Animal Cognition

First published Tue Jan 8, 2008; substantive revision Fri May 6, 2011

The philosophical issues that relate to research on animal cognition can be categorized into three groups: questions about the assumptions on which the research is based; questions that arise about the methods used in the research programs; and questions that arise from within the specific research programs.

While the study of animal cognition is largely an empirical endeavor, the practice of science in this area relies on theoretical arguments and assumptions — for example, on the nature of mind, communication, and rationality. If nonhuman animals don't have beliefs, and if all cognitive systems have beliefs, then animals wouldn't be the proper subjects of cognitive studies. If animals aren't agents because their behavior isn't caused by propositional attitudes, and if all cognitive systems are agents, we get the same conclusion. While there are arguments against animal minds, the cognitive scientists studying animals largely accept that animals are minded, cognitive systems. Animal consciousness, however, it is a topic that some scientists are less willing to engage with.

Many of the research programs investigating particular cognitive capacities in different species raise philosophical questions and have implications for philosophical theories, insofar as they impose additional empirical constraints for naturalistically minded philosophers. Traditional research paradigms in animal cognition are similar to those in human cognition, and include an examination of perception, learning, categorization, memory, spatial cognition, numerosity, communication, language, social cognition, theory of mind, causal reasoning, and metacognition.

Scientists working within any one of these areas might use very different methods, because there is no one discipline of animal cognition. For example, social cognition could be studied by a biologist who documents mutual gaze in mother-infant dyads across primate species (e.g. Matsuzawa 2006b), an ethologist interested in free-ranging canid social play behavior (e.g. Bekoff 2001), an experimental psychologist testing theory of mind in an adult symbol-trained chimpanzee (e.g. Premack & Woodruff 1978), an anthropologist observing social games in capuchin monkey communities (e.g. Perry et al. 2003), or a cognitive neuroscientist investigating neural basis of gaze-following in primates (e.g. Emery 2000). Finally, findings about the cognitive abilities of animals often play a role in debates about the moral status of animals.

1. What is Animal Cognition?

Animal cognition is constituted by the processes used to generate adaptive or flexible behavior in animal species. Much of the work on animal cognition is more appropriately described by the term comparative cognition, because the processes and capacities underlying behavior are compared between species (Shettleworth 2010). In the context of animal cognition research, cognition usually refers to the cognitive mechanisms involved in learning, memory, perception, and decision-making. As a part of cognitive science, research in animal cognition aims to uncover the different cognitive mechanisms at play across species, with the purpose of understanding the varieties of cognition, the similarities between humans and other species, and the evolution and function of cognitive processes.

The background assumption for much animal cognition research is the computational theory of mind. As with human cognition, there are competing theories about how this plays out. Following the cognitive revolution, many animal cognition researchers believed that cognition is a general purpose computational system. This was especially true of those who advocated versions of a Social Intelligence Hypothesis (Byrne & Whiten 1988; Dunbar 1998; Humphrey 1978; Jolly 1966). According to the hypothesis, the relatively sophisticated general problem-solving capacities of social animals are due to challenges arising from social living. However, those who claim that research on other species suggests that cognition is modular have challenged this vew (see the entry on the modularity of mind). Some argue that individuals cannot use one mechanism to solve all cognitive tasks, since there are different rates of learning and different computational processes implicated in different domains. Given these differences, cognition must be thought of as a bundle of special-purpose computational modules rather than one general purpose processor (Cosmides & Tooby 1994; Hauser & Carey 1998; Shettleworth 2010). Other researchers examine animal cognition from within the framework of embodied cognition (Barrett & Henzi 2005; Barrett et al. 2007; Hutchins 2008; Wilson 2008), or dynamical systems theory (King 2004; King & Shanker 2003; Shanker & King 2002). One hope is that research in animal cognition can help to inform the philosophical debates on such issues, as well as other debates within philosophy, from mental imagery (see Hollard & Delius 1982; Hopkins et al. 1993; Köhler et al., 2005; Rilling & Neiworth 1987) to moral psychology (Bekoff & Pierce 2009; Hauser 2006; de Waal 2006).

2. Foundational Issues

The philosophical discussion of animal cognition has been traditionally focused on the metaphysics and epistemology of mind in creatures that do not have language. Philosophers have asked whether animals are minded or rational, and whether they have concepts or beliefs, but they have also struggled with the issue of how to answer such questions given the inherent limitations of the investigation.

The early history of western philosophy reflects a tendency to see animals as lacking rationality. Aristotle defined “human” as “the rational animal”, thus rejecting the possibility that any other species is rational (Aristotle Metaphysics). Aquinas believed that animals are irrational because they are not free (Aquinas Summa Theologica). Centuries later, Descartes defended a distinction between humans and animals based on the belief that language is a necessary condition for mind; on his view animals are soulless machines (Descartes Discourse on the Method). Locke agreed that animals cannot think, because words are necessary for comprehending universals (Locke Essay Concerning Human Understanding). Following in this tradition, Kant concluded that since they cannot think about themselves, animals are not rational agents and hence they only have instrumental value (Kant Lectures on Ethics).

However, there were also dissenters. Voltaire criticized Descartes' view that humans but not animals have souls and hence minds, by suggesting that there is no evidence for the claim (Voltaire Philosophical Dictionary). Hume was downright dismissive of the animal mind skeptics when he wrote “Next to the ridicule of denying an evident truth, is that of taking much pains to defend it; and no truth appears to me more evident than that beasts are endowed with thought and reason as well as man. The arguments are in this case so obvious, that they never escape the most stupid and ignorant” (Hume Treatise of Human Nature, 176).

2.1 Animal Minds

Despite Hume's judgment about their worth, much ink has been spilled developing arguments for the existence of animal minds. The two standard arguments are extensions of the two arguments for other minds: the argument from analogy and the inference to the best explanation argument. The argument from analogy for animal minds can be formulated as:

  1. All animals I already know to have a mind (i.e., humans) have property x.
  2. Individuals of species y have property x.
  3. Therefore, individual of species y probably have a mind.

Versions of the argument differ as to what they choose as the reference property x, and how they defend the choice of reference property. The reference property could refer to any number of things, such as a general capacity (e.g. problem solving), a specific ability (e.g. language, theory of mind, tool-use), a behavior, or even brain activity (see Farah 2008 for an example of this last approach).

The argument from analogy for animal minds is in one sense stronger than the argument for other minds, insofar as the reference class is larger. Rather than starting with the introspection of one's own mind and then generalizing to all other humans, the argument for animal minds takes as given that all humans have minds and generalizes from the human species to other species. Nevertheless, in another sense the analogical argument for animal minds is weaker, since the strength of the argument is a function of the degree of similarity between the reference class and the target class. Humans are probably more similar to one another than they are to members of another species. While some researchers working with great apes have expressed concern about the argument from analogy (Povinelli et al. 2000; Povinelli 2000), it has been pointed out that those concerns do not accurately target analogical arguments for the existence of animal minds (Allen 2002).

The second standard argument for animal minds rests on the claim that the existence of animal minds is a better explanation of animal behavior and physiology than those offered by other hypotheses. This argument can be formulated as:

  1. Individuals of species x engage in behaviors y.
  2. The best scientific explanation for an individual engaging in behaviors y is that it has a mind.
  3. Therefore, it is likely that individuals of species x have minds.

The inference to the best explanation argument justifies the attribution of mental states to animals based on the robust predictive and explanatory power that is gained from such attributions. As the argument goes, without such attributions we would be unable to make sense of animal behavior. This argument relies on ordinary scientific reasoning; of two hypotheses, the one that better accounts for the phenomenon is the one to be preferred. Those who offer this sort of argument for animal minds are claiming that having a mind (whatever that amounts to) better explains the observed behavior. Critics say that the behavior can be explained just as well without appeal to mindedness.

While it is fair to say that most scientists working with animals think they have minds, they also have a tendency to use the inference to the best explanation strategy when they disagree about the cognitive mechanisms at play in a particular species at a particular time.

Though philosophers and psychologists seem to generally accept that other species have minds, there is widespread disagreement about what that means. For some, it merely means that some species can feel pain, and so are conscious beings (see animal consciousness), or that some species are rational agents who have reasons for action. For others, it means that animals process information, and the corresponding interest is in the cognitive structures supporting memory, perception, navigation, and so forth. There are also epistemological questions about how we might ever know the content of an animal's belief or reason for action, given the general difficulty of attributing content to a creature that doesn't use language. Whether animals are rational has significant bearing upon philosophical questions having to do with the moral status of animals. For example, arguments in favor of personhood for great apes are made on the basis of the rational capacities of these species (Cavalieri & Singer 1994), as are arguments for duties toward animals (Skidmore 2001), and arguments given in favor of moral agency (or proto-moral agency) (Bekoff & Pierce 2009; Hauser 2006; de Waal 2006).

2.2 Anthropomorphism

When researchers attribute mental states to other species, they open themselves to the charge of anthropomorphism. The term “anthropomorphism” has a number of different connotations, but most generally refers to the act of attributing human traits to other animals. Sometimes the term is used to refer only to psychological traits, and sometimes it is used to refer to traits that are claimed to be uniquely human (in which case anthropomorphism is an error by definition). In recent years, there have been a number of theoretical discussions about the charge of anthropomorphism itself (including the essays in Daston & Mitman 2005; Mitchell et al. 1997; and work by Andrews 2009, forthcoming; Asquith 1997; Crist 1999; Fisher 1990, 1991; Keeley 2004; Kennedy 1992; Rivas & Burghardt 2002; Shettleworth 2010b; Wynne 2004, 2007).

In response to claims that psychological and agential attributions are examples of anthropomorphic attribution, some have argued that the charge of anthropomorphism is a charge that the attributor is making a category mistake, rather than merely a false attribution. It is a claim that the attribution must be logically false, because members of the target species are not the sorts of things to which the term can apply (Keeley 2004; Fisher 1991). However, if the charge of anthropomorphism is the charge that the attributer is making a category mistake, then the charge is being made on conceptual, rather than empirical grounds. Thus, one response to the charge of anthropomorphism is continued research, for one wouldn't know whether a property is anthropomorphic until after the relevant research has been completed. As Sober puts it, “The only prophylactic we need is empiricism” (Sober 2005, 97).

However, Sober also argues that the empirical methodology of psychology places a greater burden of proof on animal cognition research than it does on human cognition research. He suggests that comparative psychologists accept as the null hypothesis that different cognitive mechanisms are at work in humans and animals. Given that type 1 errors (reporting a false positive and rejecting a (possibly true) null hypothesis) are taken to be more serious errors than are type 2 errors (reporting a false negative and not rejecting a null hypothesis when it should be rejected), the practice of science results in a bias against attributing psychological traits to animals (Sober 2005). The debate about how to interpret the results of animal studies in comparison to human studies can be viewed as a debate about an inconsistent application of what the psychologist C. Lloyd Morgan advanced as his Cannon. Morgan's Canon states: “In no case may we interpret an action as the outcome of the exercise of a higher psychical faculty, if it can be interpreted as the outcome of the exercise of one which stands lower in the psychological scale” (Morgan 1894, 53). Though this is a longstanding rule of thumb in animal cognition research, sometimes referred to as the “principle of conservatism,” it is not a principle commonly used in human cognition research. To complicate matters, attempts to determine which psychical faculties are higher or lower, a task that Morgan's Canon instructs a researcher to perform, have raised worries about its meaningfulness (Allen-Hermanson 2005; Sober 2005).

Some argue that anthropomorphism is a human tendency that must be overcome in order to do good science, because it relies an unjustified generalization from linguistic humans to nonlinguistic animals. These critics suggest that animals who lack language may not even have concepts, and without language scientists are not in a position to attribute content. Since we are barred from making attributions, scientific psychology ought not engage with questions about animal mentality (e.g. Keeton 1967; Kennedy 1992; Blumberg & Wasserman 1995; Wynne 2004, 2007).

It has been noted that such arguments concern the proper methods of science, the scope of science, and how to interpret data (Keeley 2004; Bekoff & Allen 1997). As such, they are not empirical, but theoretical arguments. This can be seen in the way in which the debates sometimes result in an impasse. Those opposed to attributing mental properties to animals are accused of begging the question (Griffin 1992), by committing “reverse anthropocentrism” (Sheets-Johnstone 1992) or “anthropodenial” (de Waal 1999). The charge of begging the question goes both ways. Kennedy argues that arguments for animal mentality are grounded in human intuition or introspection, and that introspection is itself anthropomorphic and ought not to be taken as objective evidence (Kennedy 1992). As both sides accuse the other of begging the question, some conclude that the debate is not fecund, and ought to be replaced with empirical work in comparative biology and psychology (Keeley 2004; Sober 2005; Andrews 2009, forthcoming).

Another worry concerns the scientific hypotheses at play. Even if there is no categorical prohibition against attributing human properties to animals, some researchers may be too quick to conclude that an animal is using some “higher-order” process in a particular instance. One concern is that researchers may have a failure of imagination when it comes to hypothesis generation; they may make an inference to the best explanation argument without considering all the possible explanations. This reflects Kennedy's worry when he claims that the following argument for attributing mental properties to animals rests on a false dichotomy: either animals are stimulus-response machines, or they are agents with beliefs and desires; since animals are not stimulus-response machines, they must be psychological agents (Kennedy 1992). According to Kennedy, the problem with this argument is that not all machines implement stimulus-response functions; some machines are complex and indeterministic, and if animals were machines, they would be machines of that sort (Barlow 1990; Kennedy 1992). Similar concerns are put forward by those who stress, contra Darwin, the discontinuity between humans and other animals (Penn et al. 2008).

Finally, some worry that the science of comparative cognition has been damaged by the idea that explanation of behavior in terms of species-typical predispositions rather than in terms of human-like reasoning or insight amounts to a “killjoy” explanation (Shettleworth 2010b). When one considers differences between humans and animals to be less joyful than similarities, it should not be surprising if more similarities are found. Even worse is the worry that some “human-like reasoning” postulated to explain human behavior is false, and that extraordinary behaviors performed by humans and other animals might arise out of simple processes (Andrews 2005, forthcoming; Penn et al. 2008; Shettleworth 2010b; de Waal & Ferrari 2010). This view reflects some approaches in cognitive science that focus on the power of simple rules and the emergence of complex behavior in self-organizing systems, and is related to philosophical research on emergent properties, mental representation, artificial life, robotics, as well as situated, distributed and dynamical approaches to cognition (see, e.g., Clark 2001).

The concerns about anthropomorphism appear to be largely limited to western scientists. It has been argued that researchers from countries with a Buddhist rather than Christian orientation are not culturally encouraged to see a categorical distinction between humans and nonhuman animals (Asquith 1991; Sakura 1998; Matsuzawa 2003; de Waal 2003). Unlike Christianity, the Buddhist doctrine does not claim that humans, but not animals, have immortal souls, and thus it does not allow humans to use animals for their own purposes in the ways Christianity does. The Buddhist tradition sees a connection between humans and other animals, and even states that humans can be reborn as animals. De Waal argues that the difference in cultural attitudes toward animals led Western primatologists to first reject Japanese methods, findings, and ideas; it is only recently that some of those ideas, such as Kinji Imanishi's claim that primates display cultural differences within species, have made their way into Western scientific discourse (de Waal 2003).

2.3 Rationality

The question of animal rationality is related to a number of different questions about animals, including whether they engage in action, can intend, or have intentionality. Views about animal rationality can also have consequences for views about animal autonomy and moral status.

Rationality is sometimes understood in terms of acting for reasons. Given this starting point, Glock argues that animals are rational because they can act in light of reasons understood objectively, in an agent-neutral fashion, and that the animal is sensitive to these reasons (Glock 2009). However, discussions of animal rationality are confounded by the lack of consensus on what is required for rationality. Because there are many different kinds of rationality (e.g. practical vs. theoretical, process vs. product), and given the disagreements both about the cognitive mechanisms implicated in rationality (e.g. linguistic processing, logical reasoning, causal reasoning, simulation, biases and heuristics), and the extent to which different kinds of normativity are implicated in rationality (e.g. biological fitness or reason-respecting propositional attitudes), there is no straightforward way to answer the question about whether members of any other species are rational agents.

Some philosophical theories of rationality are based on an initial acceptance of rationality across species, given evolutionary considerations. For example, on Fred Dretske's view, even some simple learned behaviors, such as a bird's avoiding eating a monarch butterfly, can be construed as minimally rational. Because monarchs who eat toxic milkweed become toxic to birds and other predators, when a bird learns not to eat monarch butterflies after having formed an association between eating monarchs and vomiting, it has a reason for its avoidance behavior. The birds also have a reason to avoid eating a viceroy, given that it is visually almost indistinguishable from a monarch, though not poisonous. The behavior in both cases is explained by the content of the bird's thought (or “thought”), and for Dretske this is sufficient for the bird to count as a minimally rational agent (1988, 2006).

Other theories of rationality that take evolutionary considerations into account include those of Daniel Dennett (1995, 1987), Ruth Millikan (2004, 2006), and Joelle Proust (1999, 2006). Another method used to develop theories of rationality starts from the human model, and attempts to extend it to other species. This approach is exemplified by José Bermúdez (2003, 2006). A third class of theories tries to stake a middle ground between these two strategies (e.g. Hurley 2003a, 2003b, 2006). For a collection of essays on rationality across species see Hurley & Nudds (2006).

Given the lack of theoretical consensus on the nature of rationality, empirical research projects are not designed to examine rationality directly. Instead, researchers investigate various capabilities that may be associated with rationality. For example, tool use has long been considered to be an indicator of rational thought. Because tool use involves finding or constructing an object that is utilized as an extension of the body to achieve a specific goal, some think that tool use requires identifying a problem, considering ways of solving the problem, and realizing that other objects can be used in the manipulation of the situation. Early experimental research on chimpanzee problem solving by the German psychologist Wolfgang Köhler had chimps constructing tools to acquire out-of-reach objects; it was reported that chimpanzees would stack boxes or put together tubes to form a long rod in order to reach bananas hung overhead (Köhler 1925). Given this behavior, Köhler suggested that chimpanzees solve some problems not by trial and error or stimulus-response association, but through a flash of insight. (But see Povinelli (2000) for a critique of the contemporary interpretation of Köhler's research).

Naturalistic studies of tool use in animals took off in the 1960s, when two independent research teams in Tanzania observed chimpanzees making and using tools. Goodall found chimpanzees in Gombe using grasses and twigs to fish for termites, and she observed chimpanzees modifying twigs by stripping off their leaves so they could be used for this purpose (Goodall 1986). Around the same time, Kinji Imanishi's team found chimpanzees using rocks to crack nuts in the Mahale forest, about 200 miles away from Goodall's research site (Nishida 1990).

We now know that chimpanzees make and use tools for a number of different purposes. Chimpanzees at Fongoli, Senegal manufacture spears in four or more steps in order to hunt bush babies (Preutz & Bertolani 2007). Chimpanzees at Bossou, Guinea, use large branches from palm-oil trees to crack open the tree from its crown in order to gain access to a rich food source (Yamakoshi & Sugiyama 1995). Chimpanzees also construct and use sets of tools that they subsequently utilize in a determinate order; Goualougo chimpanzees will manufacture a perforating tool to enlarge holes in a termite nest after an unsuccessful fishing attempt; as soon as the exit hole is enlarged, the chimpanzee then inserts a fishing probe (Sanz and Morgan 2007). Chimpanzees also use tool composites, such as a hammer and anvil, to crack nuts (Nishida 1990; Sakura & Matsuzawa 1991) and they manufacture stone tools (Carvalho et al. 2008).

Tool use in the wild has been discovered in a number of different taxa, including all great apes, some monkeys, some birds, sea otters, and cetaceans. Reports of animal tool use offer evidence in favor of the claim that some animal behavior is functionally rational, in the sense that its behavior allows the animal to achieve a goal. Furthermore, it is perhaps the result of an evolutionary adaptation. However, the extent to which such evidence addresses the question of whether the behavior is rational in the sense of being in the space of reasons is a matter of debate.

Given the lack of clarity of the term “rationality,” instead of asking whether animals are rational, researchers examine the mechanisms that are involved in various animal behaviors. See the section on Research Programs for more discussion about the different cognitive mechanisms postulated as explanations for animal behaviors.

2.4 Belief

The question of whether animals have beliefs is also difficult to answer given the lack of theoretical agreement about the nature of belief. The most common view is that belief is a representational state, and that the mental representation, which fixes content, expresses propositional content. For some, this view is consistent with animal belief, since they believe that, like humans, animals can operate in a Language of Thought (Fodor 1975; Cheney & Seyfarth 2007; Tetzlaff & Ray 2009). Some representationalists have suggested that animals might have representational belief that cannot be expressed propositionally (Bermúdez 2003; Camp 2009; Rescorla 2009). For example, Camp suggests that some beliefs are based on imagistic representational systems, such as diagrams or maps, and that such systems can account for baboon social knowledge, so there is no need to posit a baboon language of thought (Camp 2009; in response to Cheney & Seyfarth 2007). While Cheney and Seyfarth claim that the baboon cognitive system is vehicled by a language of thought given its nature as representational, discrete-valued, hierarchically structured, rule-governed, open-ended, and independent of sensory modality, Camp argues that the inference is not warranted, since non-sentential representational systems can also have such features. Baboons can have beliefs without having beliefs with propositional content. Bermúdez also argues that animals have non-propositional beliefs, because some animal behavior is only explicable in terms of beliefs and desires. However, Bermúdez denies that animal belief has any structure; rather, on his account animal beliefs are simple imagistic representations of things in the world that permit some thoughts about others' goals and perceptions (Bermúdez 2003). The view that animals can have perceptual beliefs that ought not be understood in terms of propositional attitudes has also been defended by Glock (2000, 2010).

Representationalists of all sorts point out the limitations in the different kinds of representational systems. Camp, who defends the claim that maps have a rich syntactic structure, admits some limitations: mental maps do not seem to be able to accommodate some first order thoughts such as non-specific existentially quantified propositions or universally quantified propositions, or any second-order thoughts (Camp 2007). Like Camp, Bermúdez defends the position that, while animals can think, they cannot hold beliefs about beliefs, but he denies that imagistic thought has syntactic structure, and hence he concludes that animals are not logical thinkers (Bermúdez 2003, 2009). Carruthers also argues that, while even insects have beliefs (Carruthers 2004), there is no evidence that any nonhuman species has metacognitive abilities (Carruthers 2008). Carruthers suggests that the evidence from animal behavior supports the position that belief, like desire, comes in degrees (Carruthers 2008).

For others, the lack of an external language (and the lack of an error theory to account for why animals would have a language of thought while lacking external language) suggests that animals do not have beliefs at all (Dennett 1996; Davidson 1982, Stich 1978). Donald Davidson has offered an argument against animal rationality based on an association between concepts, beliefs, and language. On Davidson's view, believers must have the concept of belief, because in order to have a belief, one must recognize that beliefs can be true or false, and one cannot understand objective truth without understanding the nature of beliefs. In order to develop an understanding of objective truth, one must be able to triangulate with others, to talk to others about the world, and hence all believers must be language users. Since other species lack language, they do not have beliefs (Davidson 1982). Davidson also argues against animal beliefs based on the claim that having a notion of error is necessary for counting as a believer (Davidson 1975). These arguments have been widely discussed in the literature.

A different argument against animal belief has been presented by Stephen Stich, who argues that we cannot attribute propositional attitudes to animals in any metaphysically robust sense, given our inability to attribute content to an animal's purported belief (Stich 1978). On Stich's view, if attribution of belief to animals is understood purely instrumentally, then animals have beliefs. However, if attribution of beliefs to animals requires that we can accurately describe the content of those beliefs, then animals don't have beliefs. In response to Armstrong's suggestion that we can fix the content of animal belief de re (Armstrong 1973), Stich argues that we cannot make de re attributions because this would violate the truth-preserving role of attribution. In addition, because “nothing we could discover would enable us to attribute content to an animal's belief” (Stich 1978, 23), we are unable to make de dicto attributions to other species. Hence, we can make no attribution, and if we can't say what an animal's belief is about, it makes no sense to say that an animal has a belief. The worry here is similar to the worry about anthropomorphism; when we use our language to ascribe content to other species, we may be attributing to them more than is appropriate. Stich is concerned that when we say “Fido believes there is a meaty bone buried in the backyard” we are attributing to Fido concepts he cannot possibility have, concepts like “backyard” which are only comprehensible if one has corresponding concepts such as “property line”, “house”, “fence”, and so on. Stich's argument can be formulated as:

  1. In order for something to have a belief, it must have a concept.
  2. In order to have a concept, one must have particular kinds of knowledge, including knowledge of how the concept relates to other concepts.
  3. Non-human animals don't have such knowledge.
  4. Therefore, non-human animals don't have beliefs.

There are at least three ways to respond the arguments that beliefs require concepts which require language. One can deny the necessary connection between concepts and language, as we saw above; also, as we will see in the next section some argue that concepts can be had by individuals who lack language (Allen & Hauser 1996; Allen 1999; Glock 2010). Another is to deny the necessary connection between beliefs and concepts; given nonconceptual content, belief may be possible without having concepts (Bermúdez 2003; Glock 2010). Another response, but one less explored in the literature, is to deny that beliefs need be understood in terms of mental representations. In addition, given that some theories of content determination do not rely on linguistic ablilities (e.g. teleological, causal), one may attempt to sidestep the kinds of concerns raised by Davidson and Stich by adopting such accounts.

2.5 Concepts

While some philosophers defend the metaphysical claim that natural language is necessary for having concepts (Brandom 1994, Davidson 1975, Dummett 1993), and while others defend the epistemic claim that that language possession is a necessary condition for identifying concepts (Stich 1978), empirical research in animal cognition suggests that both views may be mistaken. Researchers seek to uncover the nature of animal concepts both de re and de dicto using a variety of methods.

One of the earliest methods for examining animal concepts came out of a series of experiments with pigeons. The subjects were shown photographs, and were trained to peck at the pictures that contained a target object, such as a tree, and not respond to the pictures that didn't contain the target object. After the training period, the pigeons were able to generalize to new photographs, pecking only at those that contained trees just as in the training set. It was suggested that this sorting ability demonstrates that the pigeon has a concept of the target object (Herrnstein 1979; Herrnstein et al. 1976).

Many reject the idea that being able to sort objects is sufficient for having a concept corresponding to the sortal, since humans can sort objects while lacking the corresponding concept. As Colin Allen and Marc Hauser put it, “It is possible to teach a human being to sort distributors from other parts of car engines based on a family resemblance between shapes of distributors. But this ability would not be enough for us to want to say that the person has the concept of a distributor” (Allen & Hauser 1996, 51).

Rather than identifying concept acquisition with sorting behavior, Allen and Hauser suggest alternative methodologies for identifying concepts in other species. For example, they offer a possible (though, they admit, ethically untenable) test for a death concept among vervet monkeys (Allen & Hauser 1996). Vervet mothers are capable of recognizing the alarm cries of their infants, and when they hear such a cry the mother will look towards her infant, and the other females will look towards the mother. Allen and Hauser suggest that playing a recording of a recently deceased infant's alarm cry would help to determine whether vervets have a concept of death. If the mother responds to these recordings in an atypical fashion, unlike the usual response made to a living infant, that response provides evidence that vervet monkeys have the concept of death. According to Allen and Hauser, having a concept permits different responses to identical stimuli. The actual sound of the infant's alarm cry during life is identical to the sound played back after death. If the response to this stimulus is different, this is evidence that there has been a conceptual change associated with the stimulus. Allen presents the general strategy for attributing concepts to animals as follows: “An organism O may reasonably be attributed a concept of X (e.g. TREE) whenever:

  1. O systematically discriminates some Xs from some non-Xs; and
  2. O is capable of detecting some of its own discrimination errors between Xs and non-Xs; and
  3. O is capable of learning to better discriminate Xs from non-Xs as a consequence of its capacity”(Allen 1999, 37).

Another method for studying animal concepts comes from research on human infants (Hauser et al. 1996; Hauser & Carey 1998; Bermúdez 2003; Gómez 2005, Uller 2004). The preferential looking time paradigm, also known as the dishabituation paradigm, is used to study human infants' understanding of the physical and social world (Baillargeon & DeVos 1991; Spelke 1991). Dishabituation experiments are thought to help us understand what kinds of predictions infants make about their world, and this information can help us determine how they see the world. The methodology is simple; an infant is repeatedly shown a stimulus, and as soon as he becomes habituated to the stimulus, the infant becomes disinterested. At this point, a new stimulus is shown. If the infant sees the new stimulus as different from the target stimulus, or impossible given the target stimulus, the infant will look longer at the new stimulus. If the infant takes the new stimulus to be similar to the target stimulus, then she will not show any additional interest. The idea is that by comparing responses among groups of individuals, a researcher can learn something about how that group conceptualizes the world. Bermúdez argues that such methods can be used to make de dicto ascriptions to animals (Bermúdez 2003 b).

In one study using this method, Marc Hauser and colleagues investigated numerical concepts in different primate species, including rhesus monkeys (Hauser et al. 1996) and cotton-top tamarins (Uller 1997). The researchers tested the monkeys' ability to keep track of individual objects placed behind a barrier. They found that, like human infants, the monkeys look longer at impossible outcomes. For example, in one test condition the rhesus monkeys were shown two eggplants serially placed behind a screen, and then the screen was lifted showing only one eggplant. The monkeys looked longer at the one eggplant than they did when shown the two eggplants, suggesting that they represent the eggplants as distinct sortals.

Another way we might learn how different species organize the world is to teach individuals a symbolic communication system. For example, the biologist Irene Pepperberg trained an African Grey parrot named Alex to sort objects using meta-level concepts that categorize other concepts. Alex was able to sort objects according to color, shape, and matter, and he was able to sort sets of objects according to number. In addition to sorting, Alex could report which feature makes two objects similar or different. For example, when presented with a red block and a red key, Alex responded to the question “What's same?” by uttering “color.” He could also report similarities and differences in shape and matter. Pepperberg claims that her studies demonstrate Alex's understanding of categorical concepts, and reveal the classifications that Alex devised (Pepperberg 1999). However, one might be worried that the concepts exhibited by symbol-trained animals are an artifact of the communication system, and not typical of the species.

Finally, animal concepts are also being studied in the field, where the concepts' usefulness to animals may be more apparent. Through careful observation and field experiments of wild individuals, researchers are examining the natural concepts different species may use in order to categorize events in their social and physical environment. For example, primatologists observed that Diana monkeys have acoustically distinct alarm calls for different predators, and that the female alarm calls differ from the male (Zuberbühler et al. 1997; Zuberbühler et al. 1999). This natural difference allowed Zuberbühler and colleagues to set up a field experiment with the purpose of determining whether the male and female alarm calls mean the same thing to the monkeys. He found that they treated the acoustically different calls as synonyms. Such evidence suggests that researchers can identify at least some animals' concepts “de re”.

Social knowledge offers a window for field researchers who investigate animal concepts. Cheney and Seyfarth argue that primate behavior relies on a rich body of social knowledge, and that this knowledge suggests that primates have conceptual understanding (Cheney & Seyfarth 2009, forthcoming). Taking the case of baboons, we know that they recognize individuals, classify them into groups according to properties including close social bonds, kinship, dominance ranks, and transient sexual relations. For example, knowledge of kinship is demonstrated in instances of kin-mediated reconciliation, when an antagonistic encounter is resolved by a kin of the aggressor giving a reconciliation grunt. This categorical information informs baboon behavior. In addition, some of these relationships change over time, and can have widespread repercussions over the group dominance organization. Baboons are able to quickly make adjustments about linear dominance ranks after a rank reversal, even when the reversal affects different matrilines and causes changes in the rank relationship of several individuals. Cheney and Seyfarth argue that memory and classical conditioning alone cannot account for the richness of primate social knowledge, given the amount information primates would have to represent — they claim that a baboon would have to learn thousands of dyadic relations, and tens of thousands of triadic relations in order to anticipate other animals' behavior. In addition to worries about the space needed to represent all those relations, they point out that the speed of baboon behavior in response to a complex problem is not consistent with the hypothesis that baboons solve social problems by searching through a humongous and unstructured database of relations. Rather, Cheney and Seyfarth suggest that baboons and other primates with complex social societies organize individuals into rule-governed classes, or concepts. This, they argue, is an adaptive strategy (Cheney & Seyfarth 2009).

While much of the discussion has focused on whether animals have concepts and how concepts can be identified, it has also been argued that the animal evidence suggests that we may better represent cognitive diversity and individual complexity by considering that there are different kinds of representations, and not all of them are conceptual. Some animal behaviors may rely on nonconceptual content which permits flexible behavior but does not require the ability to identify objects, while other behaviors rely on perception-based concepts and even propositional content (e.g. in the case of symbol-trained apes) (Newen & Bartels 2007).

For all these foundational questions, the existence of competing theories offers a complication to those who argue that animals have the property. However, the evidence from animal behavior may also serve to shed light on these debates. Rather than seeing the different theories as competitors, we see that some philosophers take the data to suggest a plural approach when it comes to our understanding of rationality, belief, and concepts.

3. The Science of Animal Cognition

Today, no one discipline has a monopoly on the study of animal cognition. Psychology, biology, and anthropology departments all have their share of animal cognition researchers. Just as no one discipline has an exclusive focus on animal cognition, there is no one method that characterizes research in animal cognition. While early scientific interest in animal behavior was approached differently by the psychologists, who focused on using laboratory experiments to uncover mechanisms, and ethologists, who used observational methods to uncover the evolution of behavior, today many scientists approach the study of animal cognition by using a combination of methods.

3.1 Early Anecdotal Method

Contemporary scientific interest in animal minds and cognitive capacities is often traced back to Charles Darwin's theory of evolution by natural selection. In The Descent of Man, Darwin introduced many of the issues that motivate the research programs in animal cognition today, including tool use, reasoning, learning, concepts, consciousness, social cognition, artistic abilities, and moral cognition. In addition, Darwin anticipated current interest in implicit reasoning with his comment “The savage would certainly neither know nor care by what law the desired movements were effected; yet his act would be guided by a rude process of reasoning, as surely as would a philosopher in his longest chain of deductions” (Darwin 1974, 75).

Like Aristotle centuries before him, Darwin advocated the continuity of the mental across species; just as some morphological characteristics are homologous across species living in similar environments, we should expect psychological and behavioral similarities as well: “the difference in mind between man and the higher animals, great as it is, certainly is one of degree and not of kind”(Darwin 1974, 122). This view was also advocated by Darwin's contemporary, the naturalist George Romanes, who in his book Animal Intelligence writes “there must be a psychological, no less than a physiological, continuity extending throughout the length and breadth of the animal kingdom” (Romanes 1970, 10). Darwin's view about continuity across species has been challenged on several dimensions, from the notion that language or culture plays a fundamental role in the evolution of cognition to worries about anthropomorphism (for discussions see Andrews & Radenovic forthcoming; Penn et al. 2008; Shettleworth 2010b).

The method that Darwin, Romanes and their contemporaries first used to investigate these questions could be described as the anecdotal method. Stories about animal behavior were collected from a variety of people, including military officers, amateur naturalists, and layfolk, and were compiled and used as evidence for a particular cognitive capacity in that species. This approach was widely criticized. The “evidence” gathered was often a story told about an event witnessed by a single person, usually not a trained scientific observer. In addition, these stories were often acquired second- or third- hand, so there were worries that the reports had been embellished or otherwise altered along the way. These problems were recognized early on, and in response Romanes developed three principles for accepting anecdotes in order to avoid some of these problems:

  1. Never accept an incident report as fact without considering the authority or respectability of the observer.
  2. If the observer isn't known, and the incident report is sufficiently important, consider whether the observer may have reason or cause to make an inaccurate report.
  3. Look for corroborations of the observation by examining similar or analogous observations made by other independent observers (Romanes 1970).

The third principle was the one he most relied on, writing “This principle I have found to be a great use in guiding my selection of instances, for where statements of fact which present nothing intrinsically improbable are found to be unconsciously confirmed by different observers, they have as good a right to be deemed trustworthy as statements which stand on the single authority of a known observer, and I have found the former to be at least as abundant as the latter” (Romanes 1970, ix).

Despite Romanes' attempts, the method remained problematic insofar as it didn't provide any statistical information about the frequency of such behaviors; selection bias would lead people to report only the interesting intelligent behaviors and ignore the frequency of behaviors that might serve as counterevidence. Thus, the anecdotal method as practiced by Darwin and Romanes lacks many of the virtues associated with good scientific methods.

Though the early anecdotal method has been rejected, some researchers argue that anecdotes play an important role in animal cognition research (Bates & Byrne 2007), and observation of behavior is still considered a valuable research tool, as we will see below.

3.2 Experimental Methods

Before Watson and Skinner promoted behaviorism in human psychology, similar ideas were being espoused among animal cognition researchers who were disappointed in the lack of rigorous methods for studying animal minds. The psychologist C. Lloyd Morgan's early text on comparative cognition was critical of the anthropomorphism in the anecdotes reported by Darwin, Romanes, and others. In An Introduction to Comparative Psychology (1894), Morgan famously proposed his Canon; recall that Morgan's Canon is a principle of conservatism that instructs researchers to interpret behavior as caused by the lowest possible “psychical faculty” (Morgan 1894, 53). In his text, Morgan suggested that many of the seemingly cognitively sophisticated behaviors of animals could be explained by associative learning.

The Clever Hans scandal of 1904 demonstrated Morgan's Canon in use; Hans was a famous Russian trotting horse who charmed crowds by showing an ability to calculate mathematical problems, as well as to read German and musical notation, simply by tapping his hoof (Candland 1993; Pfungst 1965). After much investigation, the experimental psychologist Otto Pfungst found that Hans wasn't counting or reading language, but rather he was reacting to his owner von Osten's bodily motions. Von Osten was unconsciously cuing Hans to start and stop tapping his foot at the correct time, and Hans had merely leaned to associate von Osten's movements with the correct behavior. Today, the legacy of Clever Hans can be seen in the control methods used during the experimental testing of an animal's ability. For example, researchers who know the correct response will wear a welder's mask, blackened goggles, or some other device to keep the subject from being cued by eye gaze or facial expressions. Another method is to use naive trainers during testing.

Edward L. Thorndike (1874 − 1949) was the psychologist who did the most at this point to promote research on animal behavior. Thorndike argued for the necessity of experimental study of animals, writing, “most of the books do not give us a psychology, but rather a eulogy of animals. They have all been about animal intelligence, never about animal stupidity” (Thorndike 1911, 22). Experiments will help us learn both what animals can do and what they fail to do, thus giving us a better overall understanding of animal cognition. One of Thorndike's projects focused on the problem-solving abilities of housecats. He placed cats in a variety of puzzle boxes, and observed the strategies the cats used to escape. When first put in a new box, the cats took a long time to find the solution, but after becoming more experienced with the box, they were able to escape much more quickly. Thorndike found that the cats improved their reaction time by ignoring the ineffective actions and performing the useful ones. This suggested to Thorndike that cats learn through trial and error, and his conclusion helped to reinforce the belief that animal behavior can be fully explained in associative terms.

While the psychologists succeeded in introducing much-needed rigor into the study of animal minds, there was some concern that they had gone too far, that the methods were too stringent, and that the drive for repeatable and controlled experiments could not be used to uncover all there is to know about the function of animal minds. For example, the ethologists thought that in order to understand animal behavior, animals must be observed in their natural environment. As sterile laboratory experiments stripped the subjects of social and environmental context, the worry arose that some studies may be ecologically invalid.

Today scientists continue to conduct experiments in laboratory settings, but they also attempt to mirror the richness of the animal's natural environment. For example, the research coming out of Kyoto University's Primate Research Institute (PRI) is based on a three-part research program (Matsuzawa et al. 2006). First, the physical, cognitive, and social development of chimpanzees is taken into account in the design of experiments, and subjects are raised by their mothers rather than by human caregivers or unrelated animals. In addition, lab work and fieldwork is synthesized; field observations are used to develop experiments, and experiments are conducted both in the field and in the laboratory. Finally, the method includes analysis of the physiological and biological features of the species that could be related to cognitive abilities.

The experimental research at PRI uses what they call the “participant observation” method, which is based on the triadic social relationship between mother, infant, and experimenter. When testing chimpanzees in the lab, they are never taken from their natural social environment; rather, the experiments are brought into the social environment. As a researcher becomes a member of that social environment, she can run experiments that are woven into normal daily activities. At PRI, a different researcher is bonded with each mother-infant dyad, and the relationship is expected to last a lifetime. This close relationship between human and chimpanzee is thought to offer many benefits. It makes the chimpanzees more willing to engage in the research activities, so the researcher can gain a better understanding of what chimpanzees can and cannot do (rather than what they are willing or not willing to do). In addition, Matsuzawa claims that the participant observation method fares better at investigating species-typical social cognition than isolated experiments on single subjects, because the PRI chimpanzees are not integrated into a human social environment, but the researchers themselves adapt to the chimpanzee social environment (Matsuzawa 2006a). Finally, the bond between researcher and subject allows the human to interact with his chimpanzee “research partners” at a younger age, given the relation of trust between researcher and mother. Mother and infant can be taught a task together, which can help to illuminate developmental differences in particular abilities. For example, Inoue and Matsuzawa reported that infant chimpanzees are better able to recall strings of numerals in order than adult chimpanzees and humans (Inoue & Matsuzawa 2007).

Another way to avoid the worry about the ecological validity of experiments is to perform them in the animal's natural environment. In field experiments, researchers intervene in the natural environments of their subjects, rather than in a laboratory. One kind of field experiment is the playback experiment, in which researchers play an audio recording of an animal call in order to test the behavioral responses to the call in various contexts. Cheney and Seyfarth describe the structure of playback experiments as follows: researchers first collect recordings of various calls given by different individuals. Then, they examine the responses of the subject when a recording of some individual's call is amplified by a hidden loudspeaker (the individual whose call is being played is generally out of sight in such experiments). The subject is video recorded before and after the playback. These experiments can be used to test how the same subject responds to two different calls played in the same context, as well as how the subject responds to the same call played in different contexts (Cheney & Seyfarth 2007). Playback experiments have been used in many contexts across species; for example, such experiments have shown that vervet monkeys respond differently to different alarm calls given for different predators (Seyfarth et al. 1980), that baboons grunt to reconcile after a fight (Cheney et al. 1995), and that baboons reconcile after a relative of the aggressor grunts (Wittig et al. 2007a). Playback experiments also suggest that bottlenose dolphins recognize the signature whistle of their relatives (Sayigh et al. 1998; Janik et al 2006), and that great male tits differ on personality dimensions (Amy et al. 2010).

3.3 Observational Methods

While early psychologists were performing animal behavior experiments in the laboratory, ethologists such as Oskar Heinroth, Konrad Lorenz, Nikolaas Tinbergen, and Karl von Frisch were following animals into the field to observe naturally occurring behavior. The ethological method comes from biology, and takes into account not only the behavior, but also the context of behavior, the environment, and the physiology and evolutionary history of the animal. However, at least initially, the ethologists were less interested in cognitive mechanisms than were the experimentalists. Classical ethology gave birth to a number of different fields of study. Behavioral ecology developed into a unique field oriented towards determining how a behavior evolved and the functions of that behavior (Krebs & Daies 1993; Wilson 1975). Cognitive ethology was born as a field focused on animal consciousness (Griffin 1984, 1985, 1992), though in this literature consciousness is as much of a focus as beliefs, intentions, self-awareness, deception, and theory of mind. Griffin's use of the word “consciousness” belies his greater interest in cognition, given that most of the topics he discusses (e.g. perception, memory, spatial cognition, language, tool use etc.) are cognitive (Griffin 1992). Today few researchers welcome the cognitive ethology label (Allen 2004; Shettleworth 2010a). Rather, we witness an integration of the experimental and ethological approaches to studying cognition by scientists in psychology, biology, and anthropology, among other fields (Shettleworth 2010a). Some now use the term “cognitive ecology” to refer to the study of cognitive processes in an animals' natural environment (Healy & Braithwaite 2000; Real 1993).

In the early days of ethology, Lorenz and Tinbergen were interested in analyzing the complex and rigid set of movements that make up a single act. They postulated that such movements, which they called fixed action patterns, are innate and caused by the existence of a releasing mechanism that responds to some external sensory stimulus. Ethologists study such acts at various organizational levels, e.g. at the individual, dyad, family group, and species levels (Menzel 1969). To explain behavior, ethologists follow Tinbergen's suggestion that we can distinguish between explanations in terms of proximate causes, such as mechanism and function, and ultimate causes, such as ontogeny (the maturational processes involved in the behavior) and evolution (Tinbergen 1963).

But before an explanation for some behavior can be found, the behavior must be well understood in the context of species-normal behavior. Thus, the ethologist will begin the study of a species by constructing an ethogram from field notes taken after many hours of observation (Brown 1975; Lehner 1996). An ethogram is a thorough catalogue of the characteristic behavioral units of a species, and each unit is given a verbal description and perhaps an image. Theoretical debates arise over the issue of how an ethogram should label and describe behavioral units. Behaviors can be described formally, and describe the action at the level of muscular contractions, or patterns of bodily movements (e.g. beak pecks ground). On the other hand, an ethogram could describe behaviors functionally, and place the behavior in a larger context by referring to the purpose or consequence of the behavior (e.g. eats) (Hinde 1970).

There are criticisms of both functional and formal methods of description. Formal descriptions may leave out important aspects of an animal's behavior, whereas functional descriptions are subject to over-interpretation and may lead to anthropomorphism, and they may conflate explanations in terms of ultimate and proximate causes (see Allen & Bekoff 1997 for a discussion). Millikan (1993) and Allen and Bekoff (1997) provide philosophical defenses of relying on functional descriptions in ethology. While Millikan has claimed that ethologists should only be concerned with behavior as functionally described, Allen and Bekoff argue that the choice between a functional and formal description will vary on the context, depending on which is more useful. In many cases, functional descriptions will be preferred because of the advantages Hinde (1970) has identified. For one, behavior described functionally will result in fewer data sets, making for more robust data analysis. In addition, descriptions in terms of function are more informative than formal ones, given that they include information about the cause of the behavior or its consequence. Finally, behavioral changes can be described in terms of environmental changes.

However an ethologist decides to describe behaviors, the question of how to individuate a behavior arises (Russon et al. 2007; Skinner 1935). Descriptions of behavior can be finely grained, and refer to the specifics of a behavior, e.g. using a stone (or a leaf cup, or chewed leaves, or a hand, or fur, etc.) for drinking water from a river. On the other hand, behaviors can be roughly grained into larger behavioral units, e.g. using a drinking tool. If behaviors should be categorized to reflect the way the species organizes its behavior, then identifying behaviors requires first knowing the species' internal organizational scheme (Byrne 1999; Russon et al. 2007).

While ethograms are used to record typical behaviors, many researchers also collect rare and nonstandard behaviors, as well as behaviors that just have not been observed before. These reports are often referred to as “incidents” or “qualitative reports” rather than “anecdotes”, in order to avoid the negative connotation associated with the anecdotal method of Darwin's contemporaries. Researchers publish incidents when they indicate that a species engages in previously unknown behaviors. For example, when Jane Goodall reported seeing chimpanzee hunting and lethal intergroup aggression, the scientific image of chimpanzees had to be significantly revised (Goodall 1986). An example of a more recent observational finding suggests that juvenile chimpanzees may play with sticks in the way human children play with dolls (Kahlenberg & Wrangham 2010).

The psychologist Richard Byrne defends the scientific use of rare events as a useful research tool, writing that “careful and unbiased recording of unanticipated or rare events, followed by collation and an attempt at systematic analysis, cannot be harmful. At worst, the exercise will be superseded and made redundant by methods that give greater control; at best, the collated data may become important to theory” (Byrne 1997, 135). By sharing their incident reports, researchers have engaged in collaborative research projects to study rare or unusual behaviors, such as deception (Whiten & Byrne 1988) and innovation (van Schaik et al. 2006), and systematic study often begins with observations of spontaneous behavior (Bates & Byrne 2006; Russon & Andrews 2010, 2011; van Schaik et al. 2006).

4. Research Programs

The various research programs in animal cognition can all be seen as an attempt to uncover the underlying mechanisms involved in behavior. The functional approach aims to categorize behavior functionally (according to either ultimate or proximate function), and to discover the cognitive mechanism(s) that are use in such behaviors. The initial problem, of course, is to know whether the behavior counts as having a particular function; this is particularly troublesome when a certain function has a mechanism closely identified with it. For example, while communication understood by a biologist in terms of ultimate function is nothing more than an adaptive process of information exchange between two individuals that does not require cognition, the use of the term to describe a behavior may have Gricean implications to others, which in turn can lead to unjustified inferences about the about mechanism.

Animal behavior has been long explained in terms of what are sometimes thought to be “simple” associative learning methods such as classical and instrumental conditioning, or in terms of species-specific responses. Species-specific responses are what are sometimes called innate behaviors, but this term is problematic for a number of reasons (Bateson and Mameli 2007; Mameli & Bateson 2011), and has largely been abandoned by scientists; they refer instead to the predispositions demonstrated by typical members of the species or subset of species (e.g. the long call of the male orangutan). Associative learning comes about through experiencing relationships between events, and results in an expectation that the relationship will continue. However, the more we learn about the processes involved in building associations, and the more it seems we can do with them, the less “simple” and the more cognitive they appear to be (Carruthers 2009, De Wit & Dickinson 2009; Dickinson 2009; Rescorla 1988; Shettleworth 2010a). Other processes thought to be involved in some instances of animal behavior are transitive inference, causal learning, and path-integration. Questions arise about the nature and cognitive requirements of these processes, and their relation to associative learning.

The research programs in animal cognition are too numerous to thoroughly cover here; fortunately, there are good introductory texts that cover a variety of topics (e.g. Shettleworth 2010a; Roberts 1997; Pearce 1997). What follows is a brief introduction to three areas of research that have been of interest to philosophers: communication, theory of mind, and normativity. While these areas are the ones that have been discussed by philosophers, the choice of these paradigms is not meant to undermine the philosophical importance of other areas of research, such as concept acquisition, perception, causal reasoning, memory, culture, imitation, innovation, and so forth.

4.1 Communication

Animal communication is often described as information exchange between a sender who signals a receiver. Biological approaches consider communication to occur when one animal's behavior serves as a stimulus that causes a change in another animal's behavior, regardless of whether the signaler's behavior is intentional or voluntary; for example, a female chimpanzee's genital swelling that is observed by a male who initiates a courtship is an instance of communication. In biology contexts, this is often referred to as “functional communication”.

4.1.1 Referential and Expressive Signals

Those who argue that animal communication systems and human language are homologous (functionally similar due to common evolutionary origin) or analogous (functionally similar with different evolutionary origins) to one another have attempted to demonstrate that some animal signals are referential in some sense. One test for referential communication is to see if the behavior is flexible by determining whether there is only a probabilistic relationship between the stimulus and response. For example, if there are different responses to different utterers (e.g. infant vs. adult, dominant vs. submissive), this is thought to demonstrate flexibility in the behavior that is suggestive of referential understanding (Evans 2002; Tomasello & Zuberbühler 2002). In addition, it is thought that referential calls will encode specific information about the predator and that animals who hear the alarm call perceive that encoded information (Evans et al. 1993a, Evans 1997).

Marler et al. (1992) offer two criteria that must be met for a signal to be functionally referential. The production criterion requires that all the stimuli that elicit the signal belong to one category, either a general category such as “aerial predators” or a more specific one such as “eagle.” The perception criterion states that the utterance of the referential signal is alone sufficient to elicit the same behavior as would be elicited by perceiving the referent (Marler et al. 1992). Given these criteria, Marler and Evans examined the anti-predator behavior of bantam chickens, and found that the chickens reliably give different alarm calls to aerial predators and ground predators (Evans et al. 1993b; Evans & Marler 1995). Because they also behave differently toward the two different predators, Marler and Evans suggest that the alarm cries functionally refer to the kind of predator approaching. When a chicken emits a scream after seeing a hawk, they claim the chicken is referring to the hawk, and not simply expressing fear of the hawk, or ordering conspecifics to take cover, crouch, and look up to the sky.

Alarm calls and other communicative vocalizations that fulfill these requirements are found in many species. Gunnison's prairie dogs, for example, give different alarm calls to humans, hawks, and dogs/coyotes. In response to the hawk alarm call, only the prairie dogs that are in the flight path of the hawk respond, running into a burrow. The human alarm call elicits a community wide flight into the burrows, whereas the dog/coyote alarm call leads all individuals to run to the edge of the burrow and stand erect (Kiriazis & Slobodchikoff 2006). Vervet monkeys also give alarm calls for different predators. Following up on the field observations of zoologist Thomas Struhsaker (1967), Cheney and Seyfarth used playbacks of prerecorded alarm calls to demonstrate that when a leopard alarm is sounded, the vervets run into trees, where they are safe from the leopards due to the monkeys' agility in jumping from tree to tree. When an eagle alarm is sounded, monkeys look up and run into bushes. When the snake alarm is sounded, the monkeys stand bipedally and peer into the grass around them (Cheney & Seyfarth 1990). Other species found to have different alarm calls and different behavior for different species of predator include Diana monkeys (Zuberbühler 2000), Campbell's monkeys (Zuberbühler 2001), and meerkats (Manser 2001; Manser et al. 2001). In addition, ground squirrels (Owings & Hennessy 1984), tree squirrels (Green & Meagher 1998), and dwarf mongooses (Beynon & Rasa 1989) are all known to have alarm calls that distinguish between terrestrial and aerial predators. Many other calls and gestures are thought to involve referential communication of this sort. For example, the food calls of chimpanzees are thought to indicate not only the presence of food, but also the location or quality of food (e.g. Slocombe & Zuberbühler 2005, 2006). Similar findings have been reported for chickens (Evans & Evans 2007). Bottlenose dolphins are said to refer to themselves via their signature whistle (Janik et al. 2006).

In Darwin's The Expression of Emotions in Man and Animals, he argues that animal signals are expressions of emotions with the function of relaying the signaler's emotional or motivational states. These signals are largely species-specific and not flexibly used. For example, Darwin describes the cat's arching and hissing at a dog as an expression of the cat's terror and anger (Darwin 1886, p. 56). Ethologists followed Darwin's lead in describing animal signals as expressions of emotional or motivational state, and many ethologists thought that expressive signals were incompatible with referential ones. The assumption that animal signals are expressions of emotions led scientists to focus on questions such as whether animals communicate degree of arousal or motivation — emotional expression in analog and not just in binary, and many studies suggest that some do. However, since the 1980's there is a growing body of evidence that undermines the assumption that there is a dichotomy between expressive signals and referential ones, and some argue that animal signals can inform receivers about both motivational state and external objects or events (Marler et al. 1992; Manser et al. 2002). For example, we can see evidence for this claim from the research on suricate alarm calls. Suricates are a variety of African mongoose known to give different alarm calls to mammalian, avian, and reptilian predators, and they respond differently to the calls depending on the degree of urgency the call demonstrates (Manser et al. 2001). In playback experiments, suricates respond qualitatively differently to the three different alarm calls, and they respond quantitatively differently to different levels of urgency within each alarm call class. For example, in response to a low urgency snake alarm recording, suricates will raise their tails, approach the loudspeaker, and sniff the area around it, but they will quickly resume their previous activity. However, if a high urgency alarm call is played, the suricates will continue the alarm response behavior for a significantly longer time.

While it is clear that human language can simultaneously refer to external events and express an individual's feelings about those events (e.g. “Fire!” vs. “Fire?”), questions remain about the nature of reference in animal communication, and whether it is the same or different from how linguistic expressions refer. To describe a call as functionally referential is to remain agnostic about the role of cognition. Moreover, this leaves aside the question of whether the act is voluntary, intentional, or involves mental representations. Philosophical questions can be raised about the referential nature of animal signals in terms of their meaning, truth-evaluability, and the mechanisms involved. One philosophical treatment of the nature of animal alarm calls defends the view that alarm calls are best understood as neo-expressive avowals — self reports of one's present mental state that have both an action component (the expressing) and a semantic component (the representation) (McAninch et al. 2009). Allen and Saidel suggest that empirical work can be done to determine the kinds of referential communication different species can engage in, and that such research can help us better understand the mechanisms subsuming human language (Allen & Saidel 1998). For example, one might investigate the claim that dolphin signature whistles function as proper names in relation to various theories of reference.

4.1.2 Intentional Signals

Most discussions of intentional signals in animal communication at some point come into contact with the treatment by Daniel Dennett. In his discussion of the possible meanings of vervet monkey alarm calls, Dennett provides an analysis of the levels of intentionality that may be at work (Dennett 1987). Dennett suggests that animal cognition researchers would benefit from adopting the language of folk psychology. Moreover, he claims that animals such as vervet monkeys should be viewed as intentional systems whose behaviors are predictable via attributing beliefs, desires, and rationality to them; that is, Dennett suggests that scientists should talk about animal beliefs (understood in terms of the intentional stance, of course). The question, then, is what sort of beliefs do animals have when they vocalize: do the vervets think about the effects of their calls on the others' behaviors, or do they think about the effects of their calls on others' epistemic states or minds? That is, are they first-order intentional system who have beliefs but fail to have beliefs about beliefs, or are they second-order intentional systems that have, in effect, a theory of mind? Dennett's contribution is to suggest a method of testing for second-order belief in animals, which was influential in the development of tests for theory of mind, discussed below.

While strong criteria for intentional communication requires third-order intentionality, such that the signaler believes that the receiver believes that the signaler intended to send the message (Grice 1969), lower bars can be set. Perhaps the most basic requirement for a communicative signal to be intentional is for it to be under the signaler's voluntary control. In addition to neurobiological evidence that some animal signals are voluntary (Allen & Saidel 1998; see also articles in Platt & Ghazanfar 2010), there is behavioral evidence that animal signals can be used flexibly in ways that suggest voluntariness. Audience effects are one example of the flexibility that characterizes some signals. Roosters, for example, will alarm call more frequently in the presence of a hen than when they are alone (Evans & Marler 1995), and in the presence of a conspecific than in the presence of a bobwhite quail (Karakashian et al. 1988). Another example of apparent flexibility in controlling vocalizations comes from observations of chimpanzee border patrols, an extremely risky practice that may result in death following an intergroup encounter. As chimpanzees approach the border of a neighboring community, they become unusually silent (Mitani et al. 2002).

There is also behavioral evidence that animal signals may be context sensitive in the same way linguistic utterances are. Just as some argue that the pragmatic context of language does significant semantic work for humans (e.g. Stalnaker 1999; Sperber and Wilson 1986), both the production of and the responses to animal signals can be dependent on contextual factors. For example, while honeybee waggle dances communicate to the nest mates the location of a food source, the dance does not determine their response; if an individual remembers the location of a preferable food source, the bee may visit that source instead (Grüter et al. 2008; Grüter & Farina 2009). And, on the production side, there is experimental evidence that orangutans repeat a gesture when they are only partially understood, and will use different gestures when a message is misunderstood (Cartmill & Byrne 2007).

While much of the interest in animal communication has been focused on vocalizations, some believe that gestural communication may be a better place to look for intentional communication, especially in the great apes and especially if gestural theories of language evolution are correct (e.g. Corballis 2002; Arbib, 2002; Arbib et al., 2008; Pollick & de Waal 2007). Gestural communication has been studied in gorillas (Genty et al. 2009), orangutans (Cartmill & Byrne 2007; Russon & Andrews 2010), and chimpanzees (Tomasello 1994; Pika & Mitani 2006; Pika et al. 2005). Recent reports claim that orangutans also use sequences of gestures to communicate requests and other messages by acting out, or pantomiming, what they intend to communicate. For example, in the context of a head-cleaning game, a semi-free ranging young orangutan was observed to take a leaf from a human's hand when the human refused to use it to clean his head. The orangutan then briefly rubbed his head with the leaf, and then handed the leaf back to the human, who proceeded to clean the orangutan's head with it (Russon & Andrews 2010). Unsystematic reports of pantomime behavior can be found for other great apes as well, though formal research programs on pantomime in great apes need to be pursued further (Russon & Andrews forthcoming).

4.1.3 Symbolic Communication

In the 20th century there was great interest in teaching symbolic communication systems to other species. The earliest forays into this area were with chimpanzees, and focused on teaching spoken language to chimpanzees raised as human children (Kellogg & Kellogg 1933; Hayes & Hayes 1951). With the realization that chimpanzees lack the vocal apparatus needed to utter human words, research shifted to teaching chimpanzees American Sign Language and artificial symbolic communication systems. The first such study, Beatrix and Allen Gardner's Project Washoe, was initially reported to be a success. Using explicit training methods, including shaping, molding, and modeling, the researchers were able to train the infant Washoe to form at least 132 ASL signs. Focus was on production of gestures, rather than comprehension, and the Gardners' stated intention was to train Washoe (and later, other chimpanzees) in a social setting, mimicking the language-learning environment of children as much as possible. The Gardners claim that, “[Washoe] learned a natural human language and her early utterances were highly similar to, perhaps indistinguishable from, the early utterances of human children. Now, the categorical question, can a nonhuman being use a human language, must be replaced by quantitative questions: how much human language, how soon, or how far can they go?” (Gardner & Gardner 1978, 73).

While the Gardners' claims about ape language were being echoed by others working on ape language (e.g., Premack 1971; Patterson 1978), not everyone agreed. The psychologist Herbert Terrace, who used the methods of the Gardners to teach ASL signs to an infant chimpanzee named Nim Chimpsky, argued that the apes were not using the signs to communicate. Terrace concluded that some of the results achieved by the Gardners could be explained by associative learning rather than comprehension of the semantics of the symbols. In his study, he tried to control for associative learning, and his focus on syntax had him attend to symbol order in multi-symbol strings. While early results of this study seemed promising, after watching videos of Nim's symbol use he noticed that what had been initially seen as spontaneous utterances were often imitations of utterances just made by his trainers. Terrace reviewed films of Washoe's utterances, and found similar patterns: the teacher initiates the signing, and the chimpanzee mimics the teacher's signs. He also noted that the give and take rhythm of child-adult communication was not mirrored by the chimpanzee-trainer conversations, and took this difference in pragmatics as further evidence that the chimpanzees were not using language (Terrace et al. 1979).

Though the Gardners defended their studies against Terrace's critiques (Gardner & Gardner 1989), other researchers tried to control for alternative interpretations of their results. Premack, for example, relied on transfer tests as evidence that the chimpanzee Sara understands the symbols she was taught (Premack 1971). In a transfer test, a new symbol is taught only in the context of a subset of the subject's vocabulary. Once the subject reaches criterion on the teaching set, a formal test is conducted using novel strings of symbols.

The post-Terrace research on symbolic communication has expanded to include different species, such as the other apes, dolphins, parrots, and sea lions. In addition, the focus of some studies has shifted from syntax to semantics, and from production to comprehension.

Species Study Description
Chimpanzee Kellogg & Kellogg (1933) Co-rearing of a 7 1/2 month-old female chimpanzee, Gua, with their 10 month-old son, Donald, for nine months. Both were explicitly trained in spoken English. Though Gua failed to produce language, she was said to comprehend 95 terms by the end of the study.
Chimpanzee Hayes & Hayes (1951,1952) A female chimpanzee Vicky was raised from infancy as a human child for almost 8 years. Despite extensive training, Vicky was only able to utter four words.
Chimpanzee Gardner & Gardner (1971) Explicit teaching of ASL signs to a female chimpanzee Washoe in a social setting. Washoe was 11 months-old when the project started, and after 51 months of training she reached criterion on 132 signs.
Chimpanzee Premack (1971) Explicit teaching of symbol use to a 6 year-old chimpanzee Sarah in a laboratory setting. Sarah was taught to associate objects, actions, classes, logical connectives, etc. with plastic chips, and was taught to produce strings of symbols that obey syntactic rules.
Chimpanzee Rumbaugh (1973) Explicit teaching of a lexigram system to 2 1/2 year-old female chimpanzee Lana in a computer-mediated laboratory setting. Lana produced strings of lexigrams that obey syntactic rules. Later Lana's performance was said to be an emulation of human symbol use because she failed to grasp the referential aspect of the lexigrams.
Chimpanzee Savage-Rumbaugh (1980) Explicit teaching of a lexigram system to two male chimpanzees, Sherman (5 years-old) and Austin (4 years-old). Emphasis was on semantics rather than syntax. Sherman and Austin were reported to use the lexigrams with one another to request objects.
Gorilla Patterson (1978) Explicit teaching of ASL signs to a female gorilla Koko in a social setting.
Chimpanzee Terrace et al. (1979) Explicit teaching of ASL signs to a 2 week-old male chimpanzee, Nim Chimpsky, using the methods of Gardner & Gardner; failed to replicate their results.
Orangutan Miles (1983) Explicit teaching of ASL to an encultured male orangutan Chantek in a social setting. Chantek was 9 months-old when the project started, and it continues nearly twenty years later.
Sea lion Schusterman et al. (1984) Explicit teaching of comprehension of an artificial gestural communication system to a female sea lion, Rocky, since 1978, modeled after the bottlenose dolphin communication system developed by Lou Herman.
Chimpanzee Matsuzawa (1985) Explicit teaching of numeral use to a female chimpanze Ai in a social setting. Ai was 1 year-old when she arrived at Kyoto in 1977. Research continues on the language, numerical, and other cognitive abilities of chimpanzees, including developmental studies of Ai's son, Ayumu, using the participant observation method.
Bonobo Savage-Rumbaugh (1986) Spontaneous acquisition of lexigram symbol use in a 2 1/2 year-old male bonobo Kanzi after almost two years of observing explicit attempt to teach his surrogate mother.
Bottlenose dolphin Herman et al. (1986) Explicit teaching of comprehension of an artificial gestural communication system with some logical structure to four captive dolphins, Pheonix, Akekami, Hiapo, and Elele.
Chimpanzee Fouts et al. (1989) Social learning of ASL from a trained chimpanzee Washoe to a young naive chimpanzee Loulis.
Chimpanzee Boysen & Berntson (1989) Explicit teaching of numerals to an encultured female chimpanzee, Sheba.
African Grey Parrot Pepperberg (1999) Social modeling of spoken language used to teach the parrot Alex to vocalize English words. Alex was able to label objects by name, color, shape, and matter.
Orangutan Shumaker (1997) Explicit teaching of a symbolic lexigram communication system with some logical structure to the male orangutan Azy, ongoing since 1995.
Border Collie Pilley & Reid (2011) Explicit teaching of unique proper-name nouns (spoken in English) for 1022 objects to Chaser, whose training began by her caregivers when she was 8 weeks old.

Advocates of this research program argue that the studies uncover something about the relationship between language and mind, the evolution of human language, and the roles played by development and scaffolding in human language (Lloyd 2004). However, to the critics, these studies simply provide more evidence in favor of the power of association and the ability of humans to train animals to do nearly anything. There is a huge literature on these studies, with critics (Pinker & Bloom 1990; Pinker 1994; Chomsky 1980) as well as defenders (Lloyd 2004; Greenfield 1991; Savage Rumbaugh et al. 1998).

One area of contention has to do with whether animals that successfully use some aspect of human language are using it qua language, or are instead engaged in symbolic communication. At least three different demarcations between language and other symbolic communication systems have been offered. According to Noam Chomsky's original linguistic program, to use language is to embody certain structural principles, and all language users are able to produce a potentially infinite number of grammatical strings via recursive embedding (Chomsky 1968). The linguistic anthropologist Charles Hockett identified up to seventeen design features that occur in every human language, including semanticity, discreteness, and arbitrariness (Hockett 1977). More recently Hauser, Fitch, and Chomsky (2002) argue that the mechanism that allows for recursive thinking is the central cognitive requirement for language, and is a feature of human communication systems not found in other species.

Chomsky was a vocal critic of early animal language studies, especially of the claims made by some researchers that the apes had acquired language. For Chomsky, language requires syntax, which he claimed was lacking in all the communication systems of the apes. Furthermore, to train an ape to use symbols is a laborious process, whereas children learn language effortlessly. Language is innate, according to Chomsky, so if apes had the capacity for learning language, they would speak without human intervention (Chomsky 1968). Chomsky often states his criticism as an a priori argument against animal language: : “if an animal had a capacity as biologically sophisticated as language but somehow hadn't used it until now, it would be an evolutionary miracle, like finding an island of humans who could be taught to fly” (cited in Lloyd 2004, 585).

Another argument Chomsky has offered against animal language is based on the dissimilarity between animal communication systems and human language. He writes, “The question of whether other systems are 'like' human language is a question about the usefulness of a certain metaphor” (Chomsky 1980, 434), and he argues that the structural principles, manner of use, and ontogenetic development of ape symbol use is so different from human language that any analogy between the two would be very weak. Those who defend the animal symbolic communication system as language take Chomsky to task on this point, and stress the similarities between the two systems of communication.

Given findings in genetics, the biological capacity for language may be more accurately described as a collection of biological capacities, some of which we share with other species. The FOXP2 gene is found to play a role in speech production, and some claim that it was instrumental in the development of language in humans. The FOXP2 gene is also expressed in the same part of the brain in zebra finches, and it has been reported that finch fledglings with reduced FOXP2 are impaired in their ability to learn to sing (Haesler et al. 2007).

For overviews about the research on about animal communication, see Hauser (1996), Bradbury and Vehrenkamp (1998), Maynard Smith & Harper (2003).

4.2 Social Cognition

Social cognition includes a wide array of research programs; what follows is limited to research on animals' understanding of self and other.

4.2.1 Theory of Mind

Like humans, many species are social animals who, in addition to navigating a physical world, must also navigate a social world. In the 1970's it was suggested that in order to succeed in a social world, individuals would benefit from having some understanding of the mind of others. The psychologist Nicholas Humphrey was one of the first to propose that social knowledge requires theoretical knowledge of the causes of behavior (Humphrey 1976, 1978). Humphrey wrote, “...I venture to suggest that if a rat's knowledge of the behavior of other rats were to be limited to everything which behaviorists have discovered about rats to date, the rat would show so little understanding of its fellows that it would bungle disastrously every social interaction it engaged in; the prospects for a man similarly constrained would be still more dismal” (Humphrey 1978, 60).

The term “theory of mind” was introduced by psychologists David Premack and Guy Woodruff around the same time. The specific question Premack and Woodruff were interested in was whether the chimpanzee attributes beliefs and desires in order to predict and explain behavior, something they assumed that humans do. In effect, Premack and Woodruff wanted to know whether a chimpanzee is a Humean action theorist who understands the behavior of others as being caused by propositional attitudes. Thus, they defined theory of mind as the ability to predict and explain behavior by attributing mental states. Premack and Woodruff attempted to determine whether Sarah, the same chimpanzee from Premack's symbolic communication project, has a theory of mind. To examine whether Sarah understands what others believe, they used the following paradigm: Sarah was shown videotapes of humans trying to solve certain tasks (e.g. acquiring out of reach bananas, warming up a cold room by lighting a heater) and she was supposed to choose from an array of photos to pick the solution (Premack & Woodruff 1978). Because Sarah picked the correct photograph at an above-chance level, Premack and Woodruff concluded that she has a theory of mind. They claimed that Sarah must have been attributing “at least two states of mind to the human actor, namely, intention or purpose on the one hand, and knowledge or belief on the other” (Premack & Woodruff 1978, 518).

In commentary on this study, it was pointed out that Sarah could have used other methods to solve the problems. She could, for example, have attended to the goal of the actors, as opposed to their mental states (which is the interpretation that Premack now endorses (Premack & Premack 2003)). Most of the commentators were unconvinced by the design of the study, and several suggested alternative methodologies for examining the question. One suggestion was to require the subject to solve a coordination problem. In order to succeed in a coordination problem, the subject would have to alter his own behavior in expectation of what another will do (e.g. Bennett 1978; Dennett 1978). Dennett suggests that a good coordination problem might require that the subject considers another's false belief, so that the behavior being predicted will be an unusual one, such as a behavior that would only be exhibited if the actor had a false belief. A false belief coordination problem would thus avoid alternative interpretations having to do with identifying the actor's goal, or making associations from similar situations in the past. The behavior performed by an actor who has a false belief will not achieve the actor's goal, and will probably not be something the subject has witnessed previously. The main problem with this suggestion, Dennett notes, is how to determine the content of the predictions a chimpanzee might make.

Given the difficulties associated with developing a good nonverbal test for theory of mind (Dennett 1983), Dennett's suggestion was taken up by researchers interested in studying theory of mind in children (Wimmer & Perner 1983). Wimmer and Perner accepted Premack and Woodruff's definition of theory of mind, and become interested in the question of the stage at which small children acquire a theory of mind. To answer this question, they designed the false belief task, which was to become a standard test for theory of mind. Children watched a show in which a puppet named Maxi puts away a piece of chocolate in a box before leaving the room. While Maxi is out, his mother finds the chocolate and moves it to a cupboard. Maxi returns to the scene, the show is stopped, and children are asked to predict where Maxi will go to look for his chocolate. If the child says Maxi will look in the cupboard, she fails the test, and thus shows that she doesn't have a theory of mind. If the child says Maxi will look in the box, she passes; passing the task shows that the child has a theory of mind, because she demonstrates that she can attribute mental states and use them to predict Maxi's behavior.

The theory of mind research program was closely associated with a debate on folk psychology between folk psychology as theory (the view that human knowledge of other minds is theoretical in nature), and folk psychology as simulation (the view that our knowledge of other minds relies on using our own mind as a model). In the late 90's there was a growing acceptance that both theory-theory and simulation theory were partially right and partially wrong, and this culminated in a general acceptance of some sort of hybrid theory (e.g. Nichols & Stich 2003; Goldman 2006). These arguments make use of empirical data from both the developmental and the animal cognition literature.

During this time, there were a few attempts to uncover theory of mind in animals using nonverbal paradigms, without much success (Heyes 1998). Given the subsequent theoretical and definitional disagreements, some researchers have concluded that “the generic label 'theory of mind' actually covers a wide range of processes of social cognition” (Tomasello et al. 2003b, 239). The theory of mind research paradigm in animal cognition subsequently shifted from attempts to come up with a nonverbal false belief task, toward more specific questions about cognitive capacities like understanding others' perceptual states (Hare et al. 2000), goals (Uller 2004), or intentionality (Tomasello 2005).

There has been much interest in examining primates' understanding of perceptual states. Like belief states, other's perceptual states are opaque, and require the attributor to make a distinction between oneself and another. And like knowing someone's beliefs states, knowing another's perceptual state can lead to predictions about future behavior. Ethological evidence that chimpanzees monitor gaze and modify their behavior when they are visible to others (e.g. Plooij 1978; Whiten & Byrne 1988; Goodall 1986) was taken to provide evidence that chimpanzees can attribute perceptual states to others. As a result, experimental researchers decided to design studies meant to determine whether chimpanzees understand seeing.

The results of early laboratory studies were mixed; David Premack's research suggested that chimpanzees do understand seeing (reviewed in Premack & Premack 2003), whereas studies by Povinelli and Eddy (1996) challenged that conclusion. Later studies suggested that chimpanzees understand both seeing and intentionality (Hare et al. 2000; Hare et al. 2001). In Hare et al.'s experimental set-up, a subordinate and a dominant chimpanzee are released in a room baited with food. Normally, if both animals can see the food, or see one another witness the baiting, a subordinate animal will avoid the food and allow access to the dominant. However, in these experiments, when the food is occluded from the dominant's view, the subordinate will approach it. Only if the dominant can see the food or the baiting will the subordinate avoid it. The animals are across the room from one another, so the subordinate has to consider the visual perspective of the dominant in order to judge correctly whether he can see the food or not. Because it seems that the subordinate is able to make different judgments about whether to seek out the food based only on whether it is visible to the dominant, this study is thought to indicate that the apes understand the mental state of seeing.

Povinelli and Vonk (2004) criticize the Hare et al. studies, suggesting that the ecological nature of the study (using food competition behavior from the subject's natural repertoire) is a weakness of the study, not a strength as the authors believed, because the chimpanzees could have made inferences based on past observed behavior. In response, the authors claim that they have accounted for all possible alternative explanations for the subordinate's behavior, making an inference to the best explanation argument that the subordinate understands what the dominant sees (Tomasello et al. 2003a, 2003b; Hare et al. 2006).

In a review of the recent literature, Call and Tomasello (2008) conclude that there is ample evidence that chimpanzees understand others' goals, intentions, perceptions and knowledge, but that there is no experimental evidence that they understand false belief. Evidence for this final claim comes from recent studies, such as a turn-taking food competition study that suggests chimpanzees can understand other's knowledge state, but not their belief state (Kaminski et al. 2008). In this study, two chimpanzees take turns pointing at one of three opaque buckets in order to gain food rewards that may be hidden inside. In one condition, the subject chimpanzee observed two buckets being bated, and the competetor chimpanzee only observed one bucket being bated. When the subject chimpanzee was permitted to choose first, the subject showed no preference for either of the baited buckets. However, when the subject chimpanzee had to choose second (without having the opportunity to observe the choice of the competetor chimpanzee), the subject more often chose the bucket that the competetor had not seen baited. The authors conclude that chimpanzees sometimes know what others know. They then used a variation of this experiment to test for false belief. The subject saw the competitor chimpanzee being mislead about the actual location of the food, but was not able to make use of this information to predict the competitor's first choice. This suggests that the chimpanzees were unable to distinguish between others' true and false beliefs. While the authors claim, “These results suggest that, at least in some situations, chimpanzees know what others know, in the sense of have seen” (Kaminski et al. 2008, 229) there is some question about whether the chimpanzees can understand knowledge without understanding belief, so interpreting this behavior as understanding knowledge may be equally problematic (Andrews forthcoming).

Various worries have been raised about the design of the studies testing for belief and perceptual attribution in great apes. Daniel Povinelli and his colleagues have challenged the paradigms by arguing that in each case the subjects' performance can be explained by their having a theory of behavior, rather than a theory of mind (Povinelli & Vonk 2004). They suggest that a better test of theory of mind would require the subject to make an inference from self to other. Another critique comes from Robert Lurz, who worries that even the best tests of false belief understanding in apes fail to hone in on belief; instead, he suggests that ape belief attribution can be directly tested using a version of the appearance-reality test. Lurz points out that by considering the way an object appears to an individual, one can better predict that individual's future behavior toward that object than by considering the actual properties of the object. Following on this insight, he suggests that researchers ought to examine whether chimpanzees take into consideration how objects appear to others (Lurz 2010). Kristin Andrews argues that the general approach to studying theory of mind in apes is flawed, because the experimental paradigms require that the subject make a prediction. She suggests that the design of the experiments are based on the false assumption that humans must attribute beliefs when predicting the behavior of individuals with false beliefs. Andrews argues that human belief attribution is implicated to a greater degree in the explanation of unusual or unexpected behavior, and so researchers ought to examine whether and in what contexts apes might seek explanations for behavior (Andrews 2005, forthcoming).

Other methods for studying theory of mind in animals adopt the techniques used in infant studies. For example, Claudia Uller used a dishabituation paradigm designed to test for understanding of goal-directed behavior in human infants when testing infant chimpanzees (Uller 2004). Recall that dishabituation paradigms involve showing the subject a stimulus until it no longer holds the subject's attention, and then showing him one of two alternative stimuli. If one of the new stimuli gets more attention than the other, it is thought that the subject sees that stimulus as different from the original target stimulus. Gergely and colleagues used this method to study goal attribution in human infants: 12-month-old infants were habituated to a video of a small ball leaping over a barrier to reach a large ball (Gergely et al. 1995). After habituation, the infants were shown either the identical behavior with the barrier removed (e.g., the small ball moving toward the big ball and then jumping in the air before meeting the large ball) or a different behavior in which the small ball moved directly toward the large ball. Children looked longer at the first condition, and the authors concluded that infants perceive the small ball's action as goal-directed. Using the same paradigm, Uller found that chimpanzee infants respond at the same rate as human infants, but she suggested that more evidence is required before claiming that chimpanzees understand intentions (Uller 2004).

Recent developments in the study of theory of mind in human infants provide additional methods for studying false belief in primates. Despite the widely held claim that children do not develop a theory of mind until about four years old (Wellman et al. 2001), researchers using spontaneous response tasks claim that false belief understanding develops in infancy (see Baillargeon et al. 2010 for a review). Preliminary research using the same methods as the ones used in infant studies has found no evidence of false belief understanding in macaque monkeys (Ruiz 2010).

While the research on theory of mind and related abilities has historically focused on the great apes, researchers have more recently turned to look at other animals such as birds, monkeys, and dogs.

A number of studies suggest that corvids demonstrate social cognitive abilities similar to those of apes (Bugynar et al. 2007; Dally et al. 2006; Emery & Clayton 2004). For example, research on scrub-jay caching behavior shows that individuals who have pilfered another's cache in the past will privately recache food when a conspecific observes the original caching, but not if the original caching was unobserved (Emery & Clayton 2004). Naive scrub jays did not recache. Emery & Clayton suggest that the jays who do recache are engaging in what they call “experience projection...they relate information about their previous experience as a pilferer to the possibility of future stealing by another individual, and modify their recovery strategy appropriately” (Emery & Clayton 2004, 1905). Experience projection, they suggest, relates to theory of mind.

Studies on perceptual understanding have been conducted on rhesus monkeys (Flombaum & Santos 2005). Similarly to the chimpanzee and the scrub-jay studies, these experiments set up a naturalistic competitive situation in which the subject has to predict the behavior of a competitor. In one version of this study, rhesus macaques from the island of Cayo Santiago were pitted against human competitors in a foraging task; two experimenters would approach a lone monkey, and each would situate himself differently so that the monkey was visible to one experimenter but not the other. Both experimenters had one grape. Flombaum and Santos found that monkeys were more likely to steal grapes from the experimenter who couldn't see them. They found similar results for audibility; when given the choice of stealing a grape in a transparent box covered with bells, or a grape in a transparent box that was free of noisemakers, the monkeys preferred the silent food when no one was looking at them. However, when it was obvious that the monkey was observed, there was no preference for stealing quiet over noisy grapes (Santos et al. 2006).

While chimpanzees show some sensitivity to intentions and goals, domestic dogs may be even more attuned to the intentions of humans. Dogs are able to use the gaze of a human in order to determine where food is hidden, an ability not demonstrated in the chimpanzee (Hare et al. 1998; Hare & Tomasello 1999; Miklosi & Topal 2004; Brauer et al. 2006). Dogs appear to be sensitive to eye gaze in humans, and often make eye contact before initiating play. One explanation for dogs' social acuity is that in selecting for traits that make dogs better human companions, humans inadvertently bred dogs who are better able to pass theory of mind tasks (Hare et al. 2002).

4.2.2 Mirror self-recognition

Some research aims to explore what individuals know about their own minds. One area of much attention has been mirror self-recognition (MSR). In this paradigm, developed by psychologist Gordon Gallup, subjects are surreptitiously marked and then given a mirror. “Passing” the MSR test involves touching the mark more frequently when there is a mirror available than when there is not. Gallop argued that passing MSR entails that the animal has a concept of self (Gallup 1970), though others dispute this claim. While it was once thought to be a rare behavior, limited to some of the great apes, today many species have been studied and at least some positive results have been reported for the following species:

Species Study
Chimpanzees Lin et al. 1992; Swartz & Evans 1991
Gorillas Shumaker & Swartz 2002
Orangutans Swartz et al. 1999
Bottlenosed dolphins Marino et al. 1994; Reiss & Marino 2001
Asian elephant Plotnik et al. 2006
Magpies Prior et al. 2008
Rhesus Monkeys Rajala et al. 2010

Many other species failed to show mirror directed behavior, including some monkey species, which suggests to some that there is a corresponding cognitive mechanism that the above species, but not others, enjoy. However, it has been pointed out that there are ecological and biological constraints on this test; not all species are visually oriented, and some find eyes aversive (this was the explanation for studies that failed to show MSR in gorillas). For a discussion of these issues, see the collection of articles in Self-awareness in Animals and Humans (Parker et al. 1994).

4.2.3 Uncertainty monitoring

Uncertainty monitoring is another area of research that aims to investigate the understanding of one's own mental state (for a review, see Shettleworth & Sutton 2006). Subjects who know what they do and do not know demonstrate metacognition about their epistemic states, and several nonverbal tests for uncertainty monitoring have been developed for use with different species. The paradigm might go as follows: subjects are trained to indicate whether a stimulus is the same as or different from a sample. When the subjects respond correctly, they are rewarded with food, but food is taken away when they give incorrect responses. Once the subjects are trained on this task, the paradigm is modified to introduce a “bail out” key with the function of starting a new trial without supplying either reward or punishment. Interspersed with the easy stimuli are ambiguous stimuli that the subject is unable to accurately categorize above a chance level. If the subjects learn to choose the “bail out” key when they are uncertain, it is thought to indicate that the subjects are aware of their epistemic state. It has been reported that many species choose the “bail out” key in such a way as to maximize rewards, including dolphins (Smithe et al. 1995), rhesus monkeys (Hampton 2001), great apes (Call & Carpenter 2001), and human infants (Call & Carpenter 2001). Mixed results have been reported with pigeons (Sole et al. 2003).

Though such tests have been designed to test for metacognition, Peter Carruthers argues that animals can come to solve the problems without engaging in second-order reasoning. He suggests that the animal could be operating over beliefs and desires of different strengths, and that standard practical reasoning systems can be used to output different responses to the different permutations of weak and strong beliefs and desires (Carruthers 2008).

4.3 Proto-Morality

Recently there has been a resurgence of interest in examining whether other species share with humans any of the faculties involved in moral reasoning or ethical behavior. The growing understanding we have about other species have led some to conclude that at least some animals have morality or the ability to engage in moral and immoral behavior (de Waal 2006; Bekoff & Pierce 2009). According to continuity views, which state that different species have morality − or something like it − to some degree, the psychological capacities required for entry into the normative are not all-or-nothing. Frans de Waal takes this position when he argues that empathy and reciprocity are necessary conditions for morality, and that many species demonstrate primitive versions of these requirements. He takes these behaviors as evidence that animals have a moral sense, though one that is not as developed as the human moral sense. However, one might argue that an animal who lacks many of the cognitive capacities of adult humans can still be a moral agent because there are different kinds of moral agents, and animal species can have their own form of morality. This view is defended by Bekoff & Pierce (2009) who argue that some species have a distinct form of morality that is not a precursor to human morality. Because they take 'morality' to mean “a suite of other-regarding behaviors that cultivate and regulate complex interactions within social groups” (Bekoff & Pierce 2009, 82), they take the complexity of animal behavior, social organization, and cognitive flexibility to demonstrate that other species have morality in this sense. Central to the view is that different species have different norms, and that this makes animal morality species-relative. Despite the differences, they claim that the important similarities between species include the capacities for empathy, altruism, cooperation and perhaps a sense of fairness. Whether or not such claims about animal capacities are true is a matter of much current research.

4.3.1 Emotion and Empathy

Social cognition isn't limited to knowing the reasons another has for acting; it can include understanding the emotions of others. While out of vogue for some time, researchers are again attending to emotions in different animal species, and they try to account for the ability of some species to perceive the emotions of others. Studying emotion in other species is an important part of studying cognition because knowledge of another's emotional state allows an actor to respond differently in otherwise similar situations. Among social species, awareness of others' emotions is seen as playing an important role in regulating social interactions, coordinating behavior, forming bonds between mothers and infants, as well as in forming short-term coalitions and long lasting relationships.

At least since Darwin's The Expression of the Emotions in Man and Animals, facial expressions have been of interest because they can indicate individuals' affective states. Research from both the field and the lab suggests that facial expressions have the same kinds of functions for chimpanzees and humans (e.g. van Hoof 1967, 1972; Goodall 1986; Parr 2001). Just as Paul Ekman argued for universality in emotional expressions among humans across cultures (Ekman et al. 1969), animal researchers have argued that at least some human emotions are also found in chimpanzees, and that chimpanzee facial expressions are homologous to human facial expressions in morphology and function. For example, van Hoof has argued that the bare-teeth display of chimpanzees is homologous to the human smile (van Hoof 1973).

Lisa Parr's research demonstrates that chimpanzees, like human infants, are able to categorize facial expressions associated with different emotional responses. Using a match-to-sample paradigm, Parr and colleagues have shown that chimpanzees recognize at least five different facial expressions: bared-teeth display, scream, pant-hoot, play face, and relaxed-lip face (Parr et al. 1998). Given the salience of these facial expressions to chimpanzees, Parr and colleagues have argued that facial expressions are important behaviors for regulating social relations (Parr & de Waal 1999; Parr et al. 2000). Current research in Parr's lab is focused on the development of ChimpFACS (Facial Action Coding System − see Other Internet Resources) modeled after Ekman's work in emotion in human facial expressions. They are using the ChimpFACS to construct models of chimpanzee expressions in order to determine the configuration of muscle movements that the chimpanzees find salient in their perception of emotion.

Another area of study in animal emotion focuses on stress. As a response to potentially dangerous situations, stress is thought to be an adaptive emotion in the short term for humans and other animals. Stress is measured physiologically via levels of glucocorticoid hormones such as cortisol. In humans,cortisol levels are correlated with stress levels, and researchers have studied stressors such as dominance and status ranking in a number of different species (Sapolsky 2005; Abbott et al. 2003). For example, among baboons stress in the form of elevated glucocorticoid levels has been documented in females for about a month after the death of a close relative, in nursing mothers when a potentially infanticidal immigrant male arrives, in females when the female ranking system is undergoing instability, and in males when the male ranking system is unstable (Cheney & Seyfarth 2007). However, baboons do not appear to experience stress in the face of another's stress. Females are not concerned about male rank instability, and the death of a cohort's infant does not raise stress levels in anyone but the mother. It is suggested that for the baboon, stress is personal and egocentric, and the lack of sensitivity to the stress of others might be indicative of a lack of empathy as well (Cheney & Seyfarth 2007).

Some research in moral psychology suggests that empathy is a necessary component of moral agency, and animal cognition researchers have been examining whether any other species share this ability with humans. Empathy is thought to require the same cognitive sophistication as does understanding another's mental state or intention, but, in addition, it requires an affective response to that mental state. While the terms 'empathy' (sharing the mental state of another) and 'sympathy' (a friendly feeling in response to another's mental state) have distinct meanings in the history of psychology, folk psychology, and ethical theory, in animal cognition research the senses are often blurred and the terms are used interchangeably.

Early reports of chimpanzee empathy came from Russian comparative psychologist N. N. Ladygina-Kohts, who raised a chimpanzee named Joni in the early 20th century (Ladygina-Kohts 2002). More recently, Sanjida O'Connell analyzed thousands of qualitative reports of primate responses to the distress of others, and her results suggest that apes give complex responses in the face of others' emotions, compared to the responses of monkeys in similar situations (O'Connell 1995). Studies of chimpanzee behavior performed by Frans de Waal and his colleagues suggest that chimpanzees understand emotions, and respond to different emotional states with different behavior, e.g. consoling the loser of a fight, helping, etc. De Waal takes these behaviors to be evidence of empathy in chimpanzees (de Waal 2006).

4.3.2 Cooperation

Much of the research on empathy and altruism in other species examines helping behavior. Cooperation and helping between humans is ubiquitous, even when it requires that the actor suffer a cost, and even when the recipient is a stranger. However, because helping can be engaged in without empathy, and empathic helping requires additional cognitive resources (e.g. knowledge about how to help someone achieve their goal and the motivation to act on that knowledge), it is important to understand the limitations of the data.

Reports of naturalistic animal behavior suggest that many nonhuman animal species engage in prosocial behavior that may be empathic or proto-empathic in nature (de Waal 1996). De Waal often presents the famous example of Binti-Jua, a female gorilla at the Brookfield zoo in Chicago, who made the news when she rescued a 3-year-old human boy who fell into her habitat. Binti-Jua cradled the boy in her arms before handing him to a zookeeper. However, critics of the prosocial interpretation of Binti-Jua's behavior suggest that given her early exposure to doll play, an associative learning explanation is also possible.

Others claim that what may look like prosocial behavior may instead be a way of eliminating aversive stimuli. For example, research on rats and rhesus monkeys has shown that both species will cease eating when doing so causes shocks to a conspecific in an adjoining cage (Masserman et al. 1964). Masserman reports that one rhesus monkey almost starved himself to death to avoid shocking another. Alternatively, helping behavior among kin may be explained noncognitively as biological altruism. To determine whether other species engage in helping behavior that cannot be explained by other mechanisms, researchers have developed paradigms to determine whether chimpanzees display helping behavior to unrelated individuals. Chimpanzees are thought to be an especially good species to examine, given the range of cooperative behaviors they naturally perform, such as hunting (Boesch 2002), border patrolling (Mitani 2002), and coalition building (de Wall 1982). Cooperation among chimpanzees (Hirata 2003; Melis et al. 2006) and bonobos (Hare et al. 2007) has been demonstrated in a food-sharing task, but chimpanzees are thought to cooperate only when the dyads are generally tolerant of one another (Hare et al. 2007).

In the last few years, a host of experimental studies have investigated the contexts in which chimpanzees will act to help others, and compared chimpanzee behavior with human behavior. Differences and similarities have been found, suggesting to some that the evolutionary roots of helping behavior may be different in chimpanzees and humans (Brosnan & Bshary 2010; Greenberg et al. 2010; Melis and Semmann 2010; Yamamato & Tanaka 2009). In one set of studies, Warneken and colleagues compared the helping behavior of human infants and chimpanzees in a social setting. The experimenter made nonverbal requests for help, thus achieving a goal such as picking up a dropped object or opening a box. While both 18 month-old children and chimpanzees respond to simple requests (e.g. picking up a dropped object), children are able to respond to more complex requests (Warneken & Tomasello 2006, video from these studies is available here). Other studies found that chimpanzees help humans or conspecifics open doors to acquire food (Warneken et al. 2007; Melis et al. 2008), and respond to conspecific requests to bring a needed tool (Yamamato et al. 2009). Chimpanzees even help a conspecific gain food after they have already been rewarded, without the need for a request for assistance (Greenberg et al. 2010).

Other experiments failed to elicit any helping behavior, even when helping required no additional effort on the actor's part (Silk et al. 2005; Jensen et al. 2006; Vonk et al. 2008). In one study, the experimental setup allowed the actor to pull one of two ropes, one of which delivered food to only the actor, and the other of which delivered food to an adjacent chimpanzee as well as the actor (Silk et al. 2005). No preference was found for pulling the rope that rewarded both animals, even though the actor could see and hear the other chimpanzee. There was no significant correlation between another animal being present and which rope was pulled. Silk and colleagues conclude that “The absence of other-regarding preferences in chimpanzees may indicate that such preferences are a derived property of the human species, tied to sophisticated capacities for cultural learning, theory of mind, perspective taking and moral judgment” (Silk et al. 2005, 1359).

Several explanations have been offered for the negative result. Some suggest the chimpanzees may have been distracted by the presence of food (Warneken & Tomasello 2006), or that they are more likely to help in response to a request for help (Yamamato 2009). However, additional experimental results find that chimpanzees will help conspecifics acquire food even when there isn't a request for assistance; instead, the design of the studies may have elicited chimpanzee's competitive nature (Greenberg et al. 2010).

4.3.3 Punishment

Punishment might be considered the flipside of helping. Like altruistic behaviors, acts of punishment may lower individual fitness, so the existence of animal punishment is a puzzle for biologists. Across many species, individuals engage in aggressive acts in response to violations of their interests. However, game theoretical analysis suggests that punishment is an adaptive strategy for individuals living in stable social groups, and that punishment can help establish or secure dominance in a social group (Clutton-Brock & Parker 1995).

Experimental studies of primate responses to violations of their interests (or of group norms) have uncovered mixed results. For example, while capuchin monkeys will withdraw and stop participating in a task if they observe another monkey getting a better reward for the same task (Brosnan & de Waal 2003), chimpanzees do not reject an unequal division of resources in an ultimatum game (Jensen et al. 2007) (see philosophy of economics). Jensen and colleagues suggest that chimpanzees may not be concerned with fairness, and are instead rational maximizers of resources. In response it has been argued that just as what counts as fair differs among human communities, what is unfair to humans may not be unfair to another species; researchers should consider natural behavior in order to uncover potential fairness norms (Bekoff & Pierce 2009; Brosnan & Bshary 2010).

Other studies have directly tested punishment in chimpanzees. While there is evidence that chimpanzees will punish a thief who stole food from him (Jensen et al. 2007), currently there are only negative findings on the issue of third party punishment (Jensen et al. 2007; Riedl et al. 2010); in an experimental setting, even mothers will not retaliate against an individual who steals food from their offspring. However, since some field researchers report incidents of third party punishment in the wild, further research is required.

Experiments designed to examine the evolutionary roots of social norms are also suggestive. Chimpanzees look longer at video clips of infanticide than at other clips with striking stimuli but lacking norm violations (von Rohr et al. 2010). Whether such findings suggest that normative elements are present in animal communities is an issue that requires further investigation. Many questions remain to be answered (and asked). The mechanisms of altruism, cooperation and punishment, the existence of social norms, the affective requirements of moral reasoning are all issues that require conceptual analysis as well as empirical investigation of prosocial behavior in humans and other animals.

5. Animal Cognition and Philosophy: What Next?

Today we are in a kind of golden era when it comes to animal cognition research. Different species are being studied in the field and in the lab, and the results of these studies may be relevant to areas of philosophy including action theory, agency, belief, concepts, consciousness, culture, epistemology, ethics, folk psychology, imagery, language, memory, mental causation, mental content, modularity of mind, perception, personal identity, practical reason, rationality, and so forth. It seems that every day a new report is released, and many of these seem to have some theoretical implications.

Of course, scientific reports must be examined carefully to distinguish between methodologically solid findings and unwarranted interpretations, and it goes without saying that popular media reports of these studies are sometimes misleading. The epistemology of animal cognition research is ripe for investigation.

Animal cognition is studied by psychologists, anthropologists, biologists, zoologists, neuroscientists, and ecologists, among others, and while some textbooks aim to integrate these different disciplinary approaches (e.g. Shettleworth 2010a), and many extremely clever research methods have been used to test hypotheses, there are no unifying methods or disciplines that bring together all those working under the umbrella of animal cognition. To some extent, this is to be expected. Given species differences, we must expect that different methods be used to study them. Nevertheless, some general issues deserve attention, for example the problem of analyzing rare events.

Philosophy of animal cognition, as a subfield of philosophy of science, is one place where such methodological questions can be examined. For further reading in this area, see Colin Allen and Marc Bekoff's classic book Species of Mind: The Philosophy and Biology of Cognitive Ethology, and a recent collection The Philosophy of Animal Minds edited by Robert Lurz. For an introduction to an evolutionary psychological approach to studying animal cognition, see another classic, Sara Shettleworth's Cognition, Evolution, and Behavior. One more classic, from ethology, is Philip Lehner's Handbook of Ethological Methods.

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