and borderline persons are relatively slight, and so on this account of moral status, borderline persons will either have full moral status or, at most, have a moral status very near full moral status.
On any reasonable view of moral status, then, there will not be a large difference between the consideration due a borderline person and the consideration due a paradigmatic person, and a borderline person should therefore be viewed as analogous to a child: “not as substantially autonomous or as having full-fledged moral agency but as deserving moral protections of full strength” (ibid., 323).
Such an individual, with full or near-full moral status, should not be used in research unless (a) the research is more or less compatible with the individual's best interests, (b) poses no more than minimal risk, except where greater risks are justified by therapeutic potential to the individual, and (c) the individual has not meaningfully dissented, unless participation is of pressing therapeutic urgency for the individual (ibid., 323). But neural chimeric research does not come close to satisfying those standards. The research is more than minimal risk, is not intended for any therapeutic benefit for the animal, and at this experimental stage, could not reasonably be intended as such. To take an extreme, albeit hypothetical, example, the idea of a human/chimp neural chimera in which the human and chimp traits are thoroughly mixed is a chilling one. All great apes are social creatures, and such an individual might well be rejected by both species, evoking the tragic plight of Frankenstein's monster. DeGrazia's argument, however, does not only apply to such science fiction scenarios. Although he does not draw this conclusion, if great apes have full or near-full moral status, then it is probably impermissible to use them in any kind of chimeric research in which scientists are currently interested.
Defenders of research on non-human animals typically object that arguments against such research are overbroad. Where a defender of animal research would locate the main problem with the Borderline-Personhood Argument depends on whether moral status is a binary property or whether it admits of degrees. If moral status is a binary property, then, given that even merely sentient animals have some moral status, it follows that even merely sentient animals have full moral status. The Borderline-Personhood Argument then implies that any research on any sentient animal is subject to conditions (a)–(c). Given that all vertebrates are sentient, this would prohibit the use of any vertebrates, even guppies, in any non-therapeutic research that was more than minimal risk, irrespective of how large the benefit for other individuals might be. Although some animal rights theorists would accept this conclusion, defenders of animal research will take it as a reductio of the Borderline-Person Argument, maintaining that if full moral status really is as ubiquitous as that, then DeGrazia's claim about the research protections owed individuals with full or near-full moral status is overly strict.
If moral status admits of degrees, then the defender of animal research would locate the main problem with the Borderline-Personhood Argument in its claim that there are only slight differences in personhood-relevant properties between borderline persons and paradigmatic persons. In fact, the differences between even a language-trained chimpanzee and a normal adult human are quite large. As DeGrazia himself argues elsewhere, for example, only normal adult humans are capable of what he calls “full-fledged moral agency” (1996, 199–210). Now, the Borderline-Personhood Argument only requires that borderline personhood be sufficient, not necessary, for full or near-full moral status, but both the Unequal Consideration Model and the Unequal Interests Model quite generally relate moral status to personhood-relevant properties. The question therefore arises as to why these vast differences in personhood-relevant properties do not underwrite a large difference in moral status and a concomitant difference in the research protections owed to individuals of the two groups.
DeGrazia could respond that, were they to do so, it would follow that human borderline persons (he gives the example of an 18 month toddler) would also have significantly reduced moral status, which is false (ibid., 322). But there are two problems with this reply. First, it begs the question of why, on his view, there isn't a large difference in moral status between human borderline persons and human paradigmatic persons. The fact that large variations in personhood-relevant properties do not seem to affect the moral status of humans might support a very coarse-grained or threshold view of moral status, but it might instead indicate that personhood-relevant properties are not as central to moral status as the Unequal Consideration Model and the Unequal Interest Model posit (Kittay 2005). Second, if, as this response presupposes, the lack of personhood-relevant properties of a non-human reduces its moral status only if the same lack of personhood-relevant properties would reduce to the same degree the moral status of a human, then the range of non-humans with full or near-full moral status is much larger than DeGrazia seems willing to concede. After all, despite the near complete absence of personhood-relevant properties of a healthy but premature infant or an elderly person in the late stages of dementia, such individuals have full or near-full moral status and are owed significant protections against being harmed in research (even though their cognitive capacities might affect what kinds of treatments are harms). Extending full or near-full moral status to all non-humans who satisfied such a minimal threshold would have implications comparable to those of the view that moral status is a binary property, and defenders of animal research would find them equally implausible.
Although an evaluation of chimeric research in terms of human dignity was first put forward by Josephine Johnston and Christopher Eliot (2003), since then Philip Karpowicz, Cynthia Cohen, and Derek van der Kooy (2004, 2005, Cohen 2007) have been the main proponents of this view, and I will follow them here.
An approach to chimeric research in terms of human dignity needs to provide an account of (a) what human dignity is, (b) what kinds of individuals have human dignity, (c) what moral implications human dignity has, in terms of generating moral prohibitions, requirements, or presumptions, and (d) what constraints those moral implications place on chimeric research.
Human dignity is a kind of “unconditioned and incomparable worth” (Karpowicz et al. 2005, 119) and individuals with dignity are therefore “uniquely valuable and worthy of respect” (ibid., 120). Human dignity, understood in this rarefied way, is distinct from the common kind of dignity manifested by someone who responds to difficult circumstances in a dignified manner. Although a person can be stripped of this common kind of dignity by being placed in degrading circumstances such treatment would be said to violate, not eliminate or diminish, human dignity in the rarefied sense; thus the two concepts are distinct. Indeed, the individual's dignity in the rarefied sense is often alleged to explain what is problematic about eliminating this common kind of dignity.
Human dignity is grounded in the possession of certain morally valuable cognitive and emotive capacities, and it is because these capacities are valuable that individuals with human dignity are themselves valuable. Accounts of which capacities are relevant vary, but typically include the following: reasoning, autonomous choice, complex communication, participation in social relations, sympathy, and empathy. Those who possess such dignity-grounding capacities have human dignity.
What kind of moral implications does human dignity have? Although it is common to invoke human dignity in condemning a wide range of nefarious and odious practices, proponents of human dignity are notoriously vague both on the general principles generated by human dignity and on how those principles tell against the activities in question (Macklin 2003). Part of the vagueness lies in the fact that proponents of human dignity frequently use language that implies that human dignity itself is the subject of the wrong (e.g.: “torture undermines human dignity”, “human cloning denigrates human dignity”), but if we instead understand such language as shorthand for saying that an individual with human dignity is wronged, and is wronged in a way relating to that individual's dignity-grounding capacities, then the following moral implications seem plausible. If an individual with human dignity is uniquely valuable and worthy of respect because she possesses morally valuable dignity-grounding capacities, then there would be a presumption against interfering with the development, maintenance, or exercise of her dignity-grounding capacities. More strongly, there might even be a positive duty to support the development, maintenance, and exercise of her dignity-grounding capacities. The proponent of human dignity is also likely to hold that dignity-grounding capacities and the individuals that possess them have a kind of moral value not susceptible to utilitarian or, more broadly, consequentialist trade-offs. Hence, these presumptions will not be rebuttable merely by appeals to increased utility or value. This does not, of course, commit the proponent of human dignity to the claim that the presumptions are absolute, but it does mean that the presumptions will probably correspond to rights with a relatively high degree of stringency.
How, then, do considerations of human dignity give rise to an objection to certain kinds of chimeric research? Karpowicz et al. say the following:
By giving nonhumans some of the physical components necessary for development of the capacities associated with human dignity, and encasing these components in a nonhuman body where they would either not be able to function at all or function only to a highly diminished degree, those who would create human-nonhuman chimeras would denigrate human dignity. The torturer or the enslaver of human beings denies them the option of exercising the capacities associated with human dignity. The creator of the human-nonhuman chimera would do even worse—he or she knowingly would diminish or eliminate the very capacities associated with human dignity. (ibid., 120–121)
So, human dignity generates not only a moral prohibition on denying people with human dignity the option of exercising the capacities associated with human dignity, it also generates a moral prohibition on diminishing or eliminating those capacities themselves. Chimeric research, especially the introduction of an undissociated mass of human stem cells into an animal blastocyst-stage embryo (ibid., 126), has the potential to run afoul of this second moral prohibition because such a transplant raises the possibility of conferring upon an individual some of the physical components necessary (presumably, biologically necessary) for the development of dignity-grounding capacities, but without enabling the individual to significantly exercise those capacities. Such research, Karpowicz et al., maintain, therefore diminishes or eliminates those capacities, and is therefore unethical. As an admittedly fantastical example of research that would run afoul of the prohibition, Karpowicz et al. consider transplanting an entire human brain into a nonhuman primate: “the decision to manufacture a nonhuman research subject with a human brain and, at most, diminished capacities for various forms of human-like cognition and action would violate human dignity” (ibid., 123).
There are two main problems with the Human Dignity Argument.
To see the first problem, notice that despite the terminology of human dignity, whether some non-human animals have the capacities that ground human dignity and whether some humans lack the capacities that ground human dignity are empirical questions. As to the former, Karpowicz et al. maintain that “[t]he family of capacities associated with human dignity seem to belong uniquely to human beings” (ibid., 122); as to the latter, they maintain that “those who are human and yet display a limited subset of these capacities, say, the newborn infant or the person with severe disabilities, still have human dignity” (ibid., 121). These answers are inconsistent. If the dignity-grounding capacities of a human infant are sufficient to give it human dignity, then the many non-human animals with the same or greater degree of dignity-grounding capacities have human dignity as well. Alternatively, if a chimpanzee's lack of dignity-grounding capacities is sufficient to imply that it does not have human dignity, then the even more meager dignity-grounding capacities of a human infant are also sufficient to imply that it does not have human dignity.
It is worth noting that this objection does not presuppose any particular amount of dignity-grounding capacities as being necessary or sufficient for human dignity. Given the fact that some non-human animals possess the kind of cognitive and emotive capacities cited by Karpowicz et al. to a greater degree than some humans, it cannot be the case that (a) those capacities determine whether an individual has human dignity, (b) that all humans have human dignity, and (c) that no non-human has human dignity. This is true no matter how strict or lenient one wishes to be regarding how many of the dignity-grounding capacities an individual must possess to have human dignity.
The second problem for the Human Dignity Argument lies in its claim that dignity-grounding capacities have been diminished or eliminated whenever (a) we give an individual some of the physical components biologically necessary for the development of dignity-grounding capacities and (b) we do not give it significant opportunity to exercise those capacities. Consider that having adequate blood pressure is a physical component biologically necessary for dignity-grounding capacities. Stitching a wound on a mouse so that it regains adequate blood pressure, then, counts as giving it some of the physical components biologically necessary for the dignity-grounding capacities, but it fails to provide the mouse with a body sufficient for the significant exercise of those capacities. It is clearly false to maintain that such a medical procedure diminishes or eliminates those capacities or, more generally, that such a procedure violates human dignity in any way. Or, consider again DeGrazia's views about the capacities of great apes. If he is right about those capacities, whenever we provide for the biological needs of a great ape while failing to provide them with intensive linguistic training, then we provide them components necessary for dignity-grounding capacities without the opportunity for exercising them. It is implausible that such an activity is unethical, as implied by the Human Dignity Argument, but even if it were, considerations of human dignity seem irrelevant here.
Later, Karpowicz et al. mention not the physical components “necessary” for the dignity-grounding capacities, but rather those “especially associated” or “closely connected” with the dignity-grounding capacities. This suggests that the physical capacities at issue are those sufficient for the possession of the dignity-grounding capacities. But research that confers the physical capacities sufficient for the possession of the dignity-grounding capacities ipso facto confers the dignity-grounding capacities themselves, in which case the research has not diminished or eliminated the dignity-grounding capacities of the animal research subject. Quite the opposite, the research secured those capacities for the subject. More generally, the proponents of the human dignity argument face a dilemma that limits their argument's relevance. On the one hand, if the introduction of human stem cells into a non-human conferred dignity-grounding capacities onto an animal that would otherwise not have them, then the charge that such research diminishes or eliminates those capacities is false. On the other hand, if the introduction does not confer dignity-grounding capacities onto an animal that would otherwise not have them, then the charge that such research diminishes or eliminates those capacities is also false, as the capacities were never there to begin with.
Considerations of human dignity would ground an objection to research in which the subject possesses the dignity-grounding capacities at the start of the research, but then has them eliminated or diminished during the course of the research. Such research would certainly be objectionable, but, first, this cannot be the objection that Karpowicz et al. have in mind since they believe that non-humans do not have human dignity, and, second, it is difficult to see why the language of human dignity, rather than the language of traditional animal ethics or of autonomy and interests more generally, provides the most perspicuous way to articulate the objection (Macklin 2003, DeGrazia 2007).
According to the Moral Status Framework (Streiffer 2005), what is distinctively problematic about chimera research is the possibility that the introduction of human material would enhance an animal's moral status without respecting the moral obligations entailed by that status. That is, it might cause an animal, which would have had a comparatively low moral status, to instead have the moral status of a normal human adult, viz., full moral status, while continuing to treat the individual in ways that are wrong, given its new moral status.
The Moral Status Framework raises two general questions about chimeric research. First, under what circumstances is it permissible to perform research in which an animal's moral status is enhanced? (If animals already have the same moral status as a normal human adult, then the Moral Status Framework becomes otiose, except as a possible sociological explanation of why some people who believe that animals normally have a significantly lower moral status than humans might object to some kinds of chimeric research.) Second, under what circumstances would the introduction of human material actually enhance an animal's moral status?
The moral permissibility of research in which an animal's moral status is enhanced can be evaluated both from the perspective of the research subject and from the perspective of others. From the perspective of the subject, there would seem to be the following main possibilities. First, an enhancement in moral status might always be an unequivocal good. Any deleterious effects an enhancement might have on other factors that are relevant from the subject's perspective are always outweighed by the enhancement itself. This can be labeled the Millian View, since it echoes Mill's remark that it is better to be Socrates unsatisfied than a pig satisfied.
Second, there is the opposite of the Millian View, the No-Enhancing View, which holds that conferring an enhanced moral status on an individual is always objectionable from the individual's perspective.
Intermediate between these extreme views are various Instrumentalist Views, according to which the evaluation of an enhancement from the individual's perspective depends (at least in large part) on how the individual's life compares, in terms of other independently relevant factors, to the life that it either would have had (the Instrumentalist View with the Non-Moral Baseline) or to the life to which it is entitled, given its enhanced moral status (the Instrumentalist View with the Moral Baseline). The two Instrumentalist Views disagree on the evaluation of research in which an enhanced individual's life is better than it would have been had its status not been enhanced, but given its new moral status, it deserves to have its life be even better.
Both of the extreme views are implausible. Imagine conferring an enhanced moral status on an individual, and then ensuring that it lives a life in which it receives much better treatment than it would have gotten otherwise and in which it is given everything it is owed in virtue of that enhanced moral status. It is hard to see how this outcome could be objectionable from the individual's perspective, as implied by the No-Enhancing View. Nor does such research seem objectionable from the perspective of others. It might be objected, for example, that bringing new individuals into existence that have the (previously) distinctive moral status of normal human adults somehow lessens the value of that status for extant humans, as expanding membership in an exclusive club might lessen its value to its already existing members. That objection, however, is belied by the fact that every time people reproduce, they engage in just such an activity, and they produce far more individuals with human moral status than would ever be produced by chimeric research. Another objection might be that the extension of human moral status to “lesser animals” somehow diminishes the value of that status for humans, as extending a university diploma to those who do not deserve it lessens the value of that diploma for those who do. If, however, a transplant truly has enhanced the moral status of the chimeric research subject, then in whatever sense we humans “deserve” our special status, it now does as well, and so the value placed on human moral status will not be lessened.
The Millian View is also implausible: what kind of life an individual with an enhanced status will lead surely matters. My life is better than the life of even a very satisfied pig, but if my life were filled with enough pain and misery, and with extremely limited prospects, it arguably would be worse. Indeed, the Millian view is even too extreme for Mill, who agrees that some people's lives are filled with “unhappiness so extreme” that they would be better off exchanging “their lot for almost any other, however undesirable in their own eyes” (1979 , 9).
This leaves the Instrumentalist Views. If one of the Instrumentalist Views is correct, then the question arises as to whether the moral baseline or the non-moral baseline is relevant. To decide between these two options, consider an example from the literature on exploitation in which a transaction provides someone with a benefit, but with far less benefit than they deserve: an employer who pays an employee a wage that is beneficial compared to the alternatives, but is still substantially less than what justice requires. In such cases, the relevant baseline for the evaluation of the work is the moral baseline: given that the employee deserves more, it is no defense of the employer's behavior to say that the employee is better off than he would have been without the job (see Wertheimer (1996, 289–291) for extended discussion of the analogous case of an exploitative marriage). Similarly, the relevant question for evaluating status-enhancing research is surely whether the subject's new entitlements are respected.
Because the relevant baseline is the moral baseline, research in which a non-human animal's moral status is enhanced to that of a normal human adult raises the following problem. The view institutionalized by animal research oversight committees is that almost any valid research objective justifies sacrificing even the most fundamental interests of non-human animals (Francione 1995). In contrast, the view institutionalized by human subjects research oversight committees is that humans have a moral status which provides them with substantial moral protections, including a very stringent prohibition on harmful research without informed consent. So long as experiments that involve the transplantation of human stem cells into non-human animals are overseen by animal research oversight committees, or by human subjects committees attentive only to concerns of those who provided the gametes or embryos from which the stem cells were derived, the wrong set of moral protections is likely to be afforded to status-enhanced chimeric research subjects. If the relevant baseline were the non-moral baseline, then transplants that enhanced moral status probably would be no more problematic than other kinds of biomedical research on animals. But because the relevant baseline is the moral baseline, sacrificing the fundamental interests of the chimeric research subject as they would have been sacrificed in any other animal research is the moral equivalent of sacrificing the fundamental interests of a fully functional adult human being. In status-enhancing research, what would have been animal confinement, pain, suffering, and death, becomes the moral equivalent of—and, on an anthropocentric view, also becomes—human confinement, pain, suffering, and death. On all but the most extreme animal rights views, this makes status-enhancing chimeric research much worse than other biomedical research on animals, and on any plausible view, makes it absolutely unacceptable.
Alternatively, if researchers adequately respected the chimeric research subject's newly enhanced status, then this objection would not apply to the research. It is highly unlikely, though, that researchers would would be willing to adequately respect the subject's newly enhanced moral status since most biomedical research on non-human animals is done on non-humans precisely because it involves procedures that plainly would be unethical if performed on individuals with the moral status of a normal human adult. And even if the researchers were willing to try to respect the subject's newly enhanced status, it is hard to imagine that they could come close to succeeding: what kind of life are they proposing to provide for this individual they have created and who is now under their care? At any rate, even if the research procedures in question were compatible with the protections due to an individual with the moral status of a normal human adult, another objection would then apply. Regular, non-chimeric humans provide a better model in which to learn about human development and in which to test possible therapies intended for human beings. Thus, it would be scientifically preferable to perform the research procedures on regular human beings rather than on chimeras. To insist on performing such research on enhanced human/non-human chimeras, then, would be scientifically unjustified and would arguably constitute unethical exploitation of the chimera for the benefit of others.
If almost any status-enhancing research would be unethical, then it is important to know what kinds of transplants could enhance an animal's moral status. Progress on this question can be made by asking why normal adult humans possess their comparatively high moral status. On cognitive capacity views of moral status, an individual's cognitive capacities give it its moral status, and the high-level cognitive capacities that normal human adults have is what gives them their relatively high moral status (VanDeVeer 1979). Given that high-level cognitive capacities are intimately related to the individual's neural tissue, this view obviously justifies focusing on transplants that could affect neural tissue in a way that enhances cognitive capacities. However, there are many constraints on the ability of human stem cells to significantly enhance an animal's cognitive capacities. In some cases, the subject will be terminated before the development of the relevant cognitive capacities, thus side-stepping the entire problem. In many cases, cognitive enhancements would likely be prevented by the animal's smaller skull size and shorter gestation period, as well as by the surrounding non-human cellular environment that would provide developmental cues to transplanted cells (Karpowicz et al. 2005, 124–126). For the kinds of research currently underway, this conclusion seems very plausible, but there are a few caveats that should be noted.
First, some researchers might be interested in designing experiments that intentionally seek to overcome existing limitations on cognitive development in non-human animals. Some might want to do basic research on the neurological development involved in language acquisition, mathematical concept acquisition, moral development, or any number of other cognitive capacities that are now limited to normally functioning human beings. As a science-fiction example to illustrate the worst-case scenario, Norm Fost considers a goat whose brain has been so enhanced that it feels like a human trapped in a goat's body, raising what he calls the “Help, let me out of here” fear (2006, 17). Other researchers might be interested in creating chimeras in which the limitations on animal's cognition are overcome so that they can be used as models to study diseases or injuries that impair high-level cognitive functions in humans. As noted by the NAS Committee,
[T]he idea that human neuronal cells might participate in “higher-order” brain functions in a nonhuman animal, however unlikely that may be, raises concerns that need to be considered. Indeed, if such cells are to be used in therapeutic interventions, one needs to know whether they could participate in that way in the context of a treatment. (NAS 2005, 33)
Status-enhancing research performed for such ends, were it ever to become more than science fiction, would be deemed impermissible by the Moral Status Framework.
Second, it is not yet clear what kinds of cognitive enhancements might be possible even within a constrained environment. For example, it is possible to use genetic engineering to enhance the learning and memory of mice without modifying skull size or gestational period (Tang et al. 1999). Moreover, if large quantities of hESCs are introduced during the early stages of embryonic development, it is possible that the cells themselves could induce changes that would eliminate some of the constraints mentioned above. Although some of the experiments cited above do involve the introduction of hES and neural progenitor cells early in development, experience in this area is limited. As the NAS Committee concluded,
This approach [the introduction of human ES cells into a non-human blastocyst] is an obvious extension of techniques widely used in research with [mouse ES] cells—namely, aggregation of morulas from two mice or injection of mES cells into mouse blastocysts. In both cases, the cells can contribute extensively to any mouse that arises from implantation of such a chimeric blastocyst. Clearly, an animal (e.g., mouse) blastocyst into which human cells are transplanted raises other issues because potentially the inner cell mass, the progenitor of the fetus, would consist of a mixture of human and mouse cells. It is not now possible to predict the extent of human contribution to such chimeras. (NAS 2005, 34; for further discussion see Streiffer (2005, 355–357, 363–364).)
It therefore seems premature to place much confidence in our ability to draw a precise line between transplants during the embryonic stages of development that will, and those that will not, enhance an animal's cognitive capacities. Moreover, even among those who favor a cognitive-capacities view of moral status, it is contentious just what level of cognitive capacities is needed to attain full moral status.
On anthropocentric views of moral status, normal human adults have the moral status they do simply because they are human beings, that is, because they are members of the species Homo sapiens (Noonan 1970; Devine 1978; Schwarz 1990). As has often been noted, anthropocentric views seem to suffer from an explanatory gap: it is hard to see how being a member of a certain species could give an individual its moral status (Regan 1978; Feinberg 1980; DeGrazia 1996, 56–61). Nonetheless proponents of these views argue that they provide the only way to adequately explain the equal moral status of all human beings, even human beings who lack high-level cognitive capacities, and thereby to avoid the so-called “marginal cases” that afflict cognitive capacity views.
Anthropocentric views raise difficult questions about how much human material an individual needs in order to be a human being. Since normal human embryos are both human and organisms, they are human beings, albeit ones at the earliest stages of development (Feinberg 1980, 288–291). But when faced with an organism that has some human cells and some non-human cells, how is one to decide whether the organism is human, and hence, whether it is a human being? It is overly narrow to focus on transplants that affect neural tissue, since it is not plausible to suppose that an individual must have a human brain to be a human being: an anencephalic infant is a human being and would possess human moral status on an anthropocentric view. Presumably, replacing the entire inner cell mass of an animal blastocyst with hESCs would suffice to make the resulting individual a human being since, in normal human development, the inner cell mass is what goes on to form the fetus. In such cases, one could, at least in principle, end up with a human being surrounded by a non-human trophectoderm (the layer of cells surrounding the embryo which goes on to form the placental structures). If an anthropocentric view of moral status is correct then the Moral Status Framework would clearly condemn such research. On the other hand, having only a few non-human cells in the final individual would not suffice since a human with a porcine heart valve is still a human being. But where to draw the line is unclear, similar to the situation with objects that have vague identity conditions (Parfit 1984, 231–243; Thomson 1987; Thomson 1997).
In sum, then, although the Moral Status Framework appears to provide a sound objection to status-enhancing research, its application is nonetheless hampered by the empirical uncertainties regarding the effects that various kinds of hESC transplants would have and the moral uncertainties regarding which effects would be status-enhancing.
The Unnaturalness Argument raises concerns about the unnaturalness of crossing species boundaries, and while it is sufficiently inchoate that it may perhaps resist conclusive refutation, it is nonetheless a very weak objection and it fails to provide any reasons for those who do not object to chimeric research to change their minds. The Moral Confusion Argument has been alleged to be at the heart of the public controversy, but this allegation is not supported by the extensive social science research on public attitudes towards modern biotechnology. Moreover, the consequences posited by the argument as being morally problematic seem unlikely to occur, and were they to occur, would probably be beneficial in the long run, even at the cost of some short-term social disruption. The Borderline-Personhood Argument focuses on the personhood-relevant properties of great apes and concludes that their borderline status as persons confers a high enough degree of moral status to make most, if not all, chimeric research on them impermissible. Like other traditional animal ethics arguments, though, the argument depends upon controversial claims about the sufficient conditions for full, or near-full, moral status. The Human Dignity Argument attempts to explain why partial humanization of a certain sort is morally wrong, but mistakenly assumes that such research would eliminate or diminish an individual's dignity-grounding capacities. The Moral Status Framework maintains that status-enhancing chimeric research is permissible only if reasonable assurances are in place that the individual's enhanced moral status will be adequately respected. There are, however, several empirical and ethical uncertainties as to which chimeric research, if any, would enhance a non-human animal's moral status.
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Parts of Streiffer (2003) reprinted by permission of Taylor & Francis Ltd., and parts of Streiffer (2005) reprinted by permission of Johns Hopkins University Press.
My thanks to Antonio Rauti, Jaime Ahlberg, Sara Gavrell Ortiz, Carolina Sartorio, Dan Hausman, and Norm Fost for their many helpful comments.