Hermann Cohen

First published Thu Jul 15, 2010; substantive revision Thu Sep 17, 2015

Hermann Cohen, more than any other single figure, is responsible for founding the orthodox neo-Kantianism that dominated academic philosophy in Germany from the 1870s until the end of the First World War. Earlier German philosophers finding inspiration in Kant tended either towards speculative, metaphysical idealism, or sought to address philosophical questions with the resources of the empirical sciences, especially psychology. In contrast, Cohen's seminal interpretation of Kant offered a vision of philosophy that decisively maintained its independence from empirical psychology, without at the same time simply lapsing back into uncritical metaphysics. Cohen brought these attitudes to bear on a wide range of topics, writing systematically about epistemology, philosophy of science, ethics, law, political theory, and aesthetics. His anti-psychologism became a defining commitment not only of the Marburg School of neo-Kantianism, founded by Cohen himself, but of orthodox neo-Kantianism more generally. Indeed, that commitment ultimately defined the philosophical context from which, in the early twentieth century, both phenomenology and logical positivism emerged.

No less significant than his influence on academic philosophy, Cohen was his generation's preeminent German-Jewish public intellectual and religious philosopher. His philosophical ethics and political theory provided the foundation for a non-Marxist, Kantian democratic socialism that informed his more popular and topical writings. He argued publicly for universal suffrage and for the rights of workers to organize democratically-constituted collectives. He also saw deep points of connection between ethics and religion, and developed a view of Judaism as a profoundly ethical system of belief and practice. He argued that monotheism was the historical source of the idea of universal ethical laws, and thus that Judaism offered the world its first model of a universalist morality. This view of Judaism's ethical significance ultimately informed Cohen's public defense of the Jews' place in Germany not only against anti-Semitic attacks, but also against the arguments of early twentieth-century Zionists. However, Cohen's influence on Jewish thought extends far beyond debates within Imperial Germany: his late religious writings inspired a broad renewal in twentieth-century Jewish ethics and philosophy of religion.

1. Life and Works

Born in 1842 in Coswig, Germany, Cohen was raised in a devout family. His father was a synagogue cantor, and Cohen left Gymnasium in order to attend a rabbinical seminary in Breslau, Poland. But he decided against becoming a rabbi, and enrolled in university first in Breslau and then in Berlin, where he attended classes taught by a leading light in the history of philosophy, the Aristotelian scholar and metaphysician Adolf Trendelenburg. He received his doctorate from the University of Halle, after which, encouraged by H. Steinthal, he studied Völkerpsychologie, an anthropological investigation of the origins of cultural products such as art and literature. It was in a journal of Völkerpsychologie and linguistics that he published his first major work of Kant interpretation, an intervention in Trendelenburg's and Kuno Fischer's debate about Kant's Transcendental Aesthetic (see §2 below). That essay also marked a decisive turn in Cohen's philosophical orientation, and after two years in which he wrote on both Kant's pre-critical philosophy and the Critique of Pure Reason, he was appointed lecturer at the University of Marburg. Three years later, he was promoted to full Professor, a rank that was at that time in Germany almost never granted to unconverted Jews in philosophy departments. It was no coincidence that Cohen's appointment and subsequent promotion took place during Bismark's anti-Catholic Kulturkampf, a brief period of relatively liberal attitudes toward Jews. But following Heinrich von Treitschke's notorious 1879 anti-Semitic attack on German-Jewish writers and intellectuals, Cohen was compelled to enter the public debate about the Jews' place in Imperial Germany. His “Declaration on the Jewish Question” appeared in 1880, and questions of German-Jewish identity would occupy him throughout his career (Schwarzschild 1979; and especially Wiedebach 1997, Pts. 4–5). He remained at Marburg for almost four decades. After retiring from Marburg in 1912, Cohen returned to Berlin in order to teach at a rabbinical seminary, the Academy of Jewish Sciences. He spent four years there, writing principally about religious problems, until his death in 1918.

Cohen's period of philosophical productivity spanned the duration of the German empire, from the late 1860s until 1918. We can distinguish three periods in his writing (van der Linden 1988, 205–6; Bonaunet 2004: 22ff). The first, early period is characterized by Cohen's attempts to develop his own views as commentaries on Kant. During this period, he wrote Kant's Theory of Experience, Kant's Foundations of Ethics, and Kant's Foundations of Aesthetics. The second period marks Cohen's mature philosophical work, which took the form of his multi-volume System of Philosophy. In the System, Cohen explicitly abandoned central Kantian doctrines, and presented his views systematically, and as his own, rather than offering them as interpretations of Kant. The System included The Logic of Pure Knowledge, The Ethics of Pure Will, and The Aesthetics of Pure Feeling. (He planned, but never wrote, a fourth part of the System on the psychology of “cultural consciousness.” This fourth part was to provide the systematic foundation for the other three parts of the System [Adelmann 1968].) Finally, although Cohen had been interested in religious questions throughout his career, in the last years of his life they were his overwhelming concern. It was during this period that he wrote his Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism.

However, while Cohen's interests and views evolved over the course of his career, his philosophy from all three periods nevertheless exhibits points of deep continuity. All of Cohen's major works share a profoundly historical orientation. A concern with the history of philosophy dominates his writing, and he was convinced of history's continuing significance for philosophy in the present. But he was also concerned with the histories of those subjects he took to be philosophy's topics, including science, ethics, and religion. This concern for history permeates his thought so completely that even in his systematic works, he prefers to introduce concepts and theories not by defining them straightforwardly, but by rehearsing major episodes in the history of their development. This historically-oriented method was a model for what later philosophers called Problemgeschichte – that is, the history of the origin, development, and evolution of philosophical problems. In stands in contrast to historical surveys of candidate solutions to problems the philosopher conceives as fixed, unchanging, and unresponsive to a broader philosophical context. (In Cohen's hands, this historical orientation contributes in no small part to other aspects of his writing that none of his readers can fail to notice: its obscurity, repetition, and sometimes unnecessary length.)

Cohen himself came to think that one commitment above all else unified his philosophy, from his earliest interpretation of Kant to his mature System of Philosophy. It was his commitment to a philosophical method he claimed was Kant's, and that Cohen and his students called the “transcendental method.” What follows is a sketch of that method in Cohen's philosophy: how it emerged from his interpretation of Kant; how he sought to apply that method in epistemology and philosophy of science, as well as in ethics, political theory, and aesthetics; and finally, how he sought to articulate a view of religion as a necessary counterpart to philosophy done according to that method.

2. The Interpretation of Kant

Throughout his writings on epistemology and philosophy of science, Cohen was committed to two ideas: first, that a priori laws of human knowledge determine what counts as an object for us; and second, that philosophy investigates knowledge according to what Cohen would eventually, in his mature writings, call the “transcendental method” (Edel 1988). His early interpretation of Kant reveals both of these commitments in nascent form. It also reveals a problem that would occupy him throughout his later writings on epistemology and philosophy of science: the problem of explaining the origin of the a priori laws in human knowledge.

In 1871 Cohen published a long essay, “On the Controversy between Trendelenburg and Kuno Fischer,” and a book, the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience. They were both defenses of Kant against objections that Cohen thought badly misunderstood his views on objectivity and the a priori. Cohen was responding to an interpretation of Kant in the 1860s commonly held by figures of the Back-to-Kant movement such as Hermann von Helmholtz and Cohen's own senior colleague at Marburg, F.A. Lange, as well as by non-Kantian philosophers such as Adolf Trendelenburg. Very roughly, these figures thought that Kant held (or that Kantian philosophers ought to hold) that the character of human knowledge is determined by both objective and subjective factors. On one hand, there are objects that exist independently of the subject's mind. These objects affect the subject's mind, and in so doing contribute the objective element to the subject's representations. On the other hand, there are structures in the subject's mind—say, the forms of human intuition, space and time. Because these structures are in the subject's mind and thus don't come from experience, they are a priori. Further, these a priori structures organize the subject's representations and thereby contribute a subjective, mind-dependent element to them. But since on this interpretation of Kant the a priori is subjective, an explanation of knowledge's objectivity must appeal not to it, but to the objects that exist independently of the mind.

Cohen thought this interpretation of Kant was wrong, and he thought that influential objections to Kant depended on it. Cohen was especially concerned with Trendelenburg's well-known “neglected alternative” objection to Kant's claim that space and time are nothing but the forms of intuition. But Cohen was also concerned with J.F. Herbart's (and in Cohen's own time, Helmholtz's) contention that Kant thought spatial representations were innate. Since Cohen thought both Trendelenburg's and Herbart's objections depended on a misinterpretation of Kant, he thought those objections failed. He responded to them by defending an alternative account of the relation between objectivity and the Kantian a priori (Köhnke 1991, 175–8; Patton 2005). (See Biagioli 2014 for a broadly sympathetic account of Cohen's criticism of Helmholtz in particular; Hyder 2013 offers a defense of Helmholtz on geometry against Cohen's criticisms of him.)

Thus Kant's Theory of Experience is above all an attempt to articulate and defend Cohen's alternative interpretation of Kant's a priori. On that interpretation, Kant's aim in the Critique of Pure Reason is to show how a priori laws of human thought explain the character of our experience of objects. For Cohen, because these a priori laws are necessary, they are objective. So Kant's explanation of objective experience appeals to them, and not to the effects of any alleged mind-independent objects.

Cohen argues that there are three different “levels” or “degrees” of Kant's a priori. He claims that the first of these is inessential for Kant's philosophy, and consists in the apparently permanent “metaphysical” structures we can discover in our own thought by means of introspection. The second level of the a priori consists in the forms of sensibility and the understanding, that is, space, time, and the categories. But the necessity of these forms ultimately derives from the necessity of the third level of the a priori, because the forms of sensibility and understanding are “scientific abstractions” (Cohen 1987 [1871b], 83–84) from that third level. The third level is thus the most important of the three levels. Cohen argues that a priori laws in this most important, third sense consist in the “formal conditions of the possibility of experience.” Or, as he also sometimes puts it, the a priori in this third sense consists in laws that are “constitutive of” of the possibility of experience. For Cohen, these necessary, a priori laws define what an object of experience is for us. (Klaus Christian Köhnke identifies this point in Cohen as the source of the central Marburg School doctrine that a priori laws “generate” objects of possible experience [Köhnke 1991, 178–84].)

Cohen has a striking view of what a priori laws of the third level actually consist in, and of the possible experience they are constitutive of. Although he would emphasize this striking view more in later writings it is nevertheless explicit in the first edition of his Kant's Theory of Experience. He did not think the third level of the a priori consists in cognitive structures in the subject's mind, structures we could discover by doing physiology (as, for example Helmholtz and Lange thought) or by introspection (as, for example, J.F. Fries and, in Cohen's own time, Jürgen Bona Meyer thought) (de Schmidt 1976: Ch. 2.3). Rather, he insisted that these a priori laws were the principles of mathematics and the fundamental laws of pure natural science, that is, mechanics. Further, these principles and laws are constitutive of the possibility of experience in a very specific and, Cohen insists, Kantian sense of “experience”: for Cohen, experience consists in the theories furnished by the mathematically precise science of nature, considered as if laid out “in printed books” (Cohen 1877, 27). That is, on Cohen's interpretation, Kant's a priori has nothing at all to do with the cognitive activity of the knower. Rather, it consists in the laws of mathematically precise natural science considered independently of – as if free-floating from – the mind of any particular knower.

Cohen's interpretation of Kant is thus robustly anti-psychologistic: he thinks any consideration of how the human mind operates to produce representations is completely irrelevant to a philosophical theory of knowledge. In fact, some commentators have argued that Cohen offers the first genuinely anti-psychologistic interpretation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason (Hatfield 1990, 110; Anderson 2005, 298; and Beiser 2015, 466; see Beiser especially for an account of how the young Cohen arrived at his anti-psychologism). (Nevertheless, there is a case to be made that Otto Liebmann had an anti-psychologistic interpretation of Kant before Cohen [see Edgar 2015, 116-117; contrast Beiser 2015, 299-302].) Despite the robustness of Cohen's anti-psychologism, it is not always easy to locate in his writings. On almost every page of Kant's Theory of Experience (and later, The Logic of Pure Knowledge) Cohen helps himself to the language of transcendental idealism and transcendental psychology, giving the impression of an active, conscious mind, with faculties of sensibility and understanding that produce the subject's experience of objects. But, Cohen insists, this language is actually anti-psychologistic: understood properly, the Kantian's talk of cognitive faculties really refers to the methods of mathematically precise natural science. Thus the “faculty” of sensibility is really just the methods by which the mathematician constructs spatial magnitudes, and the “faculty” of understanding is really just the most basic set of concepts the physicist uses to represent physical objects (Cohen 1885, 586ff.) Kantian theory of knowledge thus turns out to be the philosophical investigation of the methods natural science uses to represent objects.

3. The Transcendental Method

So Cohen takes the theories of mathematical natural science to be “experience.” And he takes the fundamental concepts and laws of those theories to be the a priori laws that constitute experience's possibility. Why?

For Cohen, these distinctive views are consequences of his interpretation of Kant's philosophical method. Cohen and his students, Paul Natorp and Ernst Cassirer, would take this philosophical method to be the defining characteristic of Cohen's Kantianism, rather than any of Kant's particular arguments or doctrines (Cassirer 2005 [1912], 115; Natorp 1912, 194-5). As Cohen himself puts it, “[p]hilsophy is not ‘doctrine’, but critique” (Cohen 1885, 577), and it is above all the Kantian philosophical method that distinguishes Cohen's philosophy from pre-critical philosophy.

We can see Cohen's view of philosophical method in its nascent form emerge from his interpretation of Kant's Analytic of Principles and the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics. However, Cohen would articulate the method clearly only much later, in his mature writing. Only later would Cohen (and his students) call it the “transcendental method.”

According to Cohen, for Kant mathematical natural science is the starting-point of philosophical investigation. It is the explanandum that Kantian philosophy seeks to explain. It is then up to philosophy to identify and articulate the a priori laws in that experience that are responsible for making it objective. If it is less than obvious that this is Kant's method in the Critique of Pure Reason, Cohen insists, it is at least clear in the Prolegomena. There, Kant is explicit that he begins by assuming that mathematical natural science provides us with genuine objective knowledge, and that it contains synthetic a priori principles; Kant is likewise explicit that his task is to identify the necessary conditions of those principles' possibility, and that doing so will explain the objectivity of mathematical natural science. (Kant is also explicit that this method, which in the Prolegomena he calls the ‘analytic method,’ is not the method he uses in the Critique of Pure Reason, nor would it be suitable for the full project of the Critique. Cohen seems cheerfully undaunted by this textual anomaly.)

Taking Kant's method in the Prolegomena as his guide, Cohen claims that the method of Kantian philosophy is this. He thinks philosophy takes the theories of mathematical natural science as its starting point. It begins, as he puts it, with the “fact of mathematical natural science” (Cohen 1883, 119–120). Although Cohen does not emphasize it in the first edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, he thinks (and it is consistent with his views) that this “fact of science” changes as science progresses. On the transcendental method, the philosopher takes the best physical theories of the day as her starting point, and thus the “fact of science” will be different for philosophers in different periods of the history of science.

Further, Cohen identifies the a priori of his third level, the laws of mathematical natural science, with the synthetic a priori principles Kant thinks mathematical natural science contains. Cohen says of these synthetic a priori principles that they are “that which is present” in experience (Cohen 1987 [1871b], 206). So philosophy seeks to explain the possibility of experience by identifying and articulating the a priori laws “present” in it. As Cohen would later put it, experience, conceived as the evolving doctrines of mathematical natural science, is “given as a task” [aufgegeben] to philosophy: while experience is given with synthetic a priori principles already contained in it, it is the task of philosophy to identify and articulate those principles, and in so doing to explain how they make objective experience possible.

It can be difficult to see how this method allows for any philosophically critical evaluation of theories in the history of science – a kind of evaluation Cohen never shies away from. On the transcendental method, philosophy does not seek philosophical grounds for casting doubt on or rejecting mathematical or scientific theories. Rather, it starts by taking those theories and their objectivity for granted. It starts with them as facts, as explananda in need of philosophical explanation. But Cohen often criticizes and rejects theories he does not like, and does so for philosophical reasons. This is especially clear in the historical sections of his 1883 Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and its History, where Cohen uses apparently philosophical principles to criticize and reject various efforts in the history of mathematics to define, for example, limits and infinitesimals. But Cohen's criticisms do not violate the transcendental method. The principles that serve as the basis for his criticisms emerge from a philosophical investigation of theories given in the history of science. They are thus principles that turn out to be required for the philosophical explanation of those theories and their objectivity.

Cohen's student and colleague at Marburg, Natorp, would emphasize a major advantage of the transcendental method for Cohen (Natorp 1912, 196–7). This method allows Cohen to avoid what he and his students took to be the two major errors of other post-Kantian philosophy. First, because Cohen sought to explain the possibility of experience by appeal to a priori laws in it, he avoided the physiologically-oriented psychologism of Helmholtz and Lange, among others. But second, the transcendental method anchors Kantian philosophy to mathematical natural science as its starting point. This anchor prevents philosophy from taking off on the speculative, metaphysical flights of fancy that, in the minds of many Kantian philosophers in the 1860s and 1870s, decisively undermined the Idealist Naturphilosophie of the first half of the nineteenth century. For Cohen and his students, the transcendental method thus makes possible a philosophy that is properly scientific, without absorbing it completely into physiology and psychology.

4. A Period of Transition

Cohen's 1883 The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and its History and the second, 1885 edition of Kant's Theory of Experience reveal the considerable extent to which he modified and deepened his epistemology and philosophy of science over the course of the 1870s and early 1880s. In one move that marks his increasing clarity about his own views, he abandons the term “theory of knowledge” [Erkenntnistheorie] as irredeemably psychologistic, since it was too closely associated with psychologically-oriented projects such as Helmholtz's. Instead, he proposes to call the project of his theoretical philosophy “critique of knowledge” [Erkenntniskritik].

Beyond merely terminological changes, in The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and the second edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, Cohen offers a better developed and more clearly articulated account of the substance of his epistemological view. He calls the view “critical idealism.” The view is a form of idealism, because Cohen still maintains that a priori laws contained within scientific theories make it possible for those theories to represent objects. But the idealism is “critical” because it is Kantian – that is, for Cohen, because it is committed above all to the transcendental method.

Cohen's increased clarity about critical idealism emerged in part from work on the history of philosophy he did in the 1870s and early 1880s. He presents his view of that history in both The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and a long introduction he added to the second edition of Kant's Theory of Experience. As Cohen sees it, Plato and Leibniz play roles in the development of critical idealism that are second only to Kant's. Like Kant, both sought to understand mathematics as paradigms of knowledge in general. Further, as Cohen argued in his 1878 essay “Plato's Doctrine of Ideas and Mathematics,” Plato anticipated Kant in maintaining that the objects of our thought are explained by appeal to “ideas” (which Cohen, employing his characteristic form of philosophical charity, identified with Kantian a priori laws) (Edel 1988, Ch. 4). In contrast with this Platonic-rationalist antecedent to critical idealism, Cohen argues, stands an Aristotelian-empiricist tradition. Members of this uncritical tradition believe, in one way or another, that we must explain the objects of our thought by appeal to objects that exist independently of the mind.

At the same time, Cohen's willingness to reject certain Kantian doctrines reveals the extent to which his critical idealism was a commitment only to what he took to be Kant's philosophical method. For example, in one of the many sections he added to the second edition of Kant's Theory of Experience, Cohen argues that the proper way to understand the notion of the thing-in-itself is not (as Kant seems to suggest) as an object that exists independently of the subject's representations, somehow affecting the subject and thereby giving rise to her sensations. Rather, Cohen argues that we must think of the thing-in-itself as the totality of all experience, taken as an object of thought (Cohen 1885, 503ff). Since it is the totality of all experience, rather than merely the experience we happen to have at our particular point in the history of science, the thing-in-itself is the ideal that science and critical philosophy aim at.

The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method is perhaps most significant for how it presents a detailed illustration of what the critique of knowledge done according to the transcendental method looks like. The book is a philosophically critical history of the development of calculus. In it, Cohen aims to establish the validity of calculus' foundational concepts – concepts such as limit and infinitesimal – in the face of philosophical objections against them. He also aims to establish a connection between the concept of infinitesimals and natural science's capacity to represent reality. In fact, these two aims are connected. For Cohen, the concept of an infinitesimal magnitude is valid for use in calculus, because it is a necessary condition of the possibility of natural science's representation of real objects (Richardson 2006).

Cohen sees this connection between infinitesimals and reality in the section of the Critique of Pure Reason that Kant called the Anticipations of Perception. In the Anticipations, Kant introduces the idea of magnitudes that can vary continuously from a finite magnitude to zero. He calls these continuously variable magnitudes intensive magnitudes. Kant argues that there is an important connection between continuously variable magnitudes, sensation, and reality. While Cohen thinks Kant's concern with sensation is a mistake, he thinks the connection between continuously variable magnitudes – that is, infinitesimals – and reality is exactly right. The connection is this. For Cohen, mathematical natural science can represent real objects only if it represents them as having unique identity conditions. Those identity conditions are defined by unique locations in space and time. But, Cohen insists, the mathematical units that natural science uses to represent space and time must themselves be defined by appeal to infinitesimal magnitudes.

That final claim – that the mathematical units of space and time must be defined by appeal to infinitesimals – follows for Cohen from the principle of continuity. This is the Leibnizian principle that Cohen glosses as “there are no jumps in consciousness” (Cohen 1883, §42), which for him means that mathematical and scientific theories must represent objects as continuous. That the principle of continuity serves this function for mathematical natural science is, for Cohen, a fact of science revealed by his historical investigation of the development of calculus.

5. Pure Thinking, Generation, and Origin

However, Cohen would not remain satisfied with his account of calculus' foundational concepts and their significance for a philosophical theory of knowledge. His final major work in epistemology was the 1902 Logic of Pure Knowledge, the first part of his projected System of Philosophy. In that book, Cohen claims that there is an important connection between the concepts of infinitesimals and infinities, and something he now calls “pure thinking.” For Cohen, thinking is pure just in case it is independent of any and all influences that are external to thought or reason. Nothing is given to pure thinking – not the data of sensible intuition, not the activity of a Fichtean I, not the Absolute. Cohen claims that the infinitesimal calculus is the paradigmatic example of “the triumph of pure thinking” (Cohen 1902, 35). But more than that, he thinks an analysis of the infinite is precisely what first raises the philosophical question of pure thinking – that is, the question of how pure thinking functions to let mathematical natural science represent objects (Cohen 1902, 35).

The concept of pure thinking, and the closely related concepts of generation and origin, are central to Cohen's project in the Logic. All three concepts have to do with the principles that, on Cohen's view, define what an object is for mathematical natural scientific theories. In Kant's Theory of Experience, Cohen had been content to identify and exhibit synthetic a priori principles as “present” in experience. But now in the Logic, he is concerned with the question of those principles' foundation – that is, with their “origin.” His answer to that question is staunchly idealist. Cohen now argues that pure thinking generates those principles from itself. Or in his preferred idiom, pure thinking is “generation.”

For Cohen, pure thinking generates the pure principles of knowledge through judgment – the epistemic structure that, he thinks (following Kant), relates different concepts to one another. Consequently, in the Logic Cohen aims above all to articulate the twelve different types of foundational judgments that, he thinks, make it possible for mathematical natural scientific theories to represent objects. To be sure, Cohen's twelve types of judgment partly reflect the section of the first Critique that Kant called the table of the functions of judgment. But Cohen does not merely reproduce Kant's doctrine. Perhaps most significantly, Cohen abandons Kant's account of the three possible “qualities” of judgment and replaces it with his own account of the judgments of origin, identity, and contradiction. For Cohen, these judgments express the most foundational moments in the origin of pure thinking. Moreover, he develops his accounts of them at least partly from reflection on the concepts of the infinite, infinitesimals, and continuity. This should hardly be surprising, given his claim that pure thinking's function in knowledge is first revealed by an analysis of the infinite.

While the structure of Cohen's Logic at least partly reflects Kant's table of the functions of judgment, Cohen is also pains to emphasize another way he thinks his views break decisively with Kant's. In the Logic, Cohen rejects Kant's view that (in human knowledge) there is a faculty of sensible intuition that is independent of the faculty of understanding. In effect, Cohen now decisively rejects Kant's claim that sensible intuition is the capacity that immediately relates objects to the knower (Kant 1998 [1781/1787], A19/B33). For, on Cohen's view, mathematical natural science can represent objects only in virtue of judgments that express principles of pure thinking. In the absence of pure thinking, Cohen maintains, there can be no representation of objects. On this view, since a philosophical account of knowledge does not appeal to an independent faculty of sensible intuition, Cohen insists that the project he had previously called the “critique of knowledge” now becomes the “logic of pure knowledge.” (Cohen's view in the Logic appears somewhat similar to so-called “conceptualist” interpretations of Kant in the contemporary Kant literature. [For example, Longuenesse 1998, Ch. 8 and Friedman 2012.] So how radically one thinks Cohen's Logic breaks with Kant will depend on one's views of the conceptualist interpretation of Kant. I leave it as an open question how much Cohen's views in the Logic differ from the conceptualist interpretation of Kant.)

Cohen never gave up the view that the concepts of the infinite, infinitesimals, and continuity were central to a philosophical account of pure thinking and knowledge. Yet his account of those mathematical concepts was never convincing to mathematicians and philosophers of mathematics in the analytic tradition. Gottlob Frege complained that Cohen's views in the Principle of the Infinitesimal Method were too unclear to be intelligible (Frege 1984 [1885]). Bertrand Russell objected that Cohen failed to understand that mathematicians now had a formal treatment of continuity and limits that freed them of any commitment to infinitesimals (Russell 1903, Ch. 41). Even Cassirer, Cohen's own student, abandoned Cohen's account of infinitesimals, likely in response to Russell's objections. Consequently, Cassirer also abandoned many of the details of Cohen's theory of knowledge in the Logic.

6. Ethics, Jurisprudence, and the Laws of Human Action

Cohen thought the transcendental method must be used in ethics, no less than in epistemology and philosophy of science. He thus sought to extend its application beyond a treatment of the laws of nature to the laws of human action. He ultimately argued that the result of this application was a Kantian ethical justification for democratic socialism.

Cohen's first attempt to apply the transcendental method to ethics was his Kant's Foundations of Ethics, which first appeared in 1877. In it, he is motivated by a dissatisfaction that Kant could not provide a transcendental deduction of the moral law the way he had for the categories in the first Critique (Cohen 1877, 179). In the first Critique, Kant had argued that the categories are justified, because they are necessary conditions for the possibility of experience. But in the Critique of Practical Reason, he argued that the moral law cannot be justified as a necessary condition of experience, because we can experience ourselves only as beings whose actions have natural causes, and cannot experience ourselves as free moral agents. Thus, Kant insisted, the moral law must be the sole “fact of reason”—a fact that has no, but needs no, justification beyond the force with which it impresses itself on us (Kant 1999 [1788], 5:31, 5:47–8). Cohen thinks this was an inadequate justification of the moral law. He attempts to show that an improved justification results from transcendental reflection on the idea of a pure will, that is, the idea of a will that is not conditioned by any antecedent causes and is therefore free. With Kant, he argues that such a will is possible only on the condition that the moral law applies to it. But unlike Kant, he does not assert the actuality of a pure, free will. Rather, he argues that freedom of the will is itself a regulative ideal, an end at which we aim our actions (Cohen 1877, 199–201ff.).

However, Cohen did not remain satisfied with this account of the foundations of the moral law, nor with his early view of how the transcendental method applies in the domain of ethics. In his 1904 Ethics of Pure Will, the second part of his System of Philosophy, he offers a significantly revised account of both. Here, Cohen's account is shaped by two commitments. First, he asserts that the subject matter of ethics is humanity, that is, human moral agency (Cohen 1902, 3). He thinks the aim of ethics is to construct a normative theory of the human moral agent and its will. Second, unlike in his earlier Kant's Foundations of Ethics, Cohen now takes seriously the requirement that the transcendental method begins with a fact of science. For Cohen, just as epistemology and philosophy of science must begin by accepting the theories of pure natural science as given, ethics according to the transcendental method must begin with a science of humanity.

Cohen canvasses three possibilities for such a science of humanity. Ethics might start with a Fichtean “science” of the subject. But Cohen rejects this possibility as a lapse back into pre-critical speculation (Cohen 1902, 13ff.). Alternatively, ethics might start with naturalistic human sciences such as psychology. But, Cohen objects, making these sciences the starting point for ethical reflection would violate Kant's insistence that ethics distinguishes between normative and non-normative considerations, between what Cohen calls Being and the Ought (Cohen 1902, 9ff.).

Thus Cohen argues that ethics begins with the science of jurisprudence, that is, the science that investigates law and human beings considered precisely as agents whose actions are bound by law's normative constraints (Cohen 1902, 66ff.). Cohen does not have in mind a jurisprudence that is concerned only with positive law. Rather, the transcendental method in ethics begins with pure jurisprudence, which investigates the very concept of law and its essential features such as universality. Pure jurisprudence is thus the science of universal laws of human action. (Pure jurisprudence in this sense was one topic of German legal theory around the turn of the twentieth century. Rudolf Stammler's 1902 The Theory of Justice is representative.) For Cohen, this evolving body of pure legal doctrine constitutes a fact of science. Ethics according to the transcendental method accepts it as given. Then, by reflecting on this evolving body of legal doctrine, ethics seeks to construct a theory of the human being as a moral agent (Schwarzschild 1975).

Pure jurisprudence guides ethics in constructing a theory of humanity by overcoming a problem that, Cohen thinks, any theory of humanity faces. He claims the concept of humanity has a tension contained in it: a human being is at once an individual and a member of various pluralities, such as religious communities or economic collectives (Cohen 1902, 3ff). Further, the wills of pluralities of individuals do not necessarily cohere: individuals do not necessarily will things that are consistent with what other individuals will, or with what the community as a whole wills. But, Cohen suggests, without an account of what an individual may will consistently with the wills of others, we have no coherent account of the moral agent as both an individual and a member of a plurality. Thus any theory of humanity requires an account of how to reconcile individuals' wills within a plurality. As Cohen puts it, individuals' wills must be unified into a totality. Or, in somewhat less opaque language, we must understand how the universal laws of an ideal state can reconcile the wills of individuals and pluralities (Wiedebach 1997, Pt. 3). Finally, according to Cohen, if we want to think systematically about what those universal laws are, we must start by reflecting on the evolving body of legal doctrine provided by pure jurisprudence—the science of universal laws.

Cohen's emphasis on the universal character of ethical laws is clearly Kantian in spirit, and he certainly intends the universal laws of an ideal state to be the laws people must give to themselves in Kant's realm of ends. But still, it is not obvious how exactly to characterize the relation of Cohen's ethics to Kant's. On one plausible reading of Kant, a general theory of the moral will was the basis for his theory of law in the Doctrine of Right. But on Cohen's view of how to apply the transcendental method to ethics, ethics begins with a theory of law from pure jurisprudence and then, by reflecting on pure law, it seeks to construct a general theory of the moral agent and its will. Thus Cohen's account of the foundations of ethics might differ fundamentally from Kant's—indeed, it might turn Kant's account on its head.

7. The Kantian Foundations of Democratic Socialism, Aesthetics

However, while a doctrine of pure, universal laws makes possible a coherent theory of the concept of humanity, Cohen thinks the laws of any actual state will fall short of pure law's ideal form. He maintains that states, in the course of their development through history, tend to amend their laws so as to better approximate the ideal laws. Cohen does not argue from some antecedent philosophical theory of human nature that history is somehow compelled to exhibit this progress (Cohen 1902, 37). Rather, he simply accepts it as a datum of history: philosophy can no more deny this progress than it can deny progress in the history of physics and mathematics. At the same time, Cohen's optimism was tempered by an awareness of injustice in the non-ideal world: moral progress must be unending, precisely because no actual state will ever realize the ideal completely (Schwarzschild 1979, 139–40). There is, in Cohen's terms, an unbridgeable gap between Being and the Ought.

As Cohen saw it, political progress was, and ought to be, moving towards democratic socialism. The laws of an undemocratic state cannot genuinely reconcile the wills of individuals and pluralities of individuals, even if the state has the power to control their behavior. So, Cohen argued in his 1904 essay “The General, Equal, and Direct Right Vote,” any state whose laws make the wills of individuals and pluralities cohere must be one with universal suffrage (van der Linden 1988, 215). He thus opposed Wilhelmine Germany's system of tiered suffrage, under which lower-class men from some regions voted only in national elections and women did not vote at all.

Moreover, Cohen argued that, as states amend their laws to better approximate ideal laws, legal frameworks should emerge to govern the economic activity of democratically-constituted pluralities of people. In other words, he thought that an ideal state would allow democratic workers' collectives to own the means of production. In his Ethics of Pure Will as well as his 1896 “Postscript” to F.A. Lange's History of Materialism, Cohen argues that this socialism follows straightforwardly from a proper understanding of Kant's categorical imperative (Cohen 1902, 320). For Cohen, not treating people merely as a means entails not exploiting their labor (Holzhey 2005, 26). Along with Lange, Cohen thus advocated a socialism with Kantian, rather than Marxist, foundations. (The 1890 repeal of Bismark's Anti-Socialist Laws would have offered him some evidence that Germany was moving towards that democratic socialist ideal.) Cohen's Kantian socialism was an important influence on socialist political leaders such as Eduard Bernstein, a social democratic member of the Reichstag (Gay 1970).

Politics was not the only sphere in which Cohen thought philosophy must engage with culture. In the third part of his System of Philosophy, the Aesthetics of Pure Feeling (1912), he argued that critical philosophy could not leave art without a philosophical foundation (Cohen 1982 [1912], 1.4). In his aesthetics, Cohen sought to avoid Schelling and Hegel's view that art is an expression of ideas that can be distilled from it and expressed in purely conceptual terms. Likewise, Cohen rejected Helmholtz's physiological approach to aesthetics, exemplified by his physiological and experimental investigation of tone-perception in music. However, in Cohen's theory of knowledge and ethics, he had avoided these approaches by adhering to the transcendental method—that is, by starting with a “fact” of (natural or juridical) science and then articulating the a priori, universal laws that constitute that science's object. But for Cohen, there is no “science of art.” Thus for Cohen, a philosophical aesthetics must begin with only the “fact” that art is central to culture (Poma 1997, Ch. 7; Guyer 2008).

From this starting point, Cohen develops an account of “pure feeling.” Pure feeling cannot be the consciousness of the objects of natural science or the moral consciousness of ethical ideals. But these two domains of objects – the world as it is and the world as it ought to be – are the only possible objects we can be conscious of. Thus, Cohen argues, pure feeling must be the consciousness that we are conscious. That is, it is our basic level of consciousness of the fact that we can be conscious of both the objects of natural science and of ethical ideals (Guyer 2008). Further, Cohen characterizes that basic level of consciousness as “lawfulness” (Gesetzlichkeit) (Cohen 1982 [1912], 1.68ff; cf. de Launay 2005). According to Cohen, this lawfulness of pure feeling is what produces the object of aesthetic judgment.

Apart from systematic philosophical considerations, Cohen's aesthetics is of interest for the light it promises to shed on his philosophy of religion. Cohen came to believe that concepts central to philosophy of religion should be articulated by interpreting historical scriptural texts, including prayers and biblical poetry and prose (Kepnes 2007, Ch. 2) (see §9 below). Thus recent commentators have used Cohen's account of lyric poetry in the Aesthetics of Pure Feeling to help make sense of his account of an individual's love for God (Poma 2000), as well as his conception of compassion (Wiedebach 2002).

8. Philosophy of Religion and the Correlation between the Individual and God

Cohen retired from Marburg in 1912, in order to teach at the Academy of Jewish Sciences, a rabbinical seminary in Berlin, where he remained until his death. In 1908 he had written his Ethics of Maimonides, and after 1912 he worked above all else on religious philosophy, writing The Concept of Religion in the System of Philosophy (1915) and his monumental Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism, which appeared in 1919, after his death. The Religion's significance is difficult to overstate: it has been called “the single most consequential work of Judaic thought in the period of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries” (Dietrich 2000). In it, Cohen articulates a conception of a “religion of reason,” and argues that fundamental concepts of Judaism, as they are revealed in historical Jewish texts, were the original sources of that religion of reason.

Cohen initially faces a problem in defining the relation of religion to systematic philosophy (Holzhey 2000). In both the Concept of Religion and the Religion of Reason, he identifies the two central concepts of religion as humanity and God (Cohen 1972 [1919], 11ff.) But he had already offered philosophical accounts of those concepts in his ethics. For Cohen, ethics is the theory precisely of humanity. But also, in his Ethics of Pure Will, Cohen defined God as the conjunction of two ideas: the concept of ideal ethical laws unifying all humanity into a harmonious realm of ends, and the faith that, at the end of history, this ideal would be realized. Thus Cohen's ethics seem to offer complete, systematic accounts of both of religion's central concepts. Consequently, Cohen appears to face a dilemma: religion has a distinctive role to play in philosophy just in case his philosophical ethics offered only incomplete accounts of humanity and God. But this is unacceptable to Cohen.

Cohen must thus offer an account of the distinctiveness of religion in relation to systematic philosophy, and do so in a way that does not entail the incompleteness of his ethics. The crux of his account of religion's distinctiveness seems to be the vaguely Tolstoyan assumption that insofar as individuals are moral, they are alike, but that every individual is immoral in his or her own way. In the Religion, Cohen claims that systematic philosophical ethics is concerned with individuals only insofar as they are members of pluralities or humanity as a whole—that is, only insofar as they are bound by ethical laws. But this is not the only way to conceive of individuals. We can also recognize an individual's particular moral failings, and we can recognize the particular ways an individual suffers because of those failings (Zank 2000). When we recognize an individual this way, Cohen says (appropriating Feuerbach's vocabulary) we recognize the individual as a “Thou,” rather than merely as a “He,” a generic representative of humanity. On Cohen's account, it thus turns out that systematic philosophical ethics does not address certain pervasive features of our lived moral experience: our varied, multiple, and particular moral failings, as well the suffering they bring us (Bonaunet 2005, 49ff.). This is not, he thinks, a criticism of ethics for being incomplete. It is only the recognition of what ethics is, and is not, concerned with.

Religion, however, is concerned precisely with the individual's particular moral failings (Zank 1996 and 2000). While we can recognize another individual as a “Thou,” and so assess her particular moral failings, Cohen thinks the most important person to recognize as a “Thou” is ourselves. As he puts it, we discover the “I” only by means of the “Thou.” That is, we recognize our moral selves by recognizing our own particular moral failings. As he puts it, “[i]n myself, I have to study sin, and through sin I must learn to know myself” (Cohen 1972 [1919], 22). Without first discovering our own particular moral failings, we could not strive for moral improvement. But for Cohen, this process of moral improvement is inherently religious. Prayer gives us the strength to overcome our hypocrisy and self-deceit. And only when we do that can we confess, that is, acknowledge our own moral failings. This in turn makes it possible for us to atone, that is, to strive to realize our ethical ideals in ways that respond appropriately to our particular failings (Horwitz 2000; Zank 2000). Thus, for Cohen, knowledge of our own moral selves is the “deepest ground” of religion: “[t]he discovery of humanity through sin is the source from which every religious development flows” (Cohen 1972 [1919], 20).

By striving for moral improvement, the individual relates herself to her ethical ideals. But since for Cohen our concept of ideal ethical laws just is our idea of God (or at least a component of our idea of God), an individual's striving for moral improvement relates her to God. In Cohen's terms, striving for moral improvement establishes a “correlation” between the individual and God. This correlation is a profoundly personal relationship: since the individual confesses and atones for her own particular sins, she relates herself to God in a way that is similarly particular to her. In relating herself to God, Cohen thinks, the individual thereby constitutes herself as a unique moral and religious self, and God becomes her “guide on the long road from sin to virtue” (Cohen 1919, 20).

Thus Cohen maintains that there is a distinctive role in philosophy for a religion of reason: its distinctive concern is precisely with the particularities of individual humans' lived moral experience, and their attempts to overcome their various and different moral failings as they strive to realize ideal ethical laws.

Nevertheless, almost since before Cohen's ink was dry, there have been significant disagreements about the proper interpretation of Cohen's account of the relation between religion and his systematic philosophy, and of his account of the individual's relation to God.

Perhaps the most influential reaction to Cohen's was his friend Franz Rosenzweig's. Rosenzweig argued that Cohen's concern in the Religion with the concrete individual, expressed in the idea of the individual's “correlation” with God, constituted a decisive break from the Ethics of Pure Will's concern with universal laws of human action (Rosenzweig 1924), and thus that Cohen's views in the Religion were importantly discontinuous with his views in his systematic ethics. (This, even despite Cohen's claims to the contrary.) More recently, Robert Erlewine (2010) has offered a different account of how Cohen's Religion might break decisively with his systematic ethics. Cohen's ethics are concerned with how pluralities of different wills are unified into law-governed totalities (cf §6 above). In his Ethics of Pure Will, Cohen argues that different wills are so unified in the ideal state. But, Erlewine argues, Cohen defends a different view in his Ethics of Maimonides and his Religion. For Cohen in those works, on Erlewine's account, different wills are unified in the law-governed community of the religious, and specifically Jewish, congregation.

In contrast, others have defended the consistency of Cohen's views, arguing that the Religion completes the systematic ethical project he had started in his Ethics of Pure Will. Cohen's ethics is concerned with the constitution of the will, that is, the moral self. But this moral self is an ideal, and thus it is only in the Religion that Cohen takes up the question of the human self as a concrete individual. Consequently, Schwarzschild (1975) argues that Cohen's account of the concrete individual in the Religion completes the theory of moral selfhood begun in the Ethics of Pure Will. Alternatively, Poma (1988) argues that the religious idea of God, since it is the idea not only of universal ethical ideals, but of humanity's progress towards those ideals, provides a connection between the descriptive and normative aspects of Cohen's philosophy.

However, if Cohen's philosophy of religion completes the project of his systematic ethics, it is difficult to see how to avoid the implication that Cohen's systematic ethics were, considered on their own, incomplete – a claim Cohen himself was at pains to deny.

Thus a third interpretation seeks to avoid both the claim that Cohen's Religion is a decisive “break” with his systematic ethics and the claim that his religion “completes” those ethics. Michael Zank (1996 and especially 2000) has emphasized that Cohen did not intend his philosophy of religion as part of the System of Philosophy, but nor can the philosophy of religion be in any sense a “break” from the Ethics of Pure Will in his System, since he started working on both projects at roughly the same time around the turn of the century. Cohen's systematic philosophy and his philosophy of religion thus stand as complements to each other: whereas one conceives the human as an ideal agent constituted by universal ethical laws, the other treats the human as a concrete individual, constituted by the particularities of his own moral failings and attempts to atone for them.

9. Monotheism and Prophetic Messianism

Cohen's second aim in the Religion is to show that Judaism has what he calls a special “methodological” significance for philosophy of religion, because it is the original historical source of a religion of reason (Cohen 1972 [1919], 8). Judaism has this special status because it was, Cohen contends, the original monotheistic religion, and only monotheistic religions can be religions of reason. The polytheism of the ancient world posited different gods for different peoples in different places. But, Cohen argues, since reason is a “universal human power” that belongs to all humanity (Cohen 1972 [1919], 7–8), a religion of reason cannot recognize different gods for different people, but must recognize a single, unique God for all humanity. Since the idea of such a God first emerged in history with Judaism, it is the original source of a religion of reason. Consequently, the investigation of a religion of reason must recover that religion's source by interpreting the historical scriptures and liturgical practices of Judaism (Kepnes 2007, Ch. 2).

According to Cohen, monotheism, and so too Judaism, was the historical source of the idea that all humanity could be unified by a single set of ethical laws. As Cohen sees it, God is the set of ideal ethical laws. To assert that there is only one God for all of humanity is thus to assert a universal ethical ideal, one on which individuals see all people as “fellow humans,” and not as “others” who can be excluded from the moral community (Cohen 1972 [1919], 14ff). Later religious scholars such as Wendell Dietrich would call this doctrine “ethical monotheism” (Cf. Dietrich 1986 and Theodore and Hadley 2001). Cohen thinks that because monotheism has an ethical dimension, it culminates in—its highest form is—a view he calls prophetic messianism. For Cohen, messianism just is “the dominion of the good on earth.” It is the view that the Messiah's coming consists in nothing but the ultimate end of injustice (Cohen 1972 [1919], 21). Prophetic messianism is thus an expression of faith that humanity is making progress towards realizing ideal ethical laws.

Cohen's conception of the essentially ethical nature of Judaism had important consequences for his view of Judaism's relation to other religions, as well as his views of Zionism and the Jews' place in Wilhelmine Germany. Because Cohen thought the ethical nature of Judaism was expressed by its monotheism, he believed that at least some forms of Christianity had the same ethical nature. While for Cohen Judaism was the original religion of reason, liberal Protestantism expresses universal ethical ideals and is a religion of reason as well. (He thought Catholicism failed to express properly universal ideals. He seems not to have considered Islam.) At the same time, because for Cohen Judaism ultimately aims at an ethical ideal that includes all humanity, he rejected the nationalism he saw in non-liberal forms of Judaism and was a vocal critic of Zionism. In a public exchange with Martin Buber, Cohen argued that Jews had an obligation to remain in their countries of birth, so that their religious communities could serve as exemplars for the rest of humanity of communities unified by ethical laws. He died in 1919, before the increasing virulence of antisemitism in Germany could make him reconsider this argument.

10. Cohen's Influence

The range of Cohen's influence is wide. Few figures are as important for Jewish ethics and philosophy of religion in the twentieth century, and in the last four decades religious scholars have devoted considerable attention to understanding Cohen's significance as a religious thinker and public intellectual. More recently, historians of philosophy in the analytic tradition have begun to appreciate the importance of Cohen's neo-Kantianism as a source not only of influential interpretations of Kant, but of the topics and methods characteristic of philosophy of science in the twentieth century.

In Jewish religious thought, Cohen's influence is highly visible, and substantive doctrines he developed in the Ethics of Pure Will and the Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism are still topics of debate. Martin Buber's 1923 I and Thou was explicitly indebted to, and a response to, Cohen's Religion. Inspired by Cohen (see §8 above), Buber elaborated an account of a relationship between the “I” and the “Thou.” Like Cohen, for Buber this relation is the central part of how an individual establishes a profoundly personal relationship with God. Also like Cohen, Buber thinks establishing that relationship with God is essential to strengthening the ethical bonds in one's community. But unlike Cohen, Buber thought the I-Thou relationship was essentially beyond language's ability to express—a view strikingly at odds with Cohen's rationalist philosophical tendencies.

More recently, religious ethicists have been interested in Cohen's view that monotheism expresses a universalist morality, and that it expressed for the first time in history the idea that all humanity must be subject to the same ethical laws. The religious scholar Wendell Dietrich (Dietrich 1986) identifies this view as “ethical monotheism,” and sees Cohen as the first in a trajectory of religious philosophers who argue that the concept of a unique God is necessary for—or whose essential content is revealed to us as (Gibbs 2001)—ethical laws and the freedom to live according to them. Avi Bernstein-Nahar (1998 and 2006) argues that Cohen's ethics, and perhaps his ethical monotheism in particular, provide the intellectual basis for a Jewish identity that can be shared by various Jewish communities that might otherwise have little in common. On this view, Cohen's ethics thus have a central role to play in Jewish education.

Cohen's influence on Anglo-American analytic philosophy is less visible. Perhaps the only area of Anglo-American philosophy where a substantive doctrine of Cohen's is still respected is Kant interpretation. Before Cohen's Kant's Theory of Experience, interpretations of Kant were overwhelmingly—some have claimed exclusively—psychologistic in one way or another (see §2 above). Some of those interpretations attributed to Kant a form of idealistic transcendental psychology, what Hegel called “subjective idealism.” Others attributed to Kant some form of empirical psychologism. But Cohen denies that Kant is interested in how the mind—either the transcendental mind or the empirical mind—operates to synthesize the knower's representations. For Cohen, Kant is interested in knowledge considered as if laid out “in printed books” (Cohen 1877, 27).

Cohen is thus at the head of a tradition of anti-psychologistic interpretations of Kant that includes Kant scholars such as Peter Strawson and, more recently, Henry Allison. It would overstate Cohen's influence to suggest that he directly inspired, say, Strawson's interpretation of Kant. But the anti-psychologistic philosophical environment in which Strawson produced his Kant interpretation owed a great deal to Cohen's influence. (Cf. Edel 1993 for a discussion of Cohen's anti-psychologism in relation to the tradition of analytic philosophy to which Strawson belongs.) Further, as English-language Kant interpretation became more sophisticated over the second half of the twentieth century and engaged more seriously with existing German literature, historians of philosophy like Allison found themselves at home in a much longer German tradition of anti-psychologistic Kant interpretation going back directly to Cohen. That anti-psychologistic tradition dominated Anglo-American Kant interpretation for the latter decades of the twentieth century and is still the majority view today.

However, it would be a mistake to limit a survey of Cohen's influence on contemporary analytic philosophy to the doctrines of his that are still alive today. Arguably his most profound influence on analytic philosophy has not been to give us particular philosophical doctrines, but to contribute to the basic shape, the basic orientation of an entire major subdiscipline of philosophy. Nowhere is this more evident than in history and philosophy of science (cf. Patton 2005).

Recent history of philosophy of science has become increasingly aware of neo-Kantianism's influence on philosophy of science in the twentieth century. It is thus worth taking seriously Cohen's role in shaping twentieth-century philosophy of science. His commitment to the transcendental method lead him to a view of epistemology, and theoretical philosophy more generally, as essentially a philosophically critical account of the historical development of concepts in the mathematically-precise natural sciences. This view of a historically-oriented philosophy of science is nowhere more clear in Cohen's work than in his Principle of the Infinitesimal Method. There are two significant points about the view he expresses there. First, for Cohen, the theory of knowledge begins by accepting a body of existing science, and then gives a philosophical reconstruction of important concepts and developments in that science's history. Second, Cohen thinks the principal topic of the theory of knowledge is mathematically-precise natural science—paradigmatically mathematics and physics (Richardson 2006). Cohen's disciple, Ernst Cassirer, would carry out this program in, among other writings, three books on the history and philosophy of physics.

But philosophers far beyond the Marburg School were influenced by Cohen's insistence that the philosophical reconstruction of scientific theories is the principal method of the theory of knowledge, and that its principal topic is mathematically-precise natural science. Logical positivist philosophy of science took up aspects of Cohen's project, including its central concern with mathematics and physics. Like Cohen, positivists also thought philosophy should accept existing bodies of science as a starting point, and should seek to reconstruct that science's theories and methods, even though they thought modern logic was the proper tool for carrying out their reconstructions. Recent scholarship on logical positivism, and especially on Rudolf Carnap, has emphasized its intellectual debts to Marburg School neo-Kantianism. (Cf. Friedman 1999 and 2000; Richardson 1998 and especially 2006.) Conversely, a French tradition of philosophy of science emphasized a different aspect of Cohen's project. The neo-Kantian Emile Meyerson, and his intellectual heirs, Alexandre Koyré and ultimately Thomas Kuhn, emphasized a more deeply historical reconstruction of scientific theories and methods. Finally, more recent philosophy of science has seen a turn back to views even more explicitly inspired by Marburg School doctrines: most prominently, Michael Friedman has defended the view that in reconstructing scientific theories, philosophy should seek to articulate the “constitutively a priori” principles in those theories—that is, principles that are constitutive of the possibility of experience in precisely Cohen's sense (Friedman 2001). More generally, although twentieth-century history and philosophy of science did not always take seriously Cohen's substantive doctrines, it was nevertheless affected profoundly by his vision of philosophy as the reconstruction of historical developments in mathematically-precise natural science.


Selected Works by Cohen

For a complete bibliography of Cohen's works, see Holzhey 1986, 1.355–383.

  • 1977–2005, Werke. H. Holzhey and H. Weidebach (eds.), Hildesheim: G. Olms.
  • 1871a, “Zur Controverse zwischen Trendelenburg und Kuno Fischer,” [“On the Controversy between Trendelenburg and Kuno Fischer,”] Zeitschrift für Völkerpsychologie and Sprachewissenschaft, 7 (1871): 249–296.
  • 1871b/1885, Kants Theorie der Erfahrung, [Kant's Theory of Experience,] Berlin: Dümmler. [One central chapter of the 1885 edition is translated as 2015, “The Synthetic Principles,” D. Hyder (trans.), in S. Luft (ed.), The Neo-Kantian Reader, Oxford: Routledge.]
  • 1873, Die systematische Begriffe in Kants vorkritische Schriften nach ihrem Verhältniss zum kritischen Idealismus, [Systematic Concepts in Kant's Pre-critical Writings according to their relation to Critical Idealism,] Berlin: Dümmler.
  • 1877, Kants Begründung der Ethik [Kant's Grounding of Ethics], Berlin: Dümmler.
  • 1878, “Platons Ideenlehre und die Mathematik,” [“Plato's Doctrine of Ideas and Mathematics,”] Rectoratsprogramm der Univerisität Marburg, Marburg: Elwertsche.
  • 1883, Das Prinzip der Infinitesimal-Methode and seine Geschichte: Ein Kapitel zur Grundlegung der Erkenntniskritik, [The Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and its History: a Chapter of the Foundations of the Critique of Knowledge,] Berlin: Dümmler. [A short selection is translated as 2015, “Introduction,” D. Hyder and L. Patton (trans.), in S. Luft (ed.), The Neo-Kantian Reader, Oxford: Routledge.]
  • 1889, Kants Begründung der Ästhetik, [Kant's Foundations of the Aesthetics,] Berlin: Dümmler.
  • 1902a, System der Philosophie, Erster Teil: Logik der reinen Erkenntnis, [System of Philosophy, First Part: Logic of Pure Knowledge,] Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • 1902b, “Biographisches Vorwort und kritischem Nachtrag,” [“Biographical Forward and Critical Supplement,”] in F.A. Lange, Geschichte des Materialismus und Kritik seiner Bedeutung in der Gegenwart, Iserlohn und Leipzig: Baedeker.
  • 1904/1907, System der Philosophie, Zweiter Teil: Ethik der reinen Willens. [System of Philosophy, Second Part: Ethics of Pure Will,] Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • 1907, Kommentar zu Immanuel Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft, [Commentary on Kant's Critique of Pure Reason,] Leipizig: Meiner.
  • 1912, System der Philosophie, Dritter Teil: Ästhetik der reinen Gefühls, [System of Philosophy, Third Part: Aesthetic of Pure Feeling,] Berlin: Bruno Cassirer.
  • 1915, Der Begriffe der Religion im System der Philosophie, [The Concept of Religion in System of Philosophy,] Geissen: Töpelmann.
  • 1919, Die Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums, Leipzig: Fock. Translated as: Cohen H., 1972, Religion of Reason: Out of the Sources of Judaism, trans. Simon Kaplan, New York: Frederick Unger.
  • 1924, Jüdische Schriften, ed. B. Strauss, Berlin: Schwetschke. Partially translated as: Cohen, H., 1971, Reason and Hope: Selections from the Jewish Writings of Hermann Cohen, trans. Eva Jospe, New York: Norton and Norton.
  • 1971 (1908), “Charakteristik der Ethik Maimunis,” in W. Bacher, M. Brann, D. Simonsen, and J. Guttman (eds.), Moses ben Maimon: Sein Leben, seine Werke, und seine Einfluss, Hildesheim: Georg Olms. Translated as: Cohen H., 2004, Ethics of Maimonides, trans. with extensive comnmentary A. Sh. Bruckstein, Madison, WI: Univerity of Wisconsin Press.

Selected Secondary Literature

General Commentary

  • Adelmann, D., 1968, Einheit des Buwusstsein als Grundproblem der Philosophie Hermann Cohens, Heidelberg.
  • –––, 2010, “Reinige dein Denken”: Über den jüdischen Hintergrund der Philosophie von Hermann Cohen, G. Hasselhoff (ed.), Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Cassirer, E., 1912, “Hermann Cohen und die Erneuerung der kantische Philosophie,” Kant-studien, 17: 252-273. Translated as: Cohen H., 2005, “Hermann Cohen and the Renewal of Kantian Philosophy,” trans. Lydia Patton, Angelaki, 10(1): 113–125.
  • –––, 1943, “Hermann Cohen, 1842–1918,” Social Research, 10(1/4): 219–232.
  • Dufour, É., 2001, Hermann Cohen: Introduction au Néokantisme de Marbourg, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • –––, 2003, Les Néokantiens: Valuer et Vérité, Paris: Vrin.
  • Ebbinghaus, J., 1959, “Zur Berufung Cohens auf den Marburger Lehrstuhl,” Archiv für Philosophie, 9: 90–92.
  • –––, 1967, “Hermann Cohen,” in P. Edwards, The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, New York: Collier-Macmillan.
  • Holzhey, H., 1986, Cohen und Natorp, Basel: Schwabe & Co.
  • –––, 2005, “Cohen and the Marburg School in Context,” in (Munk, 2005).
  • Munk, R. (ed.), 2005, Hermann Cohen's Critical Idealism, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Natorp, P., 1912, “Kant und die Marburger Schule,” Kant-studien, 17: 193-221.
  • Poma, A., 1997, The Critical Philosophy of Hermann Cohen, trans. John Denton, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Sieg, U., 1994, Aufstieg und Niedergang des Marburger Neukantianismus: Die Geschichte einer philosophischen Schulgemeinschaft, Würzburg: Königshausen und Neumann.

Kant Interpretation, Epistemology, and Philosophy of Science

  • Anderson, R.L., 2005, “Neo-Kantianism and the Roots of Anti-Psychologism,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 13(2): 287–323.
  • Beiser, F., 2015, The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism: 1796-1880, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Biagioli, F., 2014, “Hermann Cohen and Alois Riehl on Geometrical Empiricism,” HOPOS, 4(1): 83-105.
  • Dufour, É., 2003, “Remarques sur la Note du Paragraphe 26 de l'Analytique Transcendentale: Les Interprétations de Cohen et Heidegger,” Kant-Studien 94: 69-79.
  • Edel, G., 1988, Von der Vernunftkritik zur Erkenntnislogik, Frieburg: Karl Alber.
  • Edgar, S., 2015, “The Physiology of the Sense Organs and Early Neo-Kantian Conceptions of Objectivity: Helmholtz, Lange, Liebmann”, in F. Padovani, A. Richardson, and J. Tsou (eds.) Objectivity in Science: Approaches to Historical Epistemology, New York, NY: Springer.
  • Frege, G., 1984 (1885), “Review of H. Cohen, Das Prinzip der Infinitesimalmethode und seine Geschichte,” in B. McGuinnes (ed.), Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic, and Philosophy, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Horstmann, R.P., 2008, “Hermann Cohen on Kant's Transcendental Aesthetic,” The Philosophical Forum, 39(2): 127–138.
  • Hyder, D., 2013, “Time, Norms, and Structure in Nineteenth-Century Philosophy of Science,” in M. Beaney (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kühn, M., 2009, “Interpreting Kant Correctly: On the Kant of the Neo-Kantians,” in R. Makreel and S. Luft (eds.), Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
  • Luft, S., 2008, “Reassessing Neo-Kantianism. Another Look at Hermann Cohen's Kant Interpretation,” Dilthey: International Yearbook for Philosophy and the Human Sciences, 1
  • Patton, L., 2005, “The Critical Philosophy Renewed,” Angelaki, 10(1): 109–118.
  • Richardson, A., 2003, “Conceiving, Experiencing, and Conceiving Experiencing: Neo-Kantianism and the History of the Concept of Experience,” Topoi, 22(1): 55–67.
  • –––, 2006, “‘The Fact of Science’ and Critique of Knowledge: Exact Sceince as problem and Resource in Marburg Neo-Kantianism,” in M. Friedman and A. Nordmann (eds.), The Kantian Legacy in Ninete enth-Century Science, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Russell, B., 1903, The Principles of Mathematics, New York, NY: W.W. Norton and Company.
  • de Schmidt, W., 1976, Psychologie und Transzendentalphilosophie: Zur Psychologie-Rezeption bei Hermann Cohen und Paul Natorp, Bonn: Bouvier.
  • Stolzenberg, J., 2009, “The Highest Principle and the Principle of Origin in Hermann Cohen's Theoretical Philosophy,” in R. Makreel and S. Luft (eds.), Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.

Ethics, Political Theory, and Aesthetics

  • Gibbs, R. (ed.), 2006, Hermann Cohen's Ethics, Boston, MA: Brill Academic Publishing.
  • Guyer, P., 2008, “What Happened to Kant in Neo-Kantian Aesthetics? Cohen, Cohn, and Dilthey,” The Philosophical Forum, 39(2): 143–176.
  • de Launey, M., 2005, “The Statute of Music in Hermann Cohen's Ästhetik,” in R. Munk (ed.), Hermann Cohen's Critical Idealism, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • van der Linden, H., 1988, Kantian Ethics and Socialism, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • Poma, A., 2000, “Lyric Poetry and Prayer” in H. Holzhey, G. Motzkin, and H. Wiedebach (eds.), “Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums”: Tradition und Ursprungsdenken in Hermann Cohens Spätwerk, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • –––, 2006, Yearning for Form and Other Essays on Hermann Cohen's Thought, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Schwarzschild, S., 1975, “The Tenability of Herman [sic] Cohen's Construction of the Self,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 13: 361–384.
  • Wiedebach, H., 1997, Die Bedeutung der Nationalität für Hermann Cohen, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • –––, 2002, “Aesthetics in Religion: Remarks on Hermann Cohen's Theory of Jewish Existence,” The Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy 11(1): 63–73.


  • Bernstein-Nahar, A., 1998, “Hermann Cohen's Teaching Concerning Jewish Identity (1904-1918),” in Leo Baeck Institute Yearbook: 25-46.
  • –––, 2006, “In the Name of a Narrative Education: Hermann Cohen and Historicism Reconsidered,” in R. Gibbs, Hermann Cohen's Ethics, Boston, MA: Brill Academic Publishing.
  • Bonaunet, K., 2004, Hermann Cohen's Kantian Philosophy of Religion, Bern: Peter Lang.
  • Dietrich, W., 1986, Cohen and Troeltsch: Ethical Monotheistic Religion and Theory of Culture, Providence, RI: Brown University Press.
  • –––, 2000, “Preface,” in M. Zank, The Idea of Atonement in the Philosophy of Hermann Cohen, Providence, RI: Brown Judaic Studies.
  • Erlewine, R., 2010, “Hermann Cohen, Maimonides, and the Jewish Virtue of Humility,” Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy 18(1): 27-47.
  • Holzey, H., 2000, “Der systematische Ort der Religion der Vernunft im Gesamptwerk Hermann Cohens,” in H. Holzhey, G. Motzkin, and H. Wiedebach (eds.), “Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums”: Tradition und Ursprungsdenken in Hermann Cohens Spätwerk, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • Holzhey, H., Motzkin, G., and Wiedebach, H. (eds.), “Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums”: Tradition und Ursprungsdenken in Hermann Cohens Spätwerk, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • Horwitz, R, 2000, “Two Models of Atonement in Cohen's Religion of Reason: One according to Ezekiel, the other ”joyful sufferings“ according to Job,” in H. Holzhey, G. Motzkin, and H. Wiedebach (eds.), “Religion der Vernunft aus den Quellen des Judentums”: Tradition und Ursprungsdenken in Hermann Cohens Spätwerk, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • Kepnes, S., 2007, Jewish Liturgical Reasoning, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kluback, W., 1884, Hermann Cohen: The Challenge of a Religion of Reason, Atlanta, GA: Scholar's Press.
  • –––, 1987, The Idea of Humanity: Hermann Cohen's Legacy to Philosophy and Theology, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • –––, 1989, The Legacy of Hermann Cohen, Atlanta, GA: Scholars Press.
  • Melber, J., 1968, Hermann Cohen's Philosophy of Judaism, New York, NY: Yeshiva University Press.
  • Moses, S. and Wiedebach, H. (eds.), 1997, Hermann Cohen's Philosophy of Religion, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • Rosenzweig, F., 1924, “Einleitung,” in B. Strauss, Hermann Cohens Jüdische Schriften, Berlin: Schwetchke.
  • Schwarzschild, S., 1979, “‘Germanism and Judaism’ — Hermann Cohen's Normative Paradigm of the German-Jewish Symbiosis,” in D. Bronson (ed.), Jews and Germans from 1860 to 1933: The Problematic Symbiosis, Heidelberg: Carl Winter Universität.
  • Vial, M and M. Hadley (eds.), 2001, Ethical Monotheism, Past and Present: Essays in Honor of Wendell Dietrich, Providence, RI: Brown University Press.
  • Zank, M., 1996, “‘The Individual as I’ in Hermann Cohen's Jewish Thought,” The Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, 5(2): 281–296.
  • –––, 2000, The Idea of Atonement in the Philosophy of Hermann Cohen, Providence, RI: Brown Judaic Studies.

Other Works Cited

  • Allison, H., 1983/2004, Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Buber, M., 1971 (1923), I and Thou, trans. W. Kaufmann. Free Press.
  • Edel, G., 1993, “Cohen und die analytische Philosophie der Gegenwart,” in R. Brandt and F. Orlik (eds.), Philosophisches Denken – Politisches Wirken: Hermann-Cohen-Kolloquium Marburg 1992, Hildesheim: Georg Olms.
  • Friedman, M., 1999, “Carnap's Aufbau Reconsdiered,” Reconsidering Logical Positivism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2000, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, Heidegger, Chicago: Open Court.
  • –––, 2001, Dynamics of Reason, Palo Alta, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, “Kant on Geometry and Spatial Intuition,” Synthese, 186(1): 231-255.
  • Gay, P., 1970, The Dilemma of Democratic Socialism: Eduard Bernstein's Challenge to Marx, New York, NY: Columbia University Press.
  • Hatfield, G., 1990, The Natural and the Normative: Theories of Spatial Perception from Kant to Helmholtz, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kant, I., 1997 (1781/1787), Critique of Pure Reason, trans. P. Guyer and A. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002 (1783), Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics that will be able to Come Forward as Science, trans. G. Hatfield, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Köhnke, K.C., 1991, The Rise of Neo-Kantianism: German Academic Philosophy Between Positivism and Idealism, trans. R.J. Hollingdale, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Longuenesse, B., 1998, Kant and the Capacity to Judge, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Richardson, A., 1998, Carnap's Construction of the World, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stammler, R., 1925 (1902), The Theory of Justice, trans. Issak Husik, New York, NY: MacMillan.

Other Internet Resources

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